Georg Wilhelm Friedrich Hegel
Along with J. G. Fichte and F. W. J. von Schelling, Hegel (1770–1831) belongs to the period of “German idealism” in the decades following Kant. The most systematic of the post-Kantian idealists, Hegel attempted, throughout his published writings as well as in his lectures, to elaborate a comprehensive and systematic ontology from a “logical” starting point. He is perhaps most well-known for his teleological account of history, an account which was later taken over by Marx and “inverted” into a materialist theory of an historical development culminating in communism. For most of the twentieth century, the “logical” side of Hegel's thought had been largely forgotten, but his political and social philosophy continued to find interest and support. However, since the 1970s, a degree of more general philosophical interest in Hegel's systematic thought has also been revived.
- 1. Life, Work, and Influence
- 2. Hegel's Philosophy
- 3. Hegel's Works
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Born in 1770 in Stuttgart, Hegel spent the years 1788–1793 as a theology student in nearby Tübingen, forming friendships there with fellow students, the future great romantic poet Friedrich Hölderlin (1770–1843) and Friedrich von Schelling (1775–1854), who, like Hegel, would become one of the major figures of the German philosophical scene in the first half of the nineteenth century. These friendships clearly had a major influence on Hegel's philosophical development, and for a while the intellectual lives of the three were closely intertwined.
After graduation Hegel worked as a tutor for families in Bern and then Frankfurt, where he was reunited with Hölderlin. Until around 1800, Hegel devoted himself to developing his ideas on religious and social themes, and seemed to have envisaged a future for himself as a type of modernising and reforming educator, in the image of figures of the German Enlightenment such as Lessing and Schiller. Around the turn of the century, however, under the influence of Hölderlin and Schelling, his interests turned more to issues arising from the “critical” philosophy initiated by Immanuel Kant (1724–1804) and developed by J. G. Fichte (1762–1814). In the 1790s the University of Jena had become a centre for the development of critical philosophy due to the presence of K. L. Reinhold (1757–1823) and then Fichte, and by the end of the decade Schelling, who had been attracted by the presence of Fichte, had established himself there. In 1801 Hegel moved to Jena to join Schelling, although by then the glory days of Jena idealism and its romantic offshoot where effectively over. In late 1801, Hegel published his first philosophical work, The Difference between Fichte's and Schelling's System of Philosophy, and up until 1803 worked closely with Schelling, with whom he edited the Critical Journal of Philosophy. In his “Difference” essay Hegel had argued that Schelling's approach succeeded where Fichte's failed in the project of systematising and thereby completing Kant's transcendental idealism, and on the basis of this type of advocacy came to be dogged for many years by the reputation of being a “mere” follower of Schelling (who was five years his junior).
By late 1806 Hegel had completed his first major work, the Phenomenology of Spirit (published 1807), which showed a divergence from his earlier, seemingly more Schellingian, approach. Schelling, who had left Jena in 1803, interpreted a barbed criticism in the Phenomenology's preface as aimed at him, and their friendship abruptly ended. The occupation of Jena by Napoleon's troops as Hegel was completing the manuscript closed the university and Hegel left the town. Now without a university appointment he worked for a short time, apparently very successfully, as an editor of a newspaper in Bamberg, and then from 1808–1815 as the headmaster and philosophy teacher at a “gymnasium” in Nuremberg. During his time at Nuremberg he married and started a family, and wrote and published his Science of Logic. In 1816 he managed to return to his university career by being appointed to a chair in philosophy at the University of Heidelberg. Then in 1818, he was offered and took up the chair of philosophy at the University of Berlin, the most prestigious position in the German philosophical world. While in Heidelberg he published the Encyclopaedia of the Philosophical Sciences, a systematic work in which an abbreviated version of the earlier Science of Logic (the “Encyclopaedia Logic” or “Lesser Logic”) was followed by the application of its principles to the Philosophy of Nature and the Philosophy of Spirit. In 1821 in Berlin Hegel published his major work in political philosophy, Elements of the Philosophy of Right, based on lectures given at Heidelberg but ultimately grounded in the section of the Encyclopaedia Philosophy of Spirit dealing with “objective spirit.” During the following ten years up to his death in 1831 Hegel enjoyed celebrity at Berlin, and published subsequent versions of the Encyclopaedia. After his death versions of his lectures on philosophy of history, philosophy of religion, aesthetics, and the history of philosophy were published.
After Hegel's death, Schelling, whose reputation had long since been eclipsed by that of Hegel, was invited to take up the chair at Berlin, reputedly because the government of the day had wanted to counter the influence that Hegelian philosophy had exerted on a generation of students. Since the early period of his collaboration with Hegel, Schelling had become more religious in his philosophising and criticised the “rationalism” of Hegel's philosophy. During this time of Schelling's tenure at Berlin, important forms of later critical reaction to Hegelian philosophy developed. Hegel himself had been a supporter of progressive but non-revolutionary politics, but his followers divided into “left-” and “right-wing” factions; from out of the former circle, Karl Marx was to develop his own “scientific” approach to society and history which appropriated many Hegelian ideas into Marx's materialistic outlook. (Later, especially in reaction to orthodox Soviet versions of Marxism, many “Western Marxists” re-incorporated further Hegelian elements back into their forms of Marxist philosophy.) Many of Schelling's own criticisms of Hegel's rationalism found their way into subsequent “existentialist” thought, especially via the writings of Kierkegaard, who had attended Schelling's lectures. Furthermore, the interpretation Schelling offered of Hegel during these years itself helped to shape subsequent generations' understanding of Hegel, contributing to the orthodox or traditional understanding of Hegel as a “metaphysical” thinker in the pre-Kantian “dogmatic” sense.
In academic philosophy, Hegelian idealism underwent a revival in both Great Britain and the United States in the last decades of the nineteenth century. In Britain, where philosophers such as T. H Green and F. H. Bradley had developed metaphysical ideas which they related back to Hegel's thought, Hegel came to be one of the main targets of attack by the founders of the emerging “analytic” movement, Bertrand Russell and G. E. Moore. For Russell, the revolutionary innovations in logic starting in the last decades of the nineteenth century had destroyed Hegel's metaphysics by overturning the Aristotelian logic on which, so Russell claimed, it was based, and in line with this dismissal, Hegel came to be seen within the analytic movement as an historical figure of little genuine philosophical interest. To some degree, analogous things could be said of Hegel's reception from within the twentieth century phenomenological tradition which developed in continental Europe, but although marginalized within such core areas of mainstream academic philosophy, Hegel nevertheless continued to be a figure of interest within other philosophical movements such as existentialism and Marxism. In France, a version of Hegelianism came to influence a generation of thinkers, including Jean-Paul Sartre and the psychoanalyst, Jacques Lacan, largely through the lectures of Alexandre Kojève. However, a later generation of French philosophers coming to prominence in the 1960s tended to react against Hegel in ways analogous to those in which early analytic philosophers had reacted against the Hegel who had influenced their predecessors. In Germany, having lapsed in the second half of the nineteenth century, interest in Hegel was revived at the turn of the twentieth with the historical work of Wilhelm Dilthey, and important Hegelian elements were incorporated within the approaches of thinkers of the Frankfurt School, such as Theodor Adorno, and later, Jürgen Habermas, as well as within the Heidegger-influenced “hermeneutic” approach of H.-G. Gadamer. In Hungary, similar Hegelian themes were developed by Georg Lukács and later thinkers of the “Budapest School.” In the 1960s the German philosopher Klaus Hartmann developed what was termed a “non-metaphysical” interpretation of Hegel which, together with the work of Dieter Henrich and others, played an important role in the revival of interest in Hegel in academic philosophy in the second half of the century. Within English-speaking philosophy, the final quarter of the twentieth century saw something of a revival of serious interest in Hegel's philosophy with important works appearing such as those by H. S. Harris, Charles Taylor, Robert Pippin and Terry Pinkard in North America, and Stephen Houlgate and Robert Stern in Great Britain. By the close of the twentieth century, even within core logico-metaphysical areas of analytic philosophy, a number of individuals such as Robert Brandom and John McDowell had started to take Hegel seriously as a significant modern philosopher, although generally within analytic circles a favourable reassessment of Hegel has still a long way to go.
