Paul-Henri Thiry (Baron) d'Holbach

First published Fri Sep 6, 2002; substantive revision Wed Aug 25, 2010

Paul-Henri Thiry, Baron d'Holbach was a philosopher, translator, and prominent social figure of the French Enlightenment. In his philosophical writings Holbach developed a deterministic and materialistic metaphysics which grounded his polemics against organized religion and his utilitarian ethical and political theory. As a translator, Holbach made significant contributions to the European Enlightenment in science and religion. He translated German works on chemistry and geology into French, summarizing many of the German advances in these areas in his entries in Diderot's Encyclopedia. Holbach also translated important English works on religion and political philosophy into French. Holbach remains best known, however, for his role in Parisian society. The close circle of intellectuals that Holbach hosted and, in various ways, sponsored produced the Encyclopedia and a number of revisionary religious, ethical, and political works that contributed to the ideological basis for the French Revolution. Despite the radical views of many members of his coterie, however, Holbach's broader visiting guest list included many of the most prominent intellectual and political figures in Europe. His salon, then, was at once a shelter for radical thought and a hub of mainstream culture.


1. Biography

Holbach was born in 1723 in Edesheim. He was raised in Paris, principally by his uncle, Franciscus Adam d'Holbach, and attended the University of Leiden from 1744 to 1748 or 1749. Holbach particularly enjoyed the parties there. It is likely that, at least at first, the dinners Holbach gave in Paris were modelled on the parties he attended at Leiden. In 1749, Holbach married his second cousin, Basile-Geneviève d'Aine. About 1753 or 1754 both his uncle, Franciscus, and his father in law died, leaving Holbach a considerable fortune.

Holbach used his great wealth to throw the dinner parties for which he is famous. He owned a house in Paris in rue Royale, butte Saint-Roche, which, generally, had a guest list restricted to serious intellectuals, and a chateau at Grandval where, in addition to his coterie, Holbach also hosted social friends and relatives. Holbach's coterie included intellectuals who, although their positions varied on many issues, shared at least a willingness to entertain views that many would have thought too radical to be discussed in social settings. The coterie met from the 1750's into the 1780's. The group evolved over time, but its core members, Alan Kors has argued, were Denis Diderot, the encyclopedist; the diplomat and cultural critic Friedrich-Melchior Grimm; the naturalist Charles-Georges Le Roy; the writer and critic Jean-François Marmontel; the historian and priest abbé Guillame-Thomas-François Raynal; the doctor Augustin Roux; the poet and philosopher Jean-François de Saint-Lambert; the writer Jean-Baptiste-Antoine Suard; the pamphleteer François-Jean, chevalier de Chastellux, the pamphleteer abbé André Morellet; and the philosopher Jacques-André Naigeon. Many of these men were, like Holbach, avowed atheists and many also pushed radical, even revolutionary political agendas. So the general character of his coterie might suggest that Holbach was a figure on the fringe of Parisian society, a kind of eccentric parvenu with a taste for scandal.

What is really remarkable about Holbach, however, is that he managed, despite what one might expect, to keep his coterie firmly in the mainstream of European society. French nobles, as well as ambassadors from countries across Europe — Denmark, England, Naples, Saxe-Gotha, Saxe-Coburg-Gotha, Wurtemburg, and Sweden -- attended his dinners. So did prominent intellectuals of all kinds, including, at different times and with different degrees of enthusiasm, the philosopher and novelist Jean-Jacques Rousseau, the mathematician Jean Le Rond d'Alembert, the historian Edward Gibbon, the writer Horace Walpole, the chemist Joseph Priestley, the social critic Cesare Beccaria, the philosopher Nicolas-Antoine Boulanger, the statesman and scientist Benjamin Franklin, the actor David Garrick, the philosopher Claude-Adrien Helvétius, the philosopher David Hume, the economist Adam Smith, and the novelist Lawrence Stern. Holbach was known in France not primarily as a political radical but as le premier maître d'hôtel de la philosophie. Many in Paris coveted invitations to rue Royale, and Holbach's house was the first stop for many prominent international visitors.

