Gorampa [go rams pa]

First published Mon May 2, 2011; substantive revision Fri Aug 12, 2016

Gorampa Sonam Senge (Go rams pa bSod nams Seng ge, 1429–89) is one of the most widely-studied philosophers in the Sakya (sa skya) school of Tibetan Buddhism. A fierce critic of Tsongkhapa, the founder of what later came to be known as the Gelug (dge lugs) school, his works were so controversial that they were suppressed by Gelug leaders shortly after they were composed. Gorampa’s texts remained hidden until the early 20th century, when the monk Jamgyal Rinpoche received permission from the thirteenth Dalai Lama to collect Gorampa’s extant texts and have them reprinted in Derge. Today, Gorampa’s philosophy is studied widely in monastic colleges, not only in those affiliated with his own Sakya tradition, but also in institutions affiliated with the Kagyu (bka' brgyud) and Nyingma (rnying ma) schools.

Gorampa, like most Tibetan Buddhist philosophers, considers himself a follower of the Madhyamaka (Middle Way) school developed by the Indian philosopher Nāgārjuna in the second century, CE. His views with respect to particular issues within Madhyamaka, however, differ significantly from the views of scholars belonging to other sects of Tibetan Buddhism (e.g., Tsongkhapa and Dolpopa), and at times, his views even differ from those of other Sakya scholars (most notably Shakya Chokden). Gorampa’s particular brand of Madhyamaka philosophy is defined by his understanding of the relationship between the two truths, the use of negation, the role of logic, and proper methods of philosophical argumentation.

1. Life and Works

Gorampa was born in 1429 in eastern Tibet. At age nineteen, he traveled to central Tibet to pursue monastic studies. He briefly attended Nalendra monastery, one of the prominent Sakya monastic institutions in Tibet, where he studied Madhyamaka texts with the scholar Rongton (rong ston). Rongton passed away the following summer, and Gorampa began to travel throughout central Tibet, studying with a number of other teachers. In addition to becoming a skilled philosopher, Gorampa mastered a variety of Tantric practices, including the Lamdre (lam ‘bras), the defining practice of the Sakya School.

After completing his studies, Gorampa became a teacher, and in 1473 he founded Thubten Namgyal Ling Monastery, developing a curriculum that emphasized both rigorous philosophical education and thorough training in meditative practices. Gorampa later spent four years as the sixth abbot of Ewam Choden, the primary institution of the Ngor subsect of the Sakya school. He died in 1489.

Gorampa lived during a period of political instability in Tibet. From 1244 until 1354, the Sakya sect had held political control over Tibet, and was backed by the support of the Mongol army. Eventually the Mongolian court’s interest in Tibet weakened, and the Pagmodruk sect of Tibetan Buddhism ousted the Sakyapas from power in a violent confrontation. The Pagmodrukpas ruled over Tibet for 130 years, but during the latter half of Gorampa’s life, they fell from power, resulting in a number of groups fiercely competing for religious and political dominance.

Gorampa composed his philosophical texts, therefore, at a time in which the Sakya sect was struggling to re-assert its dominance. Although verifiable information about the political motivations of the Sakyapas remains elusive, the unstable political situation in Tibet could have at least partially accounted for the overtly polemical nature of some of Gorampa’s Madhyamaka texts. When the Gelugpas eventually ascended to political power in the sixteenth century, the fifth Dalai Lama ordered that Gorampa’s texts, which were so critical of Tsongkhapa, be destroyed or otherwise removed from monastic institutions. However, many of Gorampa’s texts continued to be studied in eastern Tibet, where the central government was unable to exert a strong influence.