Hegel's own pithy account of the nature of philosophy given in the “Preface” to his Elements of the Philosophy of Right captures a characteristic tension in his philosophical approach and, in particular, in his approach to the nature and limits of human cognition. “Philosophy,” he says there, “is its own time raised to the level of thought.”
On the one hand we can clearly see in the phrase “its own time” the suggestion of an historical or cultural conditionedness and variability which applies even to the highest form of human cognition, philosophy itself. The contents of philosophical knowledge, we might suspect, will come from the historically changing contents of its cultural context. On the other, there is the hint of such contents being “raised” to some higher level, presumably higher than other levels of cognitive functioning such as those based in everyday perceptual experience, for example, or those characteristic of other areas of culture such as art and religion. This higher level takes the form of conceptually articulated “thought,” a type of cognition commonly taken as capable of having “eternal” contents (think of Plato and Frege, for example).
This antithetical combination within human cognition of the temporally-conditioned and the eternal, a combination which reflects a broader conception of the human being as what Hegel describes elsewhere as a “finite-infinite,” has led to Hegel being regarded in different ways by different types of philosophical readers. For example, an historically-minded pragmatist like Richard Rorty, distrustful of all claims or aspirations to the “God's-eye view,” could praise Hegel as a philosopher who had introduced this historically reflective dimension into philosophy (and set it on the characteristically “romantic” path which has predominated in modern continental philosophy) but who had unfortunately still remained bogged down in the remnants of the Platonistic idea of the search for ahistorical truths (Rorty 1982). Those adopting such an approach to Hegel tend to have in mind the (relatively) young author of the Phenomenology of Spirit and have tended to dismiss as “metaphysical” later and more systematic works like the Science of Logic. In contrast, the British Hegelian movement at the end of the nineteenth century, for example, tended to ignore the Phenomenology and the more historicist dimensions of his thought, and found in Hegel a systematic metaphysician whose Logic provided a systematic and definitive philosophical ontology. This latter traditional “metaphysical” view of Hegel dominated Hegel reception for most of the twentieth century, but from the 1980s came to be challenged by scholars who offered an alternative “non-metaphysical” “post-Kantian” view of Hegel. In turn, the post-Kantian reading has been challenged by a revised metaphysical view, in which appeal is often made to Aristotelian conceptual realist features of Hegel's thought.
Before surveying these competing views, however, something needs to be said about the confusing term “idealism,” and about the variety of idealism that is characteristic of Hegel and other German idealists.
“Idealism” is a term that had been used sporadically by Leibniz and his followers to refer to a type of philosophy that was opposed to materialism. Thus, for example, Leibniz had contrasted Plato as an idealist with Epicurus as a materialist. The opposition to materialism here, together with the fact that in the English-speaking world the Irish philosopher and clergyman George Berkeley (1685-1753) is often taken as a prototypical idealist, has given rise to the assumption that idealism is necessarily an “immaterialist” doctrine. This assumption, however, is mistaken. The idealism of the Germans was not committed to the type of doctrine found in Berkeley according to which immaterial minds, both infinite (God's) and finite (those of humans), were the ultimately real entities, with apparently material things to be understood as reducible to states of such minds—that is, to “ideas” in the sense meant by the British empiricists.
As Leibniz's use of Plato to exemplify idealism suggests, idealists in the German tradition tended to hold to the reality or objectivity of “ideas” in the Platonic sense, and for Plato, it would seem, such ideas were not conceived as “in” any mind at all—not even the mind of Plato's “god”. The type of picture found in Berkeley was only to be found in certain late antique Platonists and, especially, early Christian Platonists like St Augustine, Bishop of Hippo. But especially for post-Kantian idealists like Hegel, Plato's philosophy was understood through the lenses of more Aristotelian varieties of neo-Platonism, which pictured the “thoughts” of the “divine mind” as immanent in matter, and not as contained in some purely immaterial or spiritual mind. It thus had features closer to the more pantheistic picture of divine thought found in Spinoza, for example, for whom matter and mind were attributes of the one substance.
Even for Leibniz, whose later monadological metaphysics was perhaps closer to Berkeley's immaterialist philosophy, an opposition to materialism didn't necessarily imply immaterialism. Leibniz had resisted Descartes' postulation of distinct spiritual and material substances, treating corporeal bodies as inseparable combinations of form and matter after the manner of Aristotle. The “materialists” to which he was opposed (mechanistic corpuscularists of his time) conceived of “unformed” matter as a type of self-subsistent substance, and it seems to have been that conception to which he was opposed, at least in some periods of his work, not the reality of matter per se. Leibniz's combination of Platonic and Aristotelian notions played a role in the thought of the later post-Kantian idealists, giving their opposition to “materialism” its distinctive character, while the post-Kantians moved progressively away from the more “subjectivistic” features of Leibniz's thought (Beiser 2002).
Given the understanding of Hegel that predominated at the time of the birth of analytic philosophy, together with the fact that early analytic philosophers were rebelling precisely against “Hegelianism” so understood, the “Hegel” encountered in discussions within analytic philosophy is often that of the late nineteenth-century interpretation. In this picture, Hegel is seen as offering a metaphysico-religious view of God qua “Absolute Spirit,” as the ultimate reality that we can come to know through pure thought processes alone. In short, Hegel's philosophy is treated as exemplifying the type of pre-critical or “dogmatic” metaphysics against which Kant had reacted in his Critique of Pure Reason, and as a return to a more religiously driven conception of philosophy to which Kant had been opposed.
There is much that can be found in Hegel's writings that seems to support this view. In his lectures during his Berlin period one comes across claims such as the one that philosophy “has no other object but God and so is essentially rational theology”. Indeed, Hegel often seems to invoke imagery consistent with the types of neo-Platonic conceptions of the universe that had been common within Christian mysticism, especially in the German states, in the early modern period. The peculiarity of Hegel's form of idealism, on this account, lies in his idea that the mind of God becomes actual only via its particularization in the minds of “his” finite material creatures. Thus, in our consciousness of God, we somehow serve to realize his own self-consciousness, and, thereby, his own perfection. In English-language interpretations, such a picture is effectively found in the influential work of Charles Taylor (1975), for example. The German Hegel scholar, Rolf-Peter Horstmann (1990, 2006), skeptical of attempts to de-metaphysicalize Hegel, also insists on the idea of an infinite self-reflecting subject as at the core of Hegel's philosophy. With its dark mystical roots, and its overtly religious content, it is hardly surprising that the philosophy of Hegel so understood is regarded as being very distant to the largely secular and “scientific” conceptions of philosophy that have been dominant in the twentieth century.
