Notes to Happiness

1. This article focuses on the standard division between descriptive and evaluative senses of ‘happiness’ (see also Feldman 2010, Sumner 1996). But that distinction may be challenged, or there might be evaluative elements in the “psychological” sense of ‘happiness’ even if it is not equivalent to well-being. For example, some argue that pleasure is itself partly an evaluative kind (e.g., Goldstein 1989). Phillips et al. have recently argued, using survey data, that the folk concept of happiness is a mix of psychological and evaluative (Phillips, Misenheimer, et al. 2011).

2. This claim holds only as a rough generalization, with some exceptions. Chekola 2007 and Murphy 2001, for instance, appear to use ‘happiness’ as a descriptive term for a life that is successful from the agent’s point of view. While there are other senses of ‘happiness’ and cognates, this article discusses only the main philosophically significant uses of ‘happiness’ and cognates; on other senses, see Davis 1981b, Goldstein 1973, Haybron 2000, 2003, and Thomas 1968. Readers should note that many philosophical works do not clearly distinguish the psychological and well-being notions, and it is not always clear how a given author employs the term. In some cases ‘happiness’ takes neither the psychological nor well-being meaning, and so it may be unclear how the discussion relates to broader philosophical debates such as those covered in this article.

3. Possible examples of theories grounded in failures properly to distinguish these projects include Smart and Hare’s accounts, on which happiness is basically about one’s mental states; but it is also partly evaluative, in that (for example) we cannot properly call someone happy if we find her desires, pleasures, circumstances, etc. to be repulsive or otherwise undesirable (Hare 1963, Smart 1973; see also Nozick 1989). It is not clear what the point of such a concept would be, or what of substance—rather than merely linguistic usage—is at issue between such theories and other accounts of “happiness.”

4. For a recent example of an article on the well-being sense, see Vitrano 2010. Most empirical researchers employ the term in the psychological sense; for an apparent exception, see Seligman 2002, though he has lately shifted focus away from the term ‘happiness’ (Seligman 2011). For an older review of the philosophical literature under the heading of “happiness,” see Den Uyl and Machan 1983. For a recent anthology, see Cahn and Vitrano 2008; Bortolotti 2009 is an edited collection of new papers. An accessible collection of papers by philosophers and other researchers can be found in the Spring 2004 issue of Daedalus. An influential discussion of different happiness concepts, focusing mainly on the well-being notion, is Kraut 1979.

5. See, e.g., Brandt 1959, Brandt 1979, 1989, 1992; Campbell 1973; Carson 1978a, 1978b, 1979, 1981; Davis 1981b, 1981a; Ebenstein 1991; Feldman 2010; Griffin 1979, 1986; Mayerfeld 1996, 1999; Morris 2011; Sen 1987a; Sprigge 1987, 1991; and Wilson 1968. For a recent extended defense of hedonism about happiness, see Feldman 2010. Among psychologists, see e.g. Parducci 1995 and Kahneman 1999.

6. Variants of the life satisfaction view appear to include Barrow 1980, 1991, Benditt 1974, 1978, Brülde 2007, Buss 2004, Campbell 1973, Montague 1967, Nozick 1989, Rescher 1972, 1980, Suikkanen 2011, Sumner 1996, 2000, Telfer 1980, and Von Wright 1963. Those making life satisfaction central or identical to well-being, or “happiness” in the well-being sense, appear to include (in addition to some of the aforementioned authors) Almeder 2000, Kekes 1982, 1988, 1992, McFall 1989, Meynell 1969, Scruton 1975, Tatarkiewicz 1976, Thomas 1968, Tiberius 2008, Tiberius and Plakias 2010, Vitrano 2010. Empirical researchers often identify life satisfaction and happiness—notably, Veenhoven 1984, 1997.

7. Haybron 2005, 2008c, 2010, Sizer 2010, and possibly Bok 2010b. A prominent contribution from the lay literature is Ricard 2006. Because hedonistic and emotional state theories have seldom been distinguished, some ostensibly “hedonistic” approaches to happiness might more accurately be characterized as emotional state views. Among empirical researchers, for instance, affect-based approaches to happiness are typically described as hedonistic, yet normally focus on moods and emotions rather than (e.g.) sensory pleasures and pains.

8. The moniker “affect-based” is problematic given that some variants of hedonism conceive of pleasure in non-affective terms, for instance as an attitude of liking or being pleased, where this attitude need not involve affect (e.g., Feldman 2004, 2010). It is possible that such theories, which bear similarities to the life satisfaction view, should be distinguished from more familiar varieties of hedonism.

9. On the significance of life satisfaction for well-being research, see Alexandrova 2005, 2008, Tiberius and Plakias 2010.

10. See Alexandrova 2005, 2008, Tiberius 2006, Tiberius and Plakias 2010, Suikkanen 2011.

11. In recent years several philosophical books have engaged with the empirical literature on happiness or subjective well-being. See, e.g., Bok 2010b, Feldman 2010, Flanagan 2007, Haybron 2008c, Kenny and Kenny 2006, Sumner 1996, Tiberius 2008. For recent discussions of measurement issues, see, e.g., Angner 2010, 2011. For scholarly reviews of this literature, see Kahneman, Diener, et al. 1999, Eid and Larsen 2008, Argyle 2002, Diener and Seligman 2004, Diener, Suh, et al. 1999, and Boniwell and David forthcoming.. Accessible surveys of the literature can be found in Layard 2005, Nettle 2005, Bok 2010a, Diener and Biswas-Diener 2008, Seligman 2002, Seligman 2011.