When work began on the republication of Gorampa’s writings in 1905, thirteen volumes of texts were recovered from monasteries throughout Tibet. In addition to his works on Madhyamaka philosophy, Gorampa composed a number of treatises on Abhidharma, several commentaries on the Indian text the Abhisamayālaṅkāra, and various practice texts based on Tantra. Gorampa’s major Madhyamaka texts, which will form the basis for the rest of this article, comprise only two of these thirteen volumes. His three major Madhyamaka texts are:

  1. Freedom from Extremes (lta ba’i shan ‘byed), a polemical text distinguishing Gorampa’s own view from those of Tsongkhapa (Tsong kha pa bLo bzang Grags pa, 1357–1419) and Dolpopa (Dol po pa Shes rab rGyal mtshan, 1292–1361);
  2. Elucidating the View (lta ba ngan sel), a commentary on the Indian scholar Candrakīrti’s Madhyamakāvatāra;
  3. The General Meaning of Madhyamaka (dbu ma’i spyi don), an encyclopedic text outlining Gorampa’s views on the major points of Madhyamaka, as well as the views of a number of Indian and Tibetan scholars with whom he both agrees and disagrees.

Although there are some subtle differences in the presentation of Gorampa’s philosophy in each of these three texts, his explanation of Madhyamaka is relatively consistent throughout his writings. The remainder of this article will provide a general sketch of Gorampa’s Madhyamaka views as they are presented in all three of these texts.

2. Gorampa’s Madhyamaka

Because Gorampa was educated in the Tibetan monastic system, he affiliates himself with the Madhyamaka school of Buddhist thought. All Tibetan Buddhist philosophers cite Nāgārjuna’s texts as authoritative, and disagreements among different scholars in Tibetan Buddhism primarily concern the correct ways to interpret the works of Nāgārjuna and his commentators. As such, the basis of Gorampa’s views are relatively non-controversial in the context of Tibetan Madhyamaka. His philosophy is based on Nāgārjuna’s concepts of emptiness and the two truths, and, like all Buddhists, Gorampa agrees that the elimination of ignorance will eliminate suffering and lead to enlightenment. What distinguishes Gorampa’s Madhyamaka from that of other Tibetan scholars is more subtle. His understanding of the nature of emptiness, ignorance, and the two truths, as well as his articulation of the proper methods for realizing emptiness and attaining enlightenment, are what originally set Gorampa apart from other scholars, and what ultimately led to the censoring of his texts in Tibet.

The scholar with whom Gorampa most vehemently disagrees in his Madhyamaka texts is Tsongkhapa (1357–1419), the scholar who founded what later came to be known as the Gelug sect. Before establishing his own monastery and composing his own philosophical commentaries, Tsongkhapa received a significant portion of his training from Sakya teachers. It is possible, therefore, that Gorampa made such overtly critical remarks against Tsongkhapa’s views because the former saw the latter as misconstruing the Sakya philosophical tradition.

Several works have been published in English that focus explicitly on the debates between Gorampa and Tsongkhapa (see Cabezon & Dargay 2007, Thakchoe 2007). While his philosophical treatises were undoubtedly composed partly in response to Tsongkhapa’s views, the remainder of this section will concern itself with Gorampa’s own views, only drawing comparisons to Tsongkhapa when Gorampa has specifically constructed his arguments in such a way.

With this in mind, there are four defining characteristics of Gorampa’s philosophy that set him apart from other Tibetan philosophers. They are his understandings of: (1) the two truths; (2) negation and the tetralemma; (3) the role of logic and reasoning; and (4) proper methods of argumentation on the path to Buddhist enlightenment.

2.1 The Two Truths

The theory of the two truths is fundamental to all Madhyamaka philosophy. Reality is understood in terms of the conventional truth, which corresponds to the perspectives of ordinary beings, and the ultimate truth, which can only be perceived by enlightened beings. While Mādhyamikas tend to disagree about the nature of and relationship between the conventional and ultimate truths, the final goal of Madhyamaka philosophy involves arriving at a direct realization of the ultimate truth.

Gorampa argues that the two truths are divided based on the perspective of an apprehending subject (yul can), rather than being divided on the basis of an apprehended object (yul). The way in which one engages with the world determines whether one perceives things conventionally or ultimately. The conventional truth involves concepts, logic, and reasoning, while the ultimate truth is outside of the realm of conceptual thought. As long as one is engaged in concepts, one is interacting with the conventional realm. Once all concepts have been eliminated by following the Buddhist path (as will be explained below), one realizes the ultimate truth.