An important consequence of Hegel's metaphysics, so understood, concerns history and the idea of historical development or progress, and it is as an advocate of an idea concerning the logically-necessitated teleological course of history that Hegel is most often derided. To critics such as Karl Popper (1945), Hegel had not only advocated a disastrous political conception of the state and the relation of its citizens to it, a conception prefiguring twentieth-century totalitarianism, but he had also tried to underpin such advocacy with dubious theo-logico-metaphysical speculations. With his idea of the development of “spirit” in history, Hegel is seen as literalising a way of talking about different cultures in terms of their “spirits,” of constructing a developmental sequence of epochs typical of nineteenth-century ideas of linear historical progress, and then enveloping this story of human progress in terms of one about the developing self-conscious of the cosmos-God itself.
As the bottom line of such an account concerned the evolution of states of a mind (God's), such an account is clearly an idealist one, but not in the sense, say, of Berkeley. The pantheistic legacy inherited by Hegel meant that he had no problem in considering an objective outer world beyond any particular subjective mind. But this objective world itself had to be understood as conceptually informed: it was objectified spirit. Thus in contrast to Berkeleian “subjective idealism” it became common to talk of Hegel as incorporating the “objective idealism” of views, especially common among German historians, in which social life and thought were understood in terms of the conceptual or “spiritual” structures that informed them. But in contrast to both forms of idealism, Hegel, according to this reading, postulated a form of absolute idealism by including both subjective life and the objective cultural practices on which subjective life depended within the dynamics of the development of the self-consciousness and self-actualisation of God, the “Absolute Spirit.”
Despite this seemingly dominant theological theme, Hegel was still seen by many as an important precursor of other more characteristically secular strands of modern thought such as existentialism and Marxist materialism. Existentialists were thought of as taking the idea of the finitude and historical and cultural dependence of individual subjects from Hegel, and as leaving out all pretensions to the “absolute,” while Marxists were thought of as taking the historical dynamics of the Hegelian picture but reinterpreting this in materialist rather than idealist categories. As for understanding Hegel himself, the traditionally "metaphysical" view remained the dominant interpretative approach of Hegel scholars throughout the twentieth century, and different aspects of it can be seen reflected in the contemporary approaches of Frederick Beiser (2005) and Rolf-Peter Horstmann (2006), for example. In the last quarter of the century, however, it came to be vigorously questioned, with a variety of interpreters putting forward very different accounts of the basic nature of Hegel's philosophical project. While a number of interpretations of Hegel have emerged during this period in an effort to acquit him of implausible metaphysico-theological views, one prominent tendency has been to stress the continuity of his ideas with the “critical philosophy” of Immanuel Kant.
Least controversially, it is often claimed that either particular works, such as the Phenomenology of Spirit, or particular areas of Hegel's philosophy, especially his ethical and political philosophy, can be understood as standing independently of the type of unacceptable metaphysical system sketched above. Thus it is commonly asserted that implicit within the “bad” metaphysical Hegel is an anti-metaphysical philosopher struggling to get out—one potentially capable of beating the critical Kant at his own game.
More controversially, one now finds argued that the traditional picture is simply wrong at a more general “metaphysical” level, and that Hegel is, in fact, in no way committed to the bizarre, teleological “spirit monism” that has been traditionally attributed to him. Prominent among such interpretations is the so-called “non-metaphysical“ or “post-Kantian“ interpretation advanced by North American Hegel scholars Robert Pippin (1989, 1997, 2008) and Terry Pinkard (1994, 2000). From a more technically analytic perspective, a broadly similar view has been put forward by Robert Brandom (2002, 2009). Thus while the traditional view sees Hegel as exemplifying the very type of metaphysical speculation that Kant successfully criticised, the post-Kantian view regards him as both accepting and extending Kant's critique, ultimately turning it against the residual “dogmatically metaphysical” aspects of Kant's own philosophy.
In Hegel, the non-traditionalists argue, one can see the ambition to bring together the universalist dimensions of Kant's transcendental program with the culturally contextualist conceptions of his more historically and relativistically-minded contemporaries, resulting in his controversial conception of “spirit,” as developed in his Phenomenology of Spirit. With this notion, it is claimed, Hegel was essentially attempting to answer the Kantian question of the conditions of rational human “mindedness,” rather than being concerned with giving an account of the developing self-consciousness of God. But while Kant had limited such conditions to “formal” abstractly conceived structures of the mind, Hegel extended them to include aspects of historically and socially determined forms of embodied human existence.
Not surprisingly, the non-metaphysical interpretation of Hegel has been resisted by defenders of the more traditional approach, who have argued against the plausibility of attempting to rehabilitate Hegel's philosophy by divesting it of any purportedly unacceptable metaphysical claims (see, for example, Beiser 2005 and Horstmann 2006). Proponents of the non-metaphysical view, it is commonly said, are guilty of projecting onto Hegel views they would like to find there rather than what is actually to be found. However, the non-metaphysical view has also been challenged by a somewhat different version of the metaphysical reading by interpreters who, while affirming the irreducible role played by metaphysics in Hegel's philosophy, do not simply reassert those particular “extravagant” views traditionally ascribed to him. Moreover, those advancing such a “revised” metaphysics to Hegel (sometimes referred to as the “conceptual realist” or “neo-Aristotelian” interpretation) do not ascribe metaphysical views to Hegel simply to dismiss him as having relevance for contemporary philosophy. Rather, here one tends to find interpreters appealing to contemporary analytic metaphysics as exemplifying a legitimate project of philosophical inquiry into fundamental “features” or “structures” of the world itself. And for Hegel, as for Aristotle, such features or structures included a conceptual dimension, hence the designations “neo-Aristotelianism” and “conceptual realism”. Among the interpreters advancing something like this “revised” metaphysical view might be counted Robert Stern (2002, 2009), Kenneth Westphal (2003) and James Kreines (2006, 2008).
On a number of points, the proponents of the revised conceptual realist metaphysical interpretation will agree with advocates of the post-Kantian “non-metaphysical” approach. First, they tend to agree in dismissing much of the “extravagant” metaphysics traditionally ascribed to Hegel. Generally they don't find in Hegel the type of classical teleological spirit monism central to, say, Taylor's interpretation. Next, they stress the importance for Hegel of Kant's critique of metaphysics. Both think that Hegel took Kant's critique seriously, but in turn subjected it itself to a telling meta-critique, showing that Kant himself was not free from the sorts of ungrounded metaphysical assumptions he criticized in others. However, while the post-Kantians interpret Hegel's criticisms of Kant as suggesting that Hegel thereby realized or “completed” Kant's critical intention, creating a form of philosophizing purged of metaphysics, proponents of the revised metaphysical interpretation typically see his criticism of Kant as involving a rejection of Kant's anti-metaphysical attitude, and as reestablishing the metaphysical program originally derived from Aristotle on a new basis.
While it is for the most part clear what sets both post-Kantians and conceptual realists against the traditional view, it is still not clear which issues dividing them are substantive and which are ultimately verbal. After all, Kant himself was not critical of “metaphysics” per se. His claim was that existing (“dogmatic”) metaphysics was in a state analogous to that in which, say, physics had been in before the scientific revolution of sixteenth and seventeenth centuries. Rather than wanting to eliminate metaphysics, after the style, say, of Hume or the modern logical positivists, he had wanted to put metaphysics on a secure “scientific” basis analogous to what Galileo and Newton, say, had achieved for physics. Thus the very idea of an “Hegelian metaphysics” is in no way straightforwardly incompatible with the project of a post-Kantian “completion” of Kant's critical program. The relevant differences between revised metaphysical and the non-metaphysical views would need to be established with respect to such particular issues as, for example, the nature of acceptably “Kantian” metaphysical claims.