Holbach's character must have been remarkable to have maintained a salon in which the espousers of political and religious reform met so freely and so often with visitors who either cannot have been accustomed to such open dialogue or who were themselves parts of the establishment under attack. Indeed Rousseau, who himself came to feel unwelcome by the coterie, nevertheless memorializes Holbach in La nouvelle Heloïse, as the paradoxical figure, Womar, an athiest who nonetheless embodies all of the Christian virtues. In addition to his good character, Holbach's generosity at table (his dinners and especially his wine were famously good) and in supporting many of his acquaintances may explain his success at being both a pillar and a critic of society. Perhaps, also, Holbach was not in the eyes of many of his contemporaries as clearly a radical as some other members of his coterie. He did publish some of the most notorious works of the French Enlightenment, including Le Christianisme Dévoilé (Christianity Unveiled), Système de la nature (System of Nature) and Le Bon-sens (Common Sense). These books evoked long and heated responses from such notable figures as Voltaire, abbé Bergier, and Frederick the Great; System of Nature and Common Sense were condemned by the parlaiment of Paris and publicly burned. Holbach, however, was not in his own time as notorious as his books. He was careful always to publish anonymously, so that those who did not know him or who did not care to think of him in that way, might have remained at least partially ignorant of his religious and political views.

Holbach's coterie met for thirty years, from the early 1750's until about 1780. During that time his first wife died and he married her younger sister, Charlotte Suzanne d'Aine, with whom he had four children. Holbach wrote prolificly throughout this time. According to Vercruysse, Holbach authored or coauthored over fifty books and over four hundred articles. He died in 1789.

2. Metaphysics: Matter and Motion, Cause and Effect

The metaphysical position with which Holbach is most often associated is a negative one: atheism. Although indeed Holbach devotes the entire second volume of Système de la nature and all of Le bon sens to the defense of atheism and the criticism of particular claims about God, his views do not hold great philosophical interest. They emphasize well worn topics such as the problem of evil, the impossibility of discussing intelligibly what is unknowable, the suspect psychological origins of religious belief, and the confusion of traditional descriptions of God in terms that are simply the negation of genuine descriptive terms: for example, to say that God is infinite is just to deny that God is finite. None of these arguments is unique to Holbach or especially well presented by him. His positive metaphysics, on the other hand, has been somewhat overshadowed by his long and loud expressions of atheism, and it will be the focus of this discussion.

Holbach takes nature to consist in matter and motion and nothing else. Nature is known to us, when it can be known, as a sequence of causes and effects:

The universe, that vast assemblage of every thing that exists, presents only matter and motion: the whole offers to our contemplation nothing but an immense, an uninterrupted succession of causes and effects. [System of Nature, 15]

Holbach's metaphysics, then, is mechanistic, in that any correct explanation of an event will refer only to matter, motion, and the laws which describe their combination. Holbach's ambitious attempt to draw from this sparse metaphysics answers to questions often thought to involve something more than this, his Système de la nature is badly marred, in some places, by over-simplification and, in others, by dogmatism. Indeed Goethe in his memoirs (Dichtung und Wahrheit vol. 9, 490–492) credits the account of nature in this work with forever turning him away from French philosophy. Nevertheless, Holbach's metaphysics does form the basis for his engaging religious, ethical, and political views, and it does so by means of an innovative recasting of a traditional account of the properties of matter.

Holbach's account of matter may best be understood against the background of the Lockean account, which is more familiar and from which in large part it is developed. (Israel 2006 traces the sources of the views of Holbach and the coterie in detail.) On Locke's account of bodies (Book 2, Chapter 8 of his Essay), all bodies possess “real” or “primary” qualities (solidity, extension, figure, number, and motion). Real qualities are those which are “inseparable” from the bodies themselves. To take Locke's example (Essay 2.8.9), a grain of wheat will have solidity, extension, figure and so on when it is intact, and it will retain these properties whatever happens to it. Locke distinguishes primary qualities from powers in bodies to produce sensations in observers, which he calls secondary qualities. Secondary qualities, for example, are color, sound, taste, and so on. Because he hesitates to call secondary qualities real qualities, it is clear that Locke takes them to have a metaphysical status different from that he gives primary qualities.

There may be several different ways of accounting for Locke's distinction between primary and secondary qualities. The important aspect of the distinction for the present discussion is that on Locke's view we ought always to explain a secondary quality in terms of a primary quality by which it produces the relevant sensation in us. Colors, sounds, smells and so on are on Locke's account powers that a body has as a result of its particular shape, motion, and so on which produce the relevant sensations in observers: “[Secondary qualities] are only Powers to act differently upon other things, which Powers result from the different Modifications of those primary qualities” (Essay 2.8.23). For example, in arguing that some, apparently more genuine properties of fire, such as heat, are really on the same footing with qualities such as the tendency to melt wax that are more obviously relational, Locke holds that each of these qualities alike are powers that a body has in virtue of its primary qualities to produce certain effects[my emphasis added]: “…the power in fire to produce a new color, or consistency in wax or clay by its primary qualities is as much a quality in fire, as the power it has to produce in me a new idea or sensation of warmth or burning” (Essay 2.8.10). For Locke, then, all bodies have primary qualities, and any secondary qualities that they have are to be understood in terms of the primary qualities that produce them.