Gorampa defines “conventional truth” as that which appears to ordinary beings: objects, concepts, words, and so on. They are true in the sense that they appear to be true for ordinary persons, without any sort of philosophical analysis. Most people, for example, can point to the Eiffel Tower and agree, “That is the Eiffel Tower.” The existence of the Eiffel Tower, therefore, is conventionally true. It appears to ordinary, unenlightened people, and these ordinary, unenlightened people identify it by means of the linguistic convention, “Eiffel Tower.”

There are, of course, things that are understood by most ordinary beings to be false. If something is conventionally false, it appears incorrectly to the perspective of ordinary beings. If a tourist in Paris drinks too much wine and starts seeing double, for example, this does not mean that there are suddenly two Eiffel Towers instead of one. The drunk person’s perception is simply skewed, and after he sobers up, he will once again see that really, there is only one Eiffel Tower. To illustrate this point in his texts, Gorampa refers to Candrakīrti’s well-known Madhyamaka analogy of a person with an eye disorder (rab rib can) incorrectly seeing floating hairs on account of his impaired perception. The hairs are not really there, as a person with normally functioning eyes can affirm.

The conventional truth, therefore, is true in the sense that it is something upon which all ordinary beings, who do not have impaired forms of perception, can agree. The conventional truth is what allows for ordinary persons to travel to Paris to visit the Eiffel Tower, to talk about the weather, and to engage in debates about politics. It is also, most importantly, what allows people to understand conceptually what a realization of the ultimate truth is like, and what enables practitioners to correctly develop logical reasoning and engage in proper types of meditative practices. In other words, some features of the conventional—such as reasoning and language—can be used to approach an understanding of the ultimate, even though the ultimate itself transcends those features.

In contrast to the conventional, the ultimate truth is understood as the way things really are, independent of the concepts and conventions with which ordinary persons engage. Gorampa contends that the conventional truth is mired in ignorance—the cause of saṃsāra, which keeps sentient beings cycling from lifetime to lifetime. When this ignorance is removed, one is capable of realizing the ultimate truth, and through that realization, one can attain freedom from the cycle of rebirth.

Based on this account, then, when ordinary, unenlightened persons talk about “the ultimate truth,” they necessarily identify it in terms of concepts. This conceptual understanding of the ultimate truth, while not a direct realization of the ultimate truth, is a crucial step on the Buddhist path, linking ordinary persons to enlightened buddhas. Developing a concept of the ultimate is not enlightenment itself, but it gives one a sense of what enlightenment is like.

In order to explain the difference between a conceptual understanding and a nonconceptual realization of the ultimate truth, Gorampa divides it into two types: the ultimate that is taught (bstan pa'i don dam) and the ultimate that is realized (rtogs pa'i don dam). The ultimate that is taught corresponds to an ordinary person’s understanding of the ultimate, while the ultimate that is realized is directly perceived by enlightened beings. Similarly, Gorampa contends that the conventional truth is also divided according to the perspective of ordinary and enlightened beings: the former perceive conventional truth (kun rdzob bden pa) while the latter understand it as mere convention (kun rdzob tsam).

Again, the conventional truth is that which is true for ordinary, unenlightened beings (such as the Eiffel Tower). Mere convention, on the other hand, is a term that corresponds to the perspective of enlightened beings. When highly realized beings (āryas, who are superior to ordinary beings on the Buddhist path, but not yet fully enlightened buddhas) engage in meditation (rnyam gzhag), they directly and nonconceptually perceive the ultimate truth. Once they emerge from their meditative states (rjes thob), however, they realize that the things that they had previously understood to be conventionally “true” are not actually true. After an ārya has directly realized the ultimate, conventional things appear as merely conventional. This mere convention is not false; it is simply understood as a mode of perception that is subordinated to the ultimate truth that has been directly experienced in meditation.

