Notes to Friedrich Heinrich Jacobi

1. For a detailed sketch of Jacobi's life, the article in the Allgemeine Deutsche Biographie (Prantl, 1881) is still the best but must be supplemented with more recent discoveries. (Booy/Mortier, 1966). Basic information is drawn from Jacobi's autobiographical comments scattered throughout his works (Jacobi, 1812–1825, 1787, 1785) and enriched from his massive correspondence and the correspondence of third parties relating to him.

2. Johann Wolfang von Goethe, Dichtung und Wahrheit, III, p. 681. In Sämmtliche Werke, eds Richter, K. et al., vol. 16. München: Hauser, 1985-.

3. Kant reacted to the dispute with his essay ‘Was heißt sich im Denken Orientieren?’ (‘What Does It Mean to Orient Oneself in Thought,’ Berlinische Monatsschrift, 8 (1786): 304–330). Without endorsing Mendelssohn, whose metaphysics he could not have accepted, he none the less showed that his sympathy lay on his side. See also, di Giovanni, 1994: 32, note 70.

4. Johann August Starck, theologian and in his days renowned preacher at the court of Darmstadt, became at some point deeply involved in the shadowy side of Masonic internal politics. He apparently zealously conspired to establish within the order an ‘ecclesiastical branch’ that would incorporate in its ceremonials older rituals allegedly going back to the Mediaeval Templars. For this intriguing, he was repeatedly criticized on the pages of the Berlinmonatsschrift and of the Allgemeine deutsche Bibliothek, and accused of obscurantism. He was connected by the two journals with what at the time was widely feared to be a plot by the Jesuits to undermine Protestant enlightened society. Starck reacted by suing the two editors of the Berlinmonatsschrift (F. Gedike and J. Biester) for defamation of character. The courts found in favour of the two editors, on the ground that it was in the interest of the press to expose perceived dangers to society.

5. As recently expressed in Gott, Einige Gespräche. Gotha: Ettinger, 1787.

6. Morgenstunden, oder Vorlesungen über das Daseyn Gottes, Erster Theil (Morning Hours, or Lectures Concerning the Existence of God. Berlin: Voß, 1785)

7. Also important is the earlier work of Margaret Jacob, The Radical Enlightenment (London, 1981).

8.See the record of Jacobi's 1788 oral comments regarding Reid, in Wilhelm von Humboldts Tagebücher, 1788–1789, ed. Albert Leitzmann (Berlin: Bher, 1916), 58, 61. See, also, ; di Giovanni, 1997.

9. Anthony J. La Vopa, Fichte: The Self and the Calling of Philosophy, 1762–1799 (Cambridge: University Press, 2001, Chapters12–13.

10. Friedrich Schlegel's review of the 1796 edition amounted to a scathing attack. Deutschland, 3 (8) (1796): 185–213.

11. There are remarkable similarities between Allwill and Kierkegaard's seducer in Either/Or.

12. Hegel paraphrases some of the language in the scene in the Phenomenology of Spirit, tr. A. V. Miller (Oxford: Clarendon), p. 409.

13. Jacobi reproduced the passage in an appendix to his Open Letter to Fichte. (Jacobi, 1799: 101)

14.145;Über das göttliche Recht der Obrigkeit’ (‘On the Divine Right of Authority’), Der Teutscher Merkur, 20 (1777): 119–45.

15. Originally published in French; German translation, Die Reisen der Päbste, 1783.

16. For how much this pamphlet might have been a tacit attack on the programme of emancipation of the Jews in Prussia advocated by Christian Wilhelm Dohm, see Goldenbaum, 2009.

17. For a detailed account of the context of Jacobi's essay, and its possible connection with Hegel's Phenomenology of Spirit, see di Giovanni, 1995.

18. The Review Focus of volume 25 of the Lessing Yearbook (1993) is dedicated to Lichtenberg.

19. See the alteration made in the 1815 edition to the text on p. 123 of the original, and the new note entered by Jacobi.

20. See, for instance, J. F. Fries, Von Deutscher Philosophie, Art, und Kunst. Ein Votum für Friedrich Heinrich Jacobi gegen F. W. J. Schelling (Heidelberg: Mohr und Zimmer, 1812), pp. 40–49, especially 40–41, 44–48.

21. Deutsches Museum, 1 (1) (1812): 79–98, especially pp. 89ff.

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George di Giovanni <>

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