The term “phenomenology” had been coined by the German scientist and mathematician (and Kant correspondent) J. H. Lambert (1728–1777), and in a letter to Lambert, sent to accompany a copy of his “Inaugural Dissertation” (1770), Kant had proposed a “general phenomenology” as a necessary “propaedeutic” presupposed by the science of metaphysics. Such a phenomenology was meant to determine the “validity and limitations” of what he called the “principles of sensibility,” principles he had (he thought) shown in the accompanying work to be importantly different to those of conceptual thought. The term clearly suited Kant as he had distinguished the “phenomena” known through the faculty of sensibility from the “noumena” known purely conceptually. This envisioned phenomenology seems to coincide roughly with what he was to eventually entitle a “critique of pure reason,” although Kant's thought had gone through important changes by the time that he came to publish the work of that name (1781, second edition 1787). Perhaps because of this he never again used the term “phenomenology” for quite this purpose.
There is clearly some continuity between this Kantian notion and Hegel's project. In a sense Hegel's phenomenology is a study of “phenomena” (although this is not a realm he would contrast with that of “noumena”) and Hegel's Phenomenology of Spirit is likewise to be regarded as a type of “propaedeutic” to philosophy rather than an exercise in it—an induction or education of the reader to the “standpoint” of purely conceptual thought of philosophy itself. As such, its structure has been compared to that of a “Bildungsroman” (educational novel), having an abstractly conceived protagonist—the bearer of an evolving series of “shapes of consciousness” or the inhabitant of a series of successive phenomenal worlds—whose progress and set-backs the reader follows and learns from. Or at least this is how the work sets out: in the later sections the earlier series of “shapes of consciousness” becomes replaced with what seem more like configurations of human social existence, and the work comes to look more like an account of interlinked forms of social existence and thought, the series of which maps onto the history of western European civilization from the Greeks to Hegel's own time. The fact that it ends in the attainment of “Absolute Knowing,” the standpoint from which real philosophy gets done, seems to support the traditionalist reading in which a “triumphalist” narrative of the growth of western civilization is combined with the theological interpretation of God's self-manifestation and self-comprehension. When Kant had broached the idea of a phenomenological propaedeutic to Lambert, he himself had still believed in the project of a purely conceptual metaphysics achievable by the use of the regressive or “analytic” method. But this project conceived as an exercise in theoretical reason was just what Kant in his later critical philosophy had come to disavow. Traditional readers of Hegel thus see the Phenomenology's telos as attesting to Hegel's “pre-Kantian” (that is, “pre-critical”) outlook, and his embrace of the metaphysical project that Kant famously came to dismiss as illusory. Supporters of the non-metaphysical Hegel obviously interpret this work and its telos differently. For example, it has been argued (e.g., Pinkard 1994) that what this history tracks is the development of a type of social existence which enables a unique form of rationality, in that in such a society all dogmatic bases of thought have been gradually replaced by a system in which all claims become open to rational self-correction, by becoming exposed to demands for conceptually-articulated justifications.
Something of Hegel's phenomenological method may be conveyed by the first few chapters, which are perhaps among the more conventionally philosophical parts (Westphal 2009). Chapters 1 to 3 effectively follow a developmental series of distinct “shapes of consciousness”—jointly epistemological and ontological attitudes articulated by criteria which are, regarded from one direction, criteria for certain knowledge, and from the other, criteria for independent objecthood. In chapter 1, the attitude of “sense-certainty” takes immediately given singular perceptual contents—the sort of role played by “sense data” in some early twentieth-century approaches to epistemology, for example—as the fundamental objects known. By following this form of consciousness's attempts to make these implicit criteria explicit, we are meant to appreciate that any such contents, even the apparently most “immediate” ones, in fact contain implicit conceptually articulated presuppositions, and so, in Hegel's terminology, are “mediated.” One might compare Hegel's point here to that expressed by Kant in his well known claim that without concepts, those singular and immediate mental representations he calls “intuitions” are “blind.” In more recent terminology one might talk of the “concept-” or “theory-ladenness” of all experience, and the lessons of this chapter have been likened to that of Wilfrid Sellars's famous criticism of the “myth of the given” (Sellars 1997).
By the end of this chapter our protagonist consciousness (and by implication, we the audience to this drama) has learnt that the nature of consciousness cannot be as originally thought: rather than being immediate and singular, its contents must have some implicit universal (conceptual) aspect to them. Consciousness thus now commences anew with its new implicit criterion—the assumption that since the contents of consciousness are “universal” they must be publicly graspable by others as well. Hegel's name for this type of perceptual realism in which any individual's idiosyncratic private apprehension will always be in principle correctable by the experience of others is “perception” (Wahrnehmung—in German this term having the connotations of taking (nehmen) to be true (wahr)). In contrast to the object of “sense-certainty,” the object of “perception” is first conceived in a quasi-Aristotelian way—it is internally complex such that some underlying self-identical substrate is thought of as the bearer of accidental and changeable properties. As in the case of “sense-certainty,” here again, by following the protagonist consciousness's efforts to make this implicit criterion explicit, we see how the criterion generates contradictions which eventually undermine it as a criterion for certainty. In fact, such collapse into a type of self-generated scepticism is typical of all the “shapes” we follow in the work, and there seems something inherently skeptical about such reflexive cognitive processes. But this is a “self-completing” form of skepticism. Hegel's point is equally that there has always been something positive that has been learned in such processes, and this learning is more than that which consists in the mere elimination of epistemological dead-ends. Rather, as in the way that the internal contradictions that emerged from sense-certainty had generated a new shape, perception, the collapse of any given attitude always involves the emergence of some new implicit criterion which will be the basis of a new emergent attitude. In the case of “perception,” the emergent new shape of consciousness Hegel calls “the understanding”—a shape which he identifies with scientific cognition rather than that of the more everyday “perception.” Furthermore, the process reveals something about the nature of all such objects of consciousness—the fact that they necessarily change into something other than themselves. In Hegel's terminology, they are “contradictory,” an issue we will touch on below in relation to his logical thought.
The transition from Chapter 3 to Chapter 4, “The Truth of Self-Certainty,” also marks a more general transition from “consciousness” to “self-consciousness.” It is in the course of Chapter 4 that we find what is perhaps the most well-known part of the Phenomenology, the account of the “struggle of recognition” in which Hegel examines the intersubjective conditions which he sees as necessary for any form of “consciousness.” This is a topic that had first been taken up by Alexandre Kojève, and which has been appealed to in non-Kojèvean ways recently by a number of non-traditional interpreters in order to give a quite different account of Hegel's notion of “spirit.”
Like Kant, Hegel thinks that one's capacity to be “conscious” of some external object as something distinct from oneself requires the reflexivity of “self-consciousness,” that is, it requires one's awareness of oneself as a subject for whom something distinct, the object, is presented as known. Hegel goes beyond Kant, however, and expanding on an idea found in Fichte, makes this requirement dependent on one's recognition (or acknowledgment—Anerkennung) of other self-conscious subjects as self-conscious subjects, and, moreover, on one's recognition of them as similarly recognizing oneself as a self-conscious subject. Such patterns of mutual recognition constituing “objective spirit” thereby provide the matrix within which individual self-consciousnesses can exist as such. It is in this way that the Phenomenology can change course, the earlier tracking of “shapes of consciousness” effectively coming to be replaced by the tracking of distinct patterns of “mutual recognition” between subjects, shapes of “spirit” itself.