It is important to note that conventional objects, such as the Eiffel Tower, tables, persons, ideas, and so on, are the same regardless of whether their existences are understood as conventionally true or mere conventions. The difference between conventional truth and mere convention is based entirely on the subject who apprehends these objects. The same table appears as truly existent to an ordinary being, and as a mere conceptual imputation to an ārya. (Tsongkhapa, on the other hand, distinguishes the two truths on the basis of the object, arguing that every object consists of an ultimate and a conventional aspect (ngo bo gcig la ldog pa tha dad). Tsongkhapa contends that these two aspects are not substantially different, but only differ conceptually. Nevertheless, the important distinction here is that for Tsongkhapa, the difference between the two truths is made on the basis of the apprehended object (yul), while for Gorampa, the distinction is made on the basis of the mind of the apprehending subject (yul can).

With respect to the ultimate truth, the ultimate that is taught is an ordinary being’s conceptual understanding of what the ultimate truth is like. After studying Buddhist scriptures and learning philosophy, ordinary beings come to understand the ultimate truth in the Madyamaka sense as emptiness. The ultimate truth that is realized corresponds to that which is directly experienced by fully enlightened buddhas, and āryas in meditation. The real ultimate truth is free from all concepts, including the concepts of emptiness and interdependence. It is a state that is entirely nonconceptual, and is the end goal of the Buddhist path.

In short, ordinary beings can understand the conventional truth, and the ultimate that is taught. Āryas in their post-meditative states, can understand mere convention. And Āryas in meditation and fully enlightened buddhas can directly, nonconceptually experience the ultimate that is realized, which is free from all concepts. On this model, the Buddhist path involves a process of transforming one’s perspective. One begins by correctly identifying and understanding the conventional truth. Then, through logical reasoning and meditative practices, one gradually begins to realize that this so-called truth is merely conventional and that it is based entirely on concepts that are rooted in ignorance; in this way one comes to a conceptual understanding of the ultimate that is taught. Through more analysis and practice still, one eventually leaves behind the mere convention and directly realizes the ultimate truth, which does not depend on ignorance and concepts. In other words, in the process of realizing the ultimate, a distinctive feature of this realization is that, even though it depends on concepts (and thus ignorance), it can be used to negate concepts and ignorance.

Gorampa describes the ultimate that is realized in terms of freedom from conceptual constructs (spros pa dang bral ba). It should be noted that this is not, however, the same as simply not thinking. (Gorampa defends himself against accusations equating his method to mere non-thinking in his lta ba’i shan ‘byed.) Concepts must be eliminated on the Buddhist path, but they must be eliminated in specific ways. These specific ways involve both logical reasoning and meditative practices, eliminating concepts gradually, in stages. When no more concepts remain to be analyzed, no conceptual constructs remain. As will be shown below, Gorampa outlines a very specific fourfold process for eliminating concepts in order to arrive at this desired state of nonconceptuality.

2.2 Negation

Gorampa employs a fourfold negation known as the tetralemma (mtha’ bzhi) in order to refute all concepts in their entirety. Use of the tetralemma as a tool in Buddhist philosophy can be traced to Nāgārjuna’s Mūlamadhyamakakārika, in which he famously remarks, “Neither from itself, nor from another, nor from both, nor without a cause, does anything, anywhere, ever, arise” (MMK I:1). This fourfold rejection of one extreme, its opposite, both, and neither, is adopted by later Mādhyamikas and is frequently used as a tool in order to demonstrate the Madhyamaka view.

Nāgārjuna’s commentator Āryadeva applies this fourfold negation to the extremes of existence, nonexistence, both, and neither in his Jñānasārasamuccaya, writing, “There is no existence, there is no nonexistence, there is no existence and nonexistence, nor is there the absence of both.” Gorampa frequently cites this passage in order to illustrate the Madhyamaka view as that which is free from conceptual constructs. He contends that a proper understanding and application of this passage allows a practitioner to successfully transition from the state of an ordinary person who sees conventional truth, to an enlightened buddha who directly and nonconceptually realizes the ultimate.