Holbach maintains something like Locke's distinction between primary and secondary qualities, but he does not insist that the properties of bodies that Locke calls secondary qualities, are properties that bodies possess in virtue of particular primary qualities. Matter, for Holbach, is whatever makes up bodies and causes the sense impressions that we have of them. Matter, in general, may be said to have properties in the sense that there are some properties that anything which is matter will possess. These properties are roughly the Lockean primary qualities (with the important exception of motion, of which more below). However, Holbach holds that matter is a class, rather than a particular thing, since different objects may possess different properties as well:

A satisfactory definition of matter has not yet been given…[Man] looked upon it as a unique being…whilst he ought to have contemplated it as a genus of beings, of which the individuals, although they might possess some common properties, such as extent, divisibility, figure, etc., should not, however, be all ranked in the same class, nor comprised under the same denomination.

So we may say that both a fire and a building have extent, divisibility and so on, but that a building has some properties, such as grayness, that fire lacks and that fire has some properties, such as luminance, that the building lacks. It may be that some of the properties that some but not all particular bodies have are to be understood in terms of primary qualities, but Holbach does not insist on this point. The properties which Locke called secondary qualities are not distinguished from primary qualities by the fact that they are rightly understood in terms of them. Rather, the only distinction between these properties and primary qualities is that primary qualities are in all matter alike and secondary qualities are in only some bodies. Of fire, for example, Holbach writes:

Fire, besides these general properties common to all matter, enjoys also the peculiar property of being put into activity by a motion producing on our organs of feeling the sensation of heat and by another, which communicates to our visual organs the sensation of light. [System of Nature, 24]

Fire, in other words, besides having figure, extension and the other properties of matter in general, has also the “peculiar” properties of heat and luminance. These further properties are, metaphysically, no different from the properties common to all matter, on Holbach's view, and they belong to fire in just as basic and just as mysterious a way as its extent and figure.

Holbach's choice of example reflects a likely familiarity with criticisms of the Lockean basis for the distinction between primary and secondary qualities found in the writings of Berkeley and Holbach's friend and correspondent, Hume. Both of these authors use the example of the feeling of pain in heat (Berkeley, Three Dialogues I; Hume Treatise 1.4.4, 3) as a first step in demonstrating the mind-dependence of all properties of body alike and so of casting into doubt any supposed difference in kind between primary and secondary qualities.

Holbach's recasting of the distinction between primary and secondary qualities in terms of properties that matter possesses universally and properties that only some bodies possess helps him to avoid the Berkeleyan criticism of the distinction. Holbach never claims, as Locke does, that properties such as color and sound have a metaphysical status different from that of the primary qualities. Lockean secondary qualities are, for Holbach, basic, inexplicable qualities of matter on a par with extension and solidity and distinguished from them only on the grounds that they are possessed by some bodies and not others. Because Holbach allows that some matter possesses qualities that other matter does not possess, his notion of matter is more varied than Locke's. For Locke, all matter is homogenous, in the sense that it possesses all of the primary qualities and no other real qualities besides. For Holbach, matter is heterogenous. It is a

genus of beings, of which the individuals, although they might possess some common properties, such as extent, divisibility, figure, etc., should not, however, be all ranked in the same class, nor comprised under the same general denomination. [System of Nature, 3]

The heterogeneity of matter in Holbach's metaphysics puts him at a disadvantage to the traditional Lockean view, in a sense. Locke's account of matter, if true, is simpler and has great explanatory power: the full panoply of sensations that we encounter are to be explained by an account of our sensory organs, a short list of primary qualities, and the laws which govern their interaction. Holbach, on the other hand, requires separate explanations for each perceived property. He promises an explanation of all phenomena in terms of matter and motion, but delivers not even a framework for such an explanation.

In another sense, though, the heterogeneity of matter is helpful to Holbach's project. Materialistic accounts of human nature are often thought to fail just because human beings seem to have properties, such as thought and freedom, that matter does not have. In making matter a genus of varied beings, Holbach creates a view flexible enough to accommodate an account of human nature more robust than that of many other materialists:

…Man is, as a whole, the result of a certain combination of matter, endowed with particular properties, competent to give, capable of receiving, certain impulses, the arrangement of which is called organization, of which the essence is, to feel, to think, to act, to move, after a manner distinguished from other beings with which he can be compared. Man, therefore, ranks in an order, in a system, in a class by himself, which differs from that of other animals, in whom we do not perceive those properties of which he is possessed. [ System of Nature 15]

Holbach's naturalism requires that human nature be understood in terms of laws and that human action be comprehended under universal determinism. But it allows that, in many ways, human beings may differ in kind from other bodies, even animals, and it allows that human beings may have many properties, notably thought, that have traditionally been denied to matter.