It is thus that Hegel has effected the transition from a phenomenology of “subjective mind,” as it were, to one of “objective spirit,” thought of as culturally distinct patterns of social interaction analysed in terms of the patterns of reciprocal recognition they embody. (“Geist” can be translated as either “mind” or “spirit,” but the latter, allowing a more cultural sense, as in the phrase “spirit of the age” (“Zeitgeist”), seems a more suitable rendering for the title.) But this is only worked out in the text gradually. We—the reading, “phenomenological” we—can see how particular shapes of self-consciousness, such as that of the other-worldly religious self-consciousness (“unhappy consciousness” ) with which Chapter 4 ends, depend on certain institutionalised forms of mutual recognition, in this case one involving a priest who mediates between the self-conscious subject and that subject's God. But we are seeing this from the “outside,” as it were: we still have to learn how real in situ self-consciousnesses could learn this of themselves. So we have to see how the protagonist self-consciousness could achieve this insight. It is to this end that we further trace the learning path of self-consciousness through the processes of “reason” (in Chapter 5) before “objective spirit” can become the explicit subject matter of Chapter 6 (Spirit).
Hegel's discussion of spirit starts from what he calls “Sittlichkeit” (translated as “ethical order” or “ethical substance”—“Sittlichkeit” being a nominalization from the adjectival (or adverbial) form “sittlich,” “customary,” from the stem “Sitte,” “custom” or “convention.”) Thus Hegel might be seen as adopting the viewpoint that since social life is ordered by customs we can approach the lives of those living in it in terms of the patterns of those customs or conventions themselves—the conventional practices, as it were, constituting specific, shareable forms of life made actual in the lives of particular individuals who had in turn internalized such general patterns in the process of acculturation. It is not surprising then that his account of spirit here starts with a discussion of religious and civic law. Undoubtedly it is Hegel's tendency to nominalise such abstract concepts in his attempt to capture the concrete nature of such patterns of conventional life, together with the tendency to then personify them (as in talking about “spirit” becoming “self-conscious”) that lends plausibility to the traditionalist understanding of Hegel. But for non-traditionalists it is not obvious that Hegel is in any way committed to any metaphysical supra-individual conscious being with such usages. To take an example, in the second section of the chapter “Spirit,” Hegel discusses “culture” as the “world of self-alienated spirit.” The idea seems to be that humans in society not only interact, but that they collectively create relatively enduring cultural products (stories, dramas, and so forth) within which they can recognise their own patterns of life as reflected. We might find intelligible the idea that such products “hold up a mirror to society” within which “the society can regard itself,” without thinking we are thereby committed to some supra-individual social “mind” achieving self-consciousness. Furthermore, such cultural products themselves provide conditions allowing individuals to adopt particular cognitive attitudes. Thus, for example, the capacity to adopt the type of objective viewpoint demanded by Kantian morality (discussed in the final section of Spirit) — the capacity to see things, as it were, from a “universal” point of view — is bound up with the attitude implicitly adopted in engaging with spirit's “alienations.”
We might think that if Kant had written the Phenomenology, he would have ended it at Chapter 6 with the modern moral subject as the telos of the story. For Kant, the practical knowledge of morality, orienting one within the noumenal world, exceeds the scope of theoretical knowledge which had been limited to phenomena. Hegel, however, thought that philosophy had to unify theoretical and practical knowledge, and so the Phenomenology has further to go. Again, this is seen differently by traditionalists and revisionists. For traditionalists, Chapters 7, “Religion” and 8, “Absolute Knowing,” testify to Hegel's disregard for Kant's critical limitation of theoretical knowledge to empirical experience. Revisionists, on the other hand, tend to see Hegel as furthering the Kantian critique into the very coherence of a conception of an “in-itself” reality which is beyond the limits of our theoretical (but not practical) cognition. Rather than understand “absolute knowing” as the achievement of some ultimate “God's-eye view” of everything, the philosophical analogue to the connection with God sought in religion, non-metaphysical interpreters see it as the accession to a mode of self-critical thought that has finally abandoned all non-questionable mythical “givens,” and which will only countenance reason-giving argument as justification. However we understand this, absolute knowing is the standpoint to which Hegel has hoped to bring the reader in this complex work. This is the “standpoint of science,” the standpoint from which philosophy proper commences, and it commences in Hegel's next book, the Science of Logic.
Hegel's Science of Logic, the three constituent “books” of which appeared in 1812, 1813, and 1816 respectively, is unlikely to be received with the degree of enthusiasm among contemporary readers that often accompanies readings of the “Phenomenology of Spirit.” First, it is a work that few contemporary logicians would recognise as a work of logic, and many readers sympathetic to Hegel have insisted on quarantining his defensible ideas from it (e.g., Wood 1990). However, rather than be understood as a treatise in formal (or “general” ) logic, it is perhaps best understood as a version of what Kant had called “transcendental logic,” and in this sense thought of as a successor to Kant's “transcendental deduction of the categories” in the Critique of Pure Reason in which Kant attempted to “deduce” a list of those non-empirical concepts, the “categories,” which he believed to be presupposed by all empirical judgments made by finite, discursive knowers like ourselves. However, many have remained critical of “post-Kantian” attempts to play down the strong ontological claims that seem to be implicit in this work.
A glance at the table of contents of Science of Logic reveals the same triadic structuring noted among the “shapes of consciousness” in the Phenomenology. At the highest level of its branching structure there are three “books,” devoted to the doctrines of “being,” “essence,” and “concept” respectively. In turn, each book has three sections, each section containing three chapters, and so on. In general each of these nodes deals with some particular category or “thought determination,” sometimes the first subheading under a node having the same name as the node itself. In fact, Hegel's categorial triads appear to repeat Kant's own triadic way of articulating the categories in the “Table of Categories,” in which the third term in the triad in some way integrates the first two. (In Hegel's later terminology, one would say that the first two were “sublated” [aufgehoben] in the third). Hegel's later treatment of the syllogism found in Book 3, in which he follows Aristotle's own three-termed schematism of the syllogistic structure, repeats the triadic structure as does his analysis of concepts into the moments of “universality,” “particularity,” and “singularity.” Hegel's logical triads are often regarded as expressions of an artificial and functionless formalism, but it should be remembered that in the later nineteenth century, no less a logician than Charles Sanders Peirce came to a similar idea about the fundamentally trinary structure of the categories of thought.
Reading into the first chapter of Book 1, “Being,” it is quickly seen that the Logic repeats the movements of the first chapters of the Phenomenology, now, however, at the level of “thought” rather than conscious experience. Thus, “being” is the thought determination with which the work commences because it at first seems to be the most “immediate,” fundamental determination characterising any possible thought content at all. It apparently has no internal structure (in contrast to the way that “bachelor,” say, has a structure containing further concepts “male” and “unmarried”). Again parallel to the Phenomenology, it is the effort of thought to make such contents explicit that both undermines them and brings about new contents. “Being” seems to be both “immediate” and simple, but reflection reveals that it itself is, in fact, only meaningful in opposition to another concept, “nothing.” In fact, the attempt to think “being” as immediate, and so as not mediated by its opposing concept “nothing,” has so deprived it of any determinacy or meaning at all that it effectively becomes nothing. That is, on reflection it is grasped as having passed over into its “negation.” Thus, while “being” and “nothing” seem both absolutely distinct and opposed, from another point of view they appear the same as no criterion can be invoked which differentiates them. The only way out of this paradox is to posit a third category, “becoming,” which seems to save thinking from paralysis because it accommodates both concepts: “becoming” contains “being” and “nothing” since when something “becomes” it passes, as it were, from nothingness to being. That is, when something becomes it seems to possess aspects of both being and nothingness, and it is in this sense that the third category of such triads can be understood as containing the first two as sublated “moments.”