Most Tibetan Buddhist philosophers agree that the tetralemma is a tool that allows one to realize the ultimate, but they differ in their explanations of the ways in which this tool functions. Gorampa argues that one must negate each of the four extremes in succession by using logic and reasoning, and then one must subsequently realize the negation of all four extremes simultaneously through meditative practices.

2.2.1 The Process of Refuting the Four Extremes

Gorampa’s Synopsis indicates that one must begin the process of the fourfold negation by analyzing and refuting the concept of existence. This can be done by using the five Madhyamaka reasonings (gtan tshigs lnga). These five types of reasoning are:

  1. Neither one nor many (gcig du dral), which analyzes the essence (ngo bo) of things.
  2. Diamond splinters (rdo rje'i gzegs ma), which analyzes causes.
  3. Refuting the arising of something existent or nonexistent (yod med skye ‘gog), which analyzes effects.
  4. Refuting the four possibilities of arising (mu bzhi skye ‘gog), which analyzes causes and effects together.
  5. Dependent arising (rten ‘brel), which shows that phenomena cannot exist independently.

These points are generally agreed upon by all Mādhyamikas, and entire essays can be devoted to each of these five types of reasoning, so they will not be discussed in detail here.

After one has successfully negated the first extreme, Gorampa concedes that a person’s natural inclination is to assume that the negation of existence implies the assertion of nonexistence. If one were to stop his logical analysis at this point, Gorampa argues that one would adhere to a nihilist view; failure to correctly negate nonexistence can lead one to wrongly believe that nonexistence is ultimately real. In order to show that the acceptance of nonexistence is untenable, Gorampa argues that the concepts of existence and nonexistence depend upon each other; one makes no sense without the other. And, since the concept of existence has already been negated, it makes no sense to conceive of nonexistence independently.

Once he has shown that existence and nonexistence are each untenable, Gorampa refutes the third extreme view, that things can somehow simultaneously both exist and not exist. He dismisses this possibility quite succinctly in his Synopsis, stating that if existence and nonexistence have each been refuted individually, then it makes no sense that they could somehow exist together.

The refutation of the fourth extreme, neither existence nor nonexistence, yet again depends upon the successful refutation of the previous three. Gorampa argues that to conceive of something as “neither existent nor nonexistent” is to conceive of something that is somewhere between the two extremes of existence and nonexistence. He contends, however, that if one has any concept of anything at all – even if it is some sort of concept of quasi-existence – this is still a wrong view. With the refutation of this fourth extreme, Gorampa shows that any possible way of conceiving of the ontological status of a thing, even something seemingly as convoluted as “things neither exist nor do not exist,” must be eliminated completely. If one is capable of conceiving of things as existing or not existing in any way whatsoever, then one cannot have a true, nonconceptual realization of the way things really are.

Gorampa contends that one must understand the refutation of each of these four concepts in succession; the logic that refutes the concept of nonexistence depends upon the successful refutation of the existence, the refutation of the third concept (both existence and nonexistence) depends on the refutation of the first two, and the refutation of the fourth (neither existence nor nonexistence) depends upon the refutation of the first three concepts. Existence, nonexistence, both, and neither are the only possible ways of conceiving of the status of a thing, so once each of these possible ways are eliminated, there is no way to conceive of things anymore.

The process of negating the four extreme views also involves meditative practices. Gorampa argues that along with conducting a thorough philosophical analysis, one must meditate on the refutation of each of the four extremes individually, in succession. Then, one will come to directly realize all four negations simultaneously. One way to understand this style of meditative practice is in terms of a “turning off” of concepts. After one conceptually understands the negation of things existing inherently, for example, one meditates on this negation and eventually stops having concepts of things existing altogether. This process continues through all four possibilities in the tetralemma, until one no longer conceives of things at all. Again, it is important to note that this is distinct from simply arresting the process of thought.