12. See, e.g., Krueger, Kahneman, et al. 2009.

13. See, e.g., Haybron 2007a, 2008c, Schwitzgebel and Hurlburt 2007, Schwitzgebel 2008, 2011, Goldstein 1981, 2002.

14. Good examples can be found in the recent Gallup studies discussed in section 3.3 (Kahneman and Deaton 2010; Diener, Ng, et al. 2010). These studies roughly assess both life satisfaction and emotional state, using a suite of inquiries about particular types of affect to get at the latter. Compare the World Values Survey, which uses a “happiness” question and a “life satisfaction” question (e.g., Inglehart, Foa, et al. 2008). Straightforwardly hedonistic measures are less common, but see Kahneman, Fredrickson, et al. 1993 and Fredrickson and Kahneman 1993; note that these instruments are not characterized in terms of happiness.

15. For example, Ryff 1989, Waterman 1993, Ryan and Deci 2001, Keyes 2002, Seligman 2002, Seligman 2011. Good discussions of the eudaimonic literature are collected in recent issues of the Journal of Positive Psychology (2008, issue 4), and Journal of Happiness Studies (2008, issue 1).

16. See references in the previous section for reviews of this literature.

17. For reviews of this literature, see Frederick and Loewenstein 1999 and Lucas 2008.

18. See, e.g., Diener, Lucas, et al. 2006, Lucas, Clark, et al. 2004a, 2004b, Lucas 2008, Diener 2008, Lyubomirsky, Sheldon, et al. 2005, Easterlin 2003, Easterlin 2005, Inglehart and Klingemann 2000, Inglehart, Foa, et al. 2008, and Headey 2007, 2008.

19. Heritability figures must be read with considerable caution: among other things, they reflect only the amount of variation within the studied population that can be explained by genes, roughly speaking. If your subjects live in relatively homogeneous environments, heritability findings will increase. Since twin studies tend not to include twins separated and placed in radically different environments—say, contemporary Manhattan versus San Bushmen, or 19th century versus contemporary Dutchmen—they often overstate the heritability of traits relative to the full spectrum of human societies, and correspondingly understate the role of environment.

20. E.g., Biswas-Diener, Vittersø, et al. 2005, Graham 2009, Diener and Suh 2000, Inglehart and Klingemann 2000, Inglehart, Foa, et al. 2008. For a striking informal account of a hunter-gatherer society, the Pirahã, see Everett 2009. What these findings show about well-being depends on the importance of happiness for it (see section 4). Note that high happiness can coexist with low longevity, which is clearly important on most views of well-being. For this reason, happiness measures may be unable to tell the whole story about well-being even if we accept a mental state view of well-being. For an effort rectify this limitation within happiness research, see Veenhoven 2005.

21. For useful surveys and lists, see Myers and Diener 1995, Argyle 1999, 2002, Layard 2005, Bok 2010a.

22. On the last, see, e.g., Kellert and Wilson 1995, Frumkin 2001.

23. Importantly, this study and the Stevenson and Wolfers study use log income instead of raw income, which substantially accounts for the stronger income-life satisfaction correlations than those found in earlier research. While neither metric is unambiguously superior, log income has the advantage of tracking proportional differences in income: a major question, for instance, is the impact of economic growth on happiness. For this purpose, the impact of, say, a five percent gain in income is more relevant than that of a $500 increase, which might represent a large gain for some, small for others.

24. For a recent discussion of these and other doubts about the value of happiness, see Belliotti 2004.

25. See, e.g., Elster 1983, Millgram 2000, Nussbaum 2000, Sen 1987b, 2009.

26. The consensus ends, however, on the question of what virtue entails. Indeed, skeptics about (conventional) morality such as Nietzsche might hold that virtue—acting well—entails immorality, at least relative to conventional standards of morality (see also, e.g., the discussion of “Gaugin” in Williams 1981, and “Admirable Immorality” in Slote 1983). This is one reason to frame the view broadly, in terms of virtue, rather than morality. Hurka’s excellent, accessible discussion of the good life may seem to reject the priority of virtue, but his treatment of virtue as a “lesser” good concerns its contribution to the sum of intrinsic value in a life, not the importance of doing the right thing (Hurka 2010).

27. Other authors who have expressed doubts about the unity of well-being include Griffin 2000, 2007, Raz 1986, 2004, Scanlon 1999.

28. See, e.g., Trout 2005, Loewenstein and Haisley 2008, Thaler and Sunstein 2008, Trout 2009.

29. E.g., Ross and Nisbett 1991, Haidt 2001, Doris 2002, Doris 2009, Christakis, Fowler, et al. 2009.

30. See, e.g., Layard 2005, Dolan and White 2007, Frey 2008, Diener and Seligman 2004, Diener, Lucas, et al. 2009, Bok 2010a. For philosophical discussion, see Kenny and Kenny 2006, Kelman 2005, Alexandrova and Haybron forthcoming, and the papers collected in Posner and Sunstein 2010.

31. For worries about even this sort of paternalism, see Hausman and Welch 2009.

Copyright © 2011 by
Dan Haybron <haybrond@slu.edu>

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