In general this is how the Logic proceeds: seeking its most basic and universal determination, thought posits a category to be reflected upon, finds then that this collapses due to a “contradiction” generated, but then seeks a further category with which to make retrospective sense of that contradiction. This new category is more complex as it has internal structure in the way that “becoming” contains “being” and “nothing” as moments. But in turn the new category will generate some further contradictory negation and again the demand will arise for a further concept which will reconcile these opposed concepts by incorporating them as moments. Such a method invoking “determinate negation” is often described as deriving from Spinoza's claim that “all determination is negation,” but it can be just as readily seen as a consequence of Hegel's use of Aristotle's term logic. In term logics, negation is understood as a relation existing primarily between terms of the same type: a colour concept such as “red,” for example, will be understood as meaningful in as much as it stands in opposition to an array of contrary colour terms such as “blue, ” “green, ” and so on. In contrast, in logics which take the proposition as the fundamental semantic unit (such as the classical predicate calculus deriving from Frege and accepted by most analytic philosophers), negation is typically regarded as applying primarily to whole propositions rather than to sub-sentential units. Hegel exploits the role of negation at a variety of levels. For example, the relation between the bare demonstratives “this” and “that” instantiates the relation of determinate negation, as does that between qualitative predicates, as for example, “red” and “green“ as instances of the more universal concept, colour. Typically, problems of determination at one level are resolved by invoking the next more complex level: even if we could indicate contrastively what we meant by “this” by invoking a contrasting “that,” we will be reliant on the presupposed ability to refer to the kind of thing we have in mind, as when we refer to “this colour” or “this shape” and so on.
In this way, then, the categorical infrastructure of thought is supposed to be able to be unpacked with only the use of those resources available to thought itself: thought's capacity to make its contents determinate (in a way somewhat like what Leibniz had thought of as making clear but confused ideas clear and distinct), as well as its refusal to tolerate contradictions. As has been mentioned, Hegel's logic might best be considered as akin to a “transcendental” not a “formal” logic. Rather than treating the pure “form” of thought that has been abstracted from any possible content, transcendental logic treats thought that already possesses a certain type of content that Kant had called (predictably) “transcendental content.” But if Hegel's is a transcendental logic, it is clearly different from Kant's. For Kant, transcendental logic was the logic governing the thought of finite thinkers like ourselves, whose cognition was constrained by the necessity of applying general discursive concepts to the singular contents given in sensory intuitions, and he kept open the possibility that there could be a kind of thinker not so constrained—God, whose thought could apply directly to the world in a type of “intellectual” intuition. Again, opinions divide as to how Hegel's approach to logic relates to that of Kant. Traditionalists see Hegel as treating the finite thought of individual human discursive intellects as a type of “distributed” vehicle for the classically conceived infinite and intuitive thought of God. Non-traditionalists, in contrast, see the post-Kantians as removing the last residual remnant of the mythical idea of transcendent godly thought from Kant's approach. On their account, the very opposition that Kant has between finite human thought and infinite godly thought is suspect, and the removal of this mythical obstacle allows an expanded role for “transcendental content.”
Regardless of how we interpret this however, it is important to grasp that for Hegel logic is not simply a science of the form of our thoughts but is also a science of actual “content” as well, and as such is a type of ontology. Thus it is not just about the concepts “being,” “nothing,” “becoming” and so on, but about being, nothing, becoming and so on, themselves. This in turn is linked to Hegel's radically non-representationalist (and in some sense “direct realist” ) understanding of thought. The world is not “represented” in thought by a type of “proxy” standing for it, but rather is presented, exhibited, or made manifest for the mind in thought. (In recent analytic philosophy, John McDowell in his Mind and World has presented an account of thought with this type of character, and has explicitly drawn a parallel to the approach of Hegel.) Moreover, Hegel seems to believe that the variety of metaphysical positions found in the history of philosophy can be understood in terms of the tendency to prioritize one particular level of determined content. For example, Plato when thinking of things as bundles or “envelopes” of individual property instances (“the white,” “the hot,” and so on), and Aristotle, when thinking of things as instances of kinds within which accidental properties inhere, would be privileging those contents that would be picked out by bare demonstratives on the one hand, and “this such” type expressions, on the other.
The thought determinations of Book 1 lead eventually into those of Book 2, “The Doctrine of Essence.” Naturally the structures implicit in “essence” thinking are more developed than those of “being” thinking. Crucially, the contrasting pair “essence” and “appearance” allow the thought of some underlying reality which manifests itself through a different overlying appearance, a relation not able to be captured in the simpler “being” structures. But distinctions such as “essence” and “appearance” will themselves instantiate the relation of determinate negation, and the metaphysical tendency to think of reality as made up of some underlying substrates in contrast to the superficial appearances will itself come to grief with the discovery that the notion of an “essence” is only meaningful in contrast to the “appearance” that it is meant to explain away. For Hegel it is the complex modern, but pre-Kantian, versions of substance metaphysics, like those of Spinoza and Leibniz, that bring out in the most developed way the inherent contradictory nature of this form of thought.
Book 3, “The Doctrine of Concept,” effects a shift from the “Objective Logic” of Books 1 and 2, to “Subjective Logic,” and metaphysically coincides with a shift to the modern subject-based ontology of Kant. Just as Kantian philosophy is founded on a conception of objectivity secured by conceptual coherence, Concept-logic commences with the concept of “concept” itself! While in the two books of objective logic, the movement had been between particular concepts, “being,” “nothing,” “becoming” etc., in the subjective logic, the conceptual relations are grasped at a meta-level, such that the concept “concept” treated in Chapter 1 of section 1 (“Subjectivity” ) passes over into that of “judgment” in Chapter 2, as judgments are the larger wholes within which concepts gain their proper content. When the anti-foundationalism and holism of the Phenomenology is recalled, it will come as no surprise that the concept of judgment passes over into that of “syllogism.” For Hegel just as a concept gains its determinacy in the context of the judgments within which it is applied, so too do judgements gain their determinacy within larger patterns of inference. When Hegel declares the syllogism to be “the truth” of the judgment, he might be thought, as has been suggested by Robert Brandom (2002), to be advocating a view somewhat akin to contemporary “inferentialist” approaches to semantics. On these approaches, an utterance gains its semantic content not from any combination of its already meaningful sub-sentential components, but from the particular inferential “commitments and entitlements” acquired when it is offered to others in practices presupposing the asking for and giving of reasons. Thought of in terms of the framework of Kant's “transcendental logic,” Hegel's position would be akin to allowing inferences — “syllogisms” — a role in the determination of “transcendental content,” a role which is not apparent in Kant.
We might see then how the different ways of approaching Hegel's logic will be reflected in the interpretation given to the puzzling claim in Book 3 concerning the syllogism becoming “concrete” and “pregnant with” a content that has necessary existence. In contrast with Kant, Hegel seems to go beyond a “transcendental deduction” of the formal conditions of experience and thought and to a deduction of their material conditions. Traditionalists will here point to Hegel's allusions to the “ontological argument” of medieval theology in which the existence of God is seen as necessitated by his concept—an argument undermined by Kant's criticism of the treatment of existence as a predicate. In Hegel's version, it would be said, the objective existence that God achieves in the world is seen as necessitated by his essential self-consciousness. Any non-metaphysical reading, in contrast, would have to interpret this aspect of Hegel's logic very differently.