2.2.2 The Role of Negation and the Function of the Tetralemma

Gorampa understands the tetralemma as a tool that one uses to analyze the ultimate truth. One uses logic and reasoning to arrive at a conceptual understanding of the ultimate that is taught, and meditative practices allow one to reach a direct, nonconceptual realization of the ultimate truth. The logical reasoning involved in the fourfold negation is implemented by ordinary persons in order to understand what the ultimate truth is like, but logic alone is not sufficient to arrive at a direct realization of the ultimate.

This particular way of understanding the tetralemma is, again, at odds with the views of Tsongkhapa. Tsongkhapa contends that Gorampa’s assertion that all concepts must be eliminated entirely amounts to nihilistic quietism. Tsongkhapa understands each of the four extremes of the tetralemma as being qualified according to the conventional or ultimate truths. According to him, existence is negated ultimately, while nonexistence is negated conventionally.

This debate between Gorampa and Tsongkhapa is based on each philosopher’s understanding of the ways in which negation functions within the tetralemma. Tsongkhapa upholds the law of double negation elimination (dgag pa gnyis kyi rnal ma go ba), a logical law stating that the negation of a negation implies an affirmation. The negation of existence, therefore, implies the acceptance of nonexistence, while the negation of nonexistence implies the assertion of existence. Because of this, Tsongkhapa’s understanding of the tetralemma involves a complex system of logical statements, each qualified according to one of the two truths. If one accepts double negation elimination, then it makes no sense for both existence and nonexistence to be negated, unless these negations are qualified in certain ways.

Gorampa, on the other hand, does not adhere to double negation in the context of the tetralemma. Instead, he understands the tetralemma as a succession of four negations that are applied to the four possible ways of conceiving of the status of the ultimate truth. Because the ultimate truth is nonconceptualizable, Gorampa contends that Tsongkhapa’s understanding of the tetralemma is incomplete, because it doesn’t negate enough (literally, it underpervades [khyab chung ba]). While Tsongkhapa’s model successfully refutes the extreme view of existence at the ultimate level, Gorampa argues that it does not eliminate all extreme views ultimately and in their entirety.

Tsongkhapa argues that a negation of all four extremes at the ultimate level contradicts logic, but Gorampa contends that an elimination of logic is specifically the tetralemma’s purpose. By negating all possibilities for logical, conceptual thought, the only recourse is to abandon concepts completely. True freedom from conceptual constructs lies outside of the scope of conceptual thought, and is therefore inexpressible. Gorampa maintains, however, that because ordinary persons utilize conceptual thought, they necessarily construe the ultimate truth as an object of conceptual constructs (that is, they construe it as the ultimate that is taught). As such, one must first use conceptual reasoning to refute each of the four extremes, but these concepts must eventually be abandoned.

In other words, because all four extremes are negated under the analysis of the tetralemma, Gorampa concludes that a correct realization of the ultimate truth must be something that is other than these conceptualizations of and dichotomizations into existence and nonexistence. As such, the ultimate truth cannot be described using these terms. And, since these are the only possible ways of speaking of or conceptualizing the status of the existence of things, once they are all negated, one is forced to conclude that the ultimate truth cannot be described linguistically or conceptually. The ultimate truth that is realized transcends the boundaries of language and conceptual thought. However, Gorampa still maintains that logic and analysis are essential in arriving at a state of nonconceptuality.

2.3 The Role of Logic

Gorampa’s understanding of the relationship between the two truths and the use of negation in the tetralemma inform his understanding of the ways in which a practitioner should proceed on the Buddhist path. The end result of this path, enlightenment, is the ultimate goal toward which all Buddhists strive. Gorampa’s arguments regarding the above points therefore inform the ways in which one should understand the nature of this end result. According to Gorampa, concepts come from ignorance, and the path of eliminating ignorance involves eliminating concepts.

In other words, since a buddha is completely free of ignorance, he has no concepts whatsoever. This claim is quite controversial for obvious reasons: buddhas are understood as consisting of perfect wisdom, and are described in scriptures as omniscient beings. How, then, can a buddha have no concepts at all, but still be considered omniscient?