The heterogeneity of matter in Holbach's account contributes to the vagueness of that designation. Matter can to some extent be understood the ordinary sense of anything that has extention, figure, and so on. However, because matter also may or may not have any number of properties not ordinarily understood to belong to matter, such as thought, it is not entirely clear what may not be matter. Motion is likewise and for similar reasons a vague term in Holbach. Where matter is understood simply as extension and some other very simple properties, motion may be thought of in similarly simple terms, as a velocity, acceleration or, perhaps, as an impulse with a certain direction. Once matter is thought of, after the manner of Holbach, as something with properties which are perhaps best not understood in spatial terms, its motion may be much more difficult to define. Although he sometimes speaks of matter and motion in narrower senses, Holbach's tendency is simply to identify matter and motion with the general terms cause and effect. Holbach typically identifies bodies with causes and motions with effects, but he also allows that motions may be causes:

A cause is a being which puts another in motion, or which produces some change in it. The effect is the change produced in one body by the motion or presence of another. [System of Nature 16]

To understand human beings and human society in terms of matter and motion, then, is simply to understand them in terms of causes and effects. Holbach's naturalism in ethics and political theory extends to a commitment to ground those disciplines in an account of human nature understood in terms of lawlike regularities, most importantly, psychological laws. But Holbach is not a naturalist in the stricter sense of attempting to understand human beings in terms of the same laws that explain the rest of nature. Determinism is universal, in Holbach's view, but different sorts of bodies may have peculiar properties that require peculiar explanations. Despite his avowed materialism, Holbach does not demand the sorts of reductive explanations of mental events that materialism might ordinarily seem to require.

3. Ethics: Virtue for the Sake of Happiness

Holbach's ethics is naturalistic in the sense described. Like his major influence in this area, Spinoza, he undertakes to explain human beings with the same clarity and rigor that others explain geometry (Eléments de la morale universelle, Preface). The laws that Holbach depends upon in accounting for human nature are primarily psychological laws. For Holbach, unlike his naturalist predecessors, man is a dominion within a dominion. Like Spinoza and Hobbes, Holbach holds that each person seeks his own preservation (System of Nature, 40; cf, Spinoza's Ethics IIIp9 and Hobbes's De Homine, Chap. 11 — Holbach's is still the most widely available French translation of the latter). As both of these authors do, Holbach associates the ends of action also with happiness, so that happiness and self-preservation are, in his ethics, generally speaking related, and an individual's interest is understood by Holbach in terms of either (and where he distinguishes between them, both) of these.

Ethics on Holbach's account, then, amounts to enlightened self-interest, vice to a failure to recognize the means to one's interest, and moral rules to hypothetical imperatives which dictate the means to happiness or self-preservation:

[Man] was ignorant of his true interests; hence his irregularities, his intemperance, his shameful voluptuousness, with that long train of vices to which he has abandoned himself, at the expense of his preservation, at the risk of his permanent felicity. [System of Nature, 14]

Because people desire what morality provides, they will as a matter of course be motivated to do what is moral, provided they know what that is. The ignorance that Holbach describes here, however, is what causes people to fail to act rightly. So what ethics requires is an investigation into ignorance: In what respects are people ignorant? What are the most dangerous forms of ignorance? How is ignorance to be overcome?

One of the most dangerous kinds of ignorance, on Holbach's analysis, is an ignorance of nature and, in particular, of the causes of good and evil in it. Like Spinoza, Holbach argues that we tend to personify nature, projecting our interests and purposes onto matter that is, in fact, different from us (System of Nature, App. 17; cf, Spinoza's Ethics I, App.). This produces, on Holbach's account, the belief in God and other religious beliefs (such as the belief in heaven and hell and immortality) which in turn cause us to pursue self-preservation in misguided ways:

The ignorance of natural causes created Gods, and imposture made them terrible. Man lived unhappy, because he was told that God had condemned him to misery. He never entertained a wish of breaking his chains, as he was taught, that stupidity, that the renouncing of reason, mental debility, and spiritual debasement, were the means of obtaining eternal felicity. [System of Nature, 349–350]