As already noted, for Hegel, the logic of inference has a “transcendental content” in a way analogous to that possessed by the logic of judgment in Kant's transcendental logic. It is this which is behind the idea that the treatment of the formal syllogisms of inference will lead to a consideration of those syllogisms as “pregnant with content.” But for logic to be truly ontological a further step “beyond” Kant is necessary. For the post-Kantians, Kant had been mistaken in restricting the conditions of experience and thought to a “subjective” status. Kant's idea of our knowledge as restricted to the world as it is for us requires us to have a concept of the noumenal as that which cannot be known, the concept “noumenon” playing the purely negative role of giving a determinate sense to “phenomenon” by specifying its limits. That is, for Kant we need to be able to think of our experience and knowledge as finite and conditioned, and this is achieved in terms of a concept of a realm we cannot know. But, as the principle of determinate negation implies, if the concept “noumenon” is to provide some sort of boundary to that of “phenomenon,” then it cannot be the merely negative concept that Kant supposed. Only a concept with a content can determine the limits of the content of some other concept (as when our empirical concept of “river,” for example, is made determinate by opposing empirical concepts like “stream” or “creek”). The positing of a noumenal realm must, contra Kant, be the positing of a realm about which we can have some understanding.
This need felt by the post-Kantians for having a contentful concept of the “noumenal” or the “in itself” can also be seen from the inverse perspective. For Kant, sensation testifies to the existence of an objective noumenal world beyond us, but this world cannot be known as such: we can only know that world as it appears to us from within the constraints of the subjective conditions of our experience and thought. But for Hegel, such an attitude attributes to a wholly inadequate form of cognition (sensation or feeling) a power that is being denied to a much more determinate form—that articulated by concepts. To think that our inarticulate sensations or feelings give us a truer account of reality than that of which we are capable via the scientific exercise of conceptualised thought indicates a type of irrationalist potential lurking within Kantian thought, a potential that Hegel thought was being realised by the approach of his romantic contemporaries. The rational kernel of Kant's approach, then, had to be carried beyond the limits of a method in which the conditions of thought and experience were regarded as merely subjective. Rather than restrict its scope to “formal” conditions of experience and thought, it had to be understood as capable of revealing the objective or material conditions. Transcendental logic must thereby become ontological. Again, it looks as if Hegel must relapse into a “pre-critical” form of metaphysics, one from which Kant himself never quite suceeded in escaping, but once more, even here elements of Hegel's position can be interpreted as continuing or radicalizing Kant's unfinished break with “dogmatic” metaphysics, elements that come into focus when Hegel's peculiar position on “contradiction” is taken into account.
Throughout the succession of transitions between shapes of phenomenal objectivity in the Phenomenology, or between different “thought determinations” in the Logic, Hegel appeals to the “negativity” involved when thought's objects turn into their determining opposites. As Hegel points out, the sense-certaintist's certainty in the objectivity of what is present to her “here” and “now” becomes confounded when what is “here” and “now” becomes (presumably with the passage of time) something “there” and “then.” This contradiction refutes the sense-certaintist's criteria of objectivity, but it also, for Hegel, reveals a truth about determinate reality: it reveals its fundamentally self-negating character. That a content that is now becomes something then is not some accidental fact about such contents. This might now be thought to coincide with Hegel's peculiar attitude to the “antinomies” within which, according to Kant, reason becomes entangled when it tries to give content to its properly “regulative” ideas. For Kant, it reveals the limits beyond which “pure reason,” in its theoretical use, cannot go; for Hegel, it reveals the contradictory nature of reason's proper objects. Thus while in a certain sense Hegel agrees with Kant's diagnosis of the internally contradictory nature of pure reason itself, his interpretation of the significance of this phenomenon is radically different to that given by Kant.
Again this works at a variety of levels. Consider the attitude towards objectivity roughly correlating with “perception” in which the stability of the identity of some individual substance is purchased by making a distinction between its essential and accidental properties, for example. Thus, while we initially think of the wax as white, solid, cold and so on, on reflection we come to think of the wax itself as that which endures throughout changes in such properties: it is essentially, then, neither white nor colourless, solid nor liquid, and so on. From Aristotle's ontological standpoint, the essence-accident distinction had been invoked to deal with the “contradiction” involved in thinking, for example, that a piece of wax was both white and colourless, both solid and liquid. But, as was suggested earlier, the introduced essence-accident or reality-appearance distinction appealed to here will, from an Hegelian point of view, itself instantiate the relation of determinate negation. That is, the substrate underlying the properties—the thing which bears the properties—cannot be some “I know not what:” it must itself have some thinkable content. This will lead thought to the positing of forces or powers as the true defining essences of such individual substances, but this move in turn means that what it is that makes the wax what it is can no longer be regarded as something that is stable and self-identical beneath its superficial changes. Forces and powers cannot be thought of in this way. They are forms of objectivity that we posit only in as much as they have effects and, moreover, they are such that they, in some sense, dissipate themselves in their effects.
It is with his critique of “the law of identity,” and the postulation of his own version of the “law of contradiction” (for Hegel, the law that everything is contradictory) that Hegel's controversial attitude to logical contradiction comes to the fore. Again it must be remembered, however, that Hegel's logic is not a formal one. (And while more akin to Kant's “transcendental” logic, it is still not equivalent to that conception of logic either.) Hegel's attitude to the law of contradiction may be non-standard, but he is not claiming that the conjunct of a proposition and its negation can be true. Nevertheless, it does seem that he is denying that the law of contradiction can stand as a normative law for actual thinking. The law of contradiction standardly understood presupposes the abstract self-identity and enduring nature of the contents that are thought, and this, as we have seen, appears to be incompatible with the very process of determinate negation through which thought achieves its determinate contents.
Like the Science of Logic, the Encyclopaedia of the Philosophical Sciences is itself divided into three parts: a Logic; a Philosophy of Nature; and a Philosophy of Spirit. The same triadic pattern in the Philosophy of Spirit results in the philosophies of subjective spirit, objective spirit, and absolute spirit. The first of these constitutes Hegel's philosophy of mind, the last, his philosophy of art, religion, and philosophy itself. The philosophy of objective spirit concerns the objective patterns of social interaction and the cultural institutions within which “spirit” is objectified. The book entitled Elements of the Philosophy of Right, published in 1821 as a textbook to accompany Hegel's lectures at the University of Berlin, essentially corresponds to a more developed version of the section on “Objective Spirit” in the Philosophy of Spirit.
The Philosophy of Right (as it is more commonly called) can be, and has been (e.g., Wood 1990), read as a political philosophy which stands independently of the system, but it is clear that Hegel intended it to be read against the background of the developing conceptual determinations of the Logic. The text proper starts from the conception of a singular willing subject (grasped from its own first-person point of view) as the bearer of “abstract right.” While this conception of the individual willing subject with some kind of fundamental right is in fact the starting point of many modern political philosophies (such as that of Locke, for example) the fact that Hegel commences here does not testify to any ontological assumption that the consciously willing and right-bearing individual is the basic atom from which all society can be understood as constructed—an idea at the heart of standard “social contract” theories. Rather, this is merely the most “immediate” starting point of Hegel's presentation and corresponds to analogous starting places of the Logic. Just as the categories of the Logic develop in a way meant to demonstrate that what had at the start been conceived as simple is in fact only made determinate in virtue of its being part of some larger structure or process, here too it is meant to be shown that any simple willing and right-bearing subject only gains its determinacy in virtue of a place it finds for itself in a larger social, and ultimately historical, structure or process. Thus, even a contractual exchange (the minimal social interaction for contract theorists) is not to be thought simply as an occurrence consequent upon the existence of two beings with natural wants and some natural calculative rationality; rather, the system of interaction within which individual exchanges take place (the economy) will be treated holistically as a culturally-shaped form of social life within which the actual wants of individuals as well as their reasoning powers are given determinate forms.