Gelugpa opponents criticize Gorampa for this very reason. They contend that Gorampa’s philosophy negates too much (literally “overpervades” [khyab che ba]). If the end result is a complete elimination of concepts, then one could attain enlightenment by simply falling asleep or otherwise becoming unconscious. Gorampa contends, however, that in order to successfully eliminate all concepts in their entirety, it is absolutely essential that one begins by using logic and reasoning. The end result is indeed nonconceptual, but it differs from the quietism that is a result of simply not-thinking, without any prior analysis.

The issue underlying this debate concerns the conceptual content of fully enlightened buddhas. Gorampa contends, citing Candrakīrti, that fully enlightened buddhas have no conceptual content whatsoever; they have completely eliminated ignorance in its entirety, and therefore do not actively engage in the conventional world. They do not conceive of things as existent, nonexistent, both, or neither. In fact, they do not conceive of things at all. They do, however, appear omniscient from the perspective of ordinary beings, and because of their previous karma and the compassion that they have cultivated on the path to enlightenment, they continue to function in the world for the benefit of ordinary unenlightened beings for a period of time.

The implications of Gorampa’s view are significant. On Tsongkhapa’s model, certain concepts (i.e., concepts about emptiness) are the right kinds of concepts, which means that if one has not carefully constructed the right kinds of concepts in the right ways, one will not attain enlightenment. On Gorampa’s model, as long as one uses logic and reasoning to refute the ignorance that gives rise to concepts, one can attain enlightenment. While Tsongkhapa’s model espouses one specific view that must be cultivated in one specific way, Gorampa’s model leaves open the possibility for different practitioners to employ different styles of reasoning.

2.4 Methods of Argumentation

Gorampa’s articulation of the idea that there are different styles of reasoning that are capable of leading to enlightenment on the Buddhist path exists in the context of his assessment of the difference between the so-called Prāsaṅgika and Svātantrika schools of Madhyamaka thought. These two subschools were understood by Tibetan thinkers as being developed by the Indian Mādhyamikas Buddhapālita and Bhāviveka, the former advocating the Prāsaṅgika position and the latter that of the Svātantrika. Candrakīrti is understood as upholding the Prāsaṅgika tradition, because he defended Buddhapālita’s views against Bhāviveka’s criticisms. It is important to note, however, that none of these Indian scholars labeled themselves as adherents of particular subschools of Madhyamaka, and that the terms rang gyud pa (Svātantrika) and thal ‘gyur ba (Prāsaṅgika) were coined centuries later by Tibetans. (Western scholars, moreover, have contributed to the misconception that these two schools actually existed in India by Sanskritizing these Tibetan terms.)

Regardless of whether Buddhapālita, Bhāviveka, or Candrakīrti actually understood themselves as advocating these distinct positions, the distinction between Svātantrika and Prāsaṅgika became reified in medieval Tibetan Buddhist discourse. Because Tibetans held Candrakīrti’s Madhyamaka in high regard, they purported to be Prāsaṅgikas themselves, and many constructed detailed explanations of the division between the Svātantrika and Prāsaṅgika systems, always upholding Prāsaṅgika as the highest form of Madhyamaka.

Tsongkhapa composed a list of “eight difficult points” (dka’ gnad brgyad) distinguishing his own Prāsaṅgika view from that of the Svātantrika. Many of these points are quite technical, and the details of this list will not be addressed here. The important point to consider is that based on these eight points, Tsongkhapa considers the two schools to differ in terms of their views regarding the nature of the ultimate truth. Based on these eight points, Tsongkhapa argues that the Prāsaṅgika view is superior to that of the Svātantrika.

Gorampa similarly considers himself a Prāsaṅgika, but disagrees with Tsongkhapa on nearly all eight of his “difficult points.” Because his views regarding the two truths and negation inform a process whereby the Mādhyamika begins with logic and analysis, but ends in a state of nonconceptuality, Gorampa contends that there can be no differences between Mādhyamikas with respect to their final view. There cannot be different types of nonconceptuality; freedom from conceptual constructs is freedom from conceptual constructs. The differences between these Madhyamaka subschools, therefore, occur with respect to the ways in which they understand the conventional truth, and utilize logic and reasoning.

Gorampa’s refutations of Tsongkhapa’s eight points are especially technical, and a considerable portion of his Madhyamaka texts are devoted to articulating the nature of the differences between these two views. (Almost one third of his Synopsis, for example, is devoted to setting out the distinction between these two schools.) The essence of Gorampa’s argument is that Svātantrikas utilize “autonomous syllogisms” to argue for emptiness, while Prāsaṅgikas do not. Because both schools assert that a realization of the ultimate truth involves freedom from all conceptual constructs (spros bral), as long as one is in such a state, one can realize the ultimate. There is no such thing as correct and incorrect spros bral. Once one has successfully arrived at this state, the methods that he has used to get there are no longer relevant.

To use an analogy: suppose that a person wishes to drive from New York City to Boston. Depending on the kind of car that she is accustomed to driving, she can travel in a car with either manual or automatic transmission. Once she has arrived in Boston, the type of car that she drove no longer matters, even though she would have had to drive differently along the way. In the same way, if spros bral is the desired destination at the end of the Buddhist path, then depending on the ways in which one is accustomed to reasoning, one can successfully follow the Svātantrika or the Prāsaṅgika method in order to arrive at the same result. Gorampa still contends, however, that the Prāsaṅgika method of reasoning is a more efficient way of arriving at that result. Once one is in a state of spros bral, however, the type of reasoning that he used to get there no longer matters.

Gorampa’s particular brand of Madhyamaka is characterized by his understanding of the two truths and negation, as shown above. Because the ultimate truth is entirely free from concepts, one utilizes negation to eliminate all concepts in their entirety. The ways in which one employs Madhyamaka reasoning in order to negate these concepts are ultimately not as important as actually arriving at a state of nonconceptuality. Thus, unlike Tsongkhapa, who concludes that there is one correct final view (i.e., that of the Prāsaṅgikas), Gorampa contends that the final, ultimate view is actually no view at all.

3. Influence on Other Philosophers

Gorampa’s harsh criticisms of Tsongkhapa resulted in his works being banned throughout Tibet for centuries. When these texts were recovered and reprinted, however, Gorampa’s philosophy experienced a resurgence of sorts, not only among fellow Sakyapas, but also among some scholars belonging to the Kagyu and Nyingma schools. Gorampa’s articulation of the use of logic and reasoning in order to refute all views (as opposed to carefully constructing one specific view), and his emphasis on the notion that different methods could successfully be applied to arrive at the same result of spros bral, appealed to non-Sakya scholars who had historically placed more of an emphasis on meditative practices, but wished to counter Gelugpa-style logical arguments.

Just as Gorampa argues that the distinction between Svātantrika and Prāsaṅgika is a matter of method, but not of a Mādhyamika’s final view, later Tibetan commentators have extended this reasoning to apply to other, non-Sakya schools within Tibetan Buddhism. Gorampa’s philosophy has become influential within what has recently come to be known as the “nonsectarian movement” (ris med) of Tibetan Buddhism. (Incidentally, the republication of his works occurred only a few decades after the development of ris med.)

Kagyu and Nyingma scholars, who, until the 19th century, did not have analytical systems of their own that were as highly developed as those of Gelug and Sakya scholars, were able to appropriate Gorampa’s philosophy and incorporate it into their own systems. Not only did Gorampa provide a compelling refutation of Tsongkhapa’s particular understanding of Madhyamaka, but his philosophical arguments also proved compatible with Kagyu and Nyingma styles of meditative practice. Today, Kagyu and Nyingma scholars study Gorampa’s philosophical texts at Sakya monastic institutions, and some even teach Gorampa’s philosophy in their own monasteries.


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Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]

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Constance Kassor <constance.e.kassor@lawrence.edu>

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