Here too it becomes apparent that Hegel follows Fichte in treating property in terms of a recognitive analysis of the nature of such a right. A contractual exchange of commodities between two individuals itself involves an implicit act of recognition in as much as each, in giving something to the other in exchange for what they want, is thereby recognizing that other as a proprietor of that thing, or, more properly, of the inalienable value attaching to it. By contrast, such proprietorship would be denied rather than recognised in fraud or theft—forms of “wrong” (Unrecht) in which right is negated rather than acknowledged or posited. Thus what differentiates property from mere possession is that it is grounded in a relation of reciprocal recognition between two willing subjects. Moreover, it is in the exchange relation that we can see what it means for Hegel for individual subjects to share a “common will”—an idea which will have important implications with respect to the difference of Hegel's conception of the state from that of Rousseau. Such an interactive constitution of the common will means that for Hegel such an identity of will is achieved because of not in spite of a co-existing difference between the particular wills of the subjects involved: while contracting individuals both “will” the same exchange, at a more concrete level, they do so with different ends in mind. Each wants something different from the exchange.
Hegel passes from the abstract individualism of “Abstract Right” to the social determinacies of “Sittlichkeit” or “Ethical Life” via considerations first of “wrong” (the negation of right) and its punishment (the negation of wrong, and hence the “negation of the negation” of the original right), and then of “morality,” conceived more or less as an internalisation of the external legal relations. Consideration of Hegel's version of the retributivist approach to punishment affords a good example of his use of the logic of “negation.” In punishing the criminal the state makes it clear to its members that it is the acknowledgment of right per se that is essential to developed social life: the significance of “acknowledging another's right” in the contractual exchange cannot be, as it at first might have appeared to the participants, simply that of being a way of each getting what he or she wants from the other. Hegel's treatment of punishment also brings out the continuity of his way of conceiving of the structure and dynamics of the social world with that of Kant, as Kant too, in his Metaphysics of Morals had employed the idea of the state's punitive action as a negating of the original criminal act. Kant's idea, conceived on the model of the physical principle of action and reaction, was structured by the category of “community” or reciprocal interaction, and was conceived as involving what he called “real opposition.” Such an idea of opposed dynamic forces seems to form something of a model for Hegel's idea of contradiction and the starting point for his conception of reciprocal recognition. Nevertheless, clearly Hegel articulates the structures of recognition in more complex ways than those derivable from Kant's category of community.
First of all, in Hegel's analysis of Sittlichkeit the type of sociality found in the market-based “civil society” is to be understood as dependent upon and in contrastive opposition with the more immediate form found in the institution of the family: a form of sociality mediated by a quasi-natural inter-subjective recognition rooted in sentiment and feeling, love. Here Hegel seems to have extended Fichte's legally characterized notion of recognition into the types of human intersubjectivity earlier broached by Hölderlin. In the family the particularity of each individual tends to be absorbed into the social unit, giving this manifestation of Sittlichkeit a one-sidedness that is the inverse of that found in market relations in which participants grasp themselves in the first instance as separate individuals who then enter into relationships that are external to them.
These two opposite but interlocking principles of social existence provide the basic structures in terms of which the component parts of the modern state are articulated and understood. As both contribute particular characteristics to the subjects involved in them, part of the problem for the rational state will be to ensure that each of these two principles mediates the other, each thereby mitigating the one-sidedness of the other. Thus, individuals who encounter each other in the “external” relations of the market place and who have their subjectivity shaped by such relations also belong to families where they are subject to opposed influences. Moreover, even within the ensemble of production and exchange mechanisms of civil society individuals will belong to particular “estates” (the agricultural estate, that of trade and industry, and the “universal estate” of civil servants), whose internal forms of sociality will show family-like features.
Although the actual details of Hegel's “mapping” of the categorical structures of the Logic onto the Philosophy of Right are far from clear, the general motivation is apparent. Hegel's logical categories can be read as an attempt to provide a schematic account of the material (rather than formal) conditions required for developed self-consciousness. Thus we might regard the various “syllogisms” of Hegel's Subjective Logic as attempts to chart the skeletal structures of those different types of recognitive inter-subjectivity necessary to sustain various aspects of rational cognitive and conative functioning (“self-consciousness”). From this perspective, we might see his “logical” schematisation of the modern “rational” state as a way of displaying just those sorts of institutions that a state must provide if it is to answer Rousseau's question of the form of association needed for the formation and expression of the “general will.”
Concretely, for Hegel it is representation of the estates within the legislative bodies that is to achieve this. As the estates of civil society group their members according to their common interests, and as the deputies elected from the estates to the legislative bodies give voice to those interests within the deliberative processes of legislation, the outcome of this process might give expression to the general interest. But Hegel's “republicanism” is here cut short by his invocation of the familial principle: such representative bodies can only provide the content of the legislation to a constitutional monarch who must add to it the form of the royal decree—an individual “I will ….” To declare that for Hegel the monarch plays only a “symbolic” role here is to miss the fundamentally idealist complexion of his political philosophy. The expression of the general will in legislation cannot be thought of as an outcome of some quasi-mechanical process: it must be willed. If legislation is to express the general will, citizens must recognize it as expressing their wills; and this means, recognising it as willed. The monarch's explicit “I will” is thus needed to close this recognitive circle, lest legislation look like a mechanical compromise resulting from a clash of interests, and so as actively willed by nobody. Thus while Hegel is critical of standard “social contract” theories, his own conception of the state is still clearly a complicated transformation of those of Rousseau and Kant.
Perhaps one of the most influential parts of Hegel's Philosophy of Right concerns his analysis of the contradictions of the unfettered capitalist economy. On the one hand, Hegel agreed with Adam Smith that the interlinking of productive activities allowed by the modern market meant that “subjective selfishness” turned into a “contribution towards the satisfaction of the needs of everyone else.” But this did not mean that he accepted Smith's idea that this “general plenty” produced thereby diffused (or “trickled down” ) though the rest of society. From within the type of consciousness generated within civil society, in which individuals are grasped as “bearers of rights” abstracted from the particular concrete relationships to which they belong, Smithean optimism may seem justified. But this simply attests to the one-sidedness of this type of abstract thought, and the need for it to be mediated by the type of consciousness based in the family in which individuals are grasped in terms of the way they belong to the social body. In fact, the unfettered operation of the market produces a class caught in a spiral of poverty. Starting from this analysis, Marx later used it as evidence of the need to abolish the individual proprietorial rights at the heart of Hegel's “civil society” and socialise the means of production. Hegel, however, did not draw this conclusion. His conception of the exchange contract as a form of recognition that played an essential role within the state's capacity to provide the conditions for the existence of rational and free-willing subjects would certainly prevent such a move. Rather, the economy was to be contained within an over-arching institutional framework of the state, and its social effects offset by welfarist state intervention.
Some of Hegel's most telling criticisms of the unmediated effects of modern civil society concern those on the psychological lives of individuals. Recently, an approach to social reality with Hegelian provenance that uses the notion of recognition to articulate such “pathologies” has been developed by Axel Honneth (1995, 2010), testifying to the continuing relevance of Hegel's analyses.
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