Holbach was notorious in the 18th century for his atheism and for his criticisms of Christianity. Indeed today these topics most frequently engage philosophers and historians who study Holbach (see Kors 2005 and Fonnesu 2006, for example), and Holbach continues to be a hero of defenders of atheism, including the popular philosopher Michel Onfrey. There is no doubt that a great deal of what Holbach wrote was inflammatory and intended to be so. However, the fact that at least some of his polemics, furious though they may have been, arose in the context of developing an account of virtue should mitigate the impression of Holbach as a purely destructive thinker or (merely) a lover of scandal. His criticism of religion, and of Catholicism in particular, is founded at least in part in the conviction that religion is the source of vice and unhappiness and that virtue can only fostered in people who seek to preserve themselves in the world of their immediate acquaintance:

Renounce your vague hopes; disengage yourself from overwhelming fears…do not attempt to plunge your views into an impenetrable future… …Only think then, of making yourself happy in that existence which is known to you; if you would preserve yourself, be temperate, moderate, and reasonable; if you seek to render your existence durable, do not be prodigal of pleasure; abstain from everything that can be harmful to yourself or others. [System of Nature, 162; cf. Spinoza's Ethics IVP42C2S]

Holbach's ethics, as Rousseau recognized, is not nearly as revisionary as his theology. As this passage makes clear, his conception of human virtue is quite traditional. Preservation and happiness, as Holbach conceives them, involve most of the same practices that the religious views Holbach denounces require for eternal preservation and felicity. Perhaps the principal practical difference between morality as Holbach conceives it and the Christian morality as Holbach understands it lies in the self-abnegation Holbach finds valued in Christian morality. For Holbach, temperance, moderation and so on are virtues that one acquires out of a love for pleasure and life. On the other hand, he takes these virtues, as they are understood traditionally, to involve an unhealthy denial of one's love for wine, food and other familiar pleasures. Temperance and moderation, for Holbach are the best means to the enjoyment of wine and food, whereas in the views he criticizes they are virtues by which we deny the value of such enjoyment.

4. Political Theory: Ethocracy

Holbach's political theory, which he developed for the most part after his metaphysics and ethics, extends his ethical views to the state. Having described human interest as happiness and preservation in the System of Nature and Common Sense in 1770 and 1772, Holbach went on to develop a notion of the just state or, to use his own term, “ethocracy,” founded for the purposes of securing the general welfare. This theory is presented in several works published during the 1770's, La politique naturelle (Natural Politics, 1773), Système social (The Social System, 1773), La morale universelle (Universal Morality, 1776), and Ethocratie (Ethocracy, 1776). Holbach's foundational view is that the most valuable thing a person seeking self-preservation can do is to unite with another person: “Man is of all beings the most necessary to man” (Sysème social, 76; cf. Spinoza's Ethics IVP35C1, C2, and S). Society, when it is just, unites for the common purpose of preservation and the securing of welfare, and society contracts with government for this purpose.

Holbach's theory of social contract has two stages. The first is social. When individuals realize that others are the greatest helps to their own welfare, they make a pact with one another, uniting in order to obtain personal and proprietary security and other benefits of society (Universal Morality 1.86; Politique Naturelle, 1.1). To strike such a pact is part of each person's reason:

Help me…and I will help you with all my talents..work for my happiness if you want me to concern myself with yours…Secure for me advantages great enough to persuade me to give up to you a part of those which I possess. [Politique Naturelle 1.1, Ladd's translation]

This social contract, the contract between individuals in society is never broken.

The second stage of the social contract is more narrowly political. It is a contract that society, in order to secure the general welfare, strikes with a sovereign power, usually understood by Holbach to be a king limited, or at least informed by, a body of elected representatives (La politique naturelle 3.17). This second social contract for Holbach, as for Locke, may be broken. Holbach is a thoroughgoing utilitarian: where the government fails to secure the general welfare, which consists principally in securing property and basic freedoms such as the freedoms of speech and religion, society has a right to revolution (La politique naturelle, 4.5).

Perhaps because of the less cautious advocacy of right to revolution among other members of his coterie, particularly Naigeon, or perhaps because he criticized the kings of his time so fiercely, Holbach is sometimes regarded as an advocate of revolution. Holbach's discussion is tentative, however. He describes the right in La politique naturelle (4.5 ff.) as a product of the natural instinct for self-preservation. Like Hobbes (Leviathan, XXIX, 23), Holbach expects that obedience to a sovereign will break down where individuals feel the need to secure their own lives. This is also why sovereigns need to take care to look after citizens' welfare and education. Where they fail to do these things, citizens come to be ruled not by reason but by passion, and revolution results. Holbach's right to revolution, then, is less an advocacy of revolution than a warning to avoid the conditions that lead to it.

Bibliography

Primary Literature: Selected Works of Holbach

  • Le Christianisme dévoilé, Nancy, 1761.
  • Système de la nature, 2 volumes, London, 1770.
  • System of Nature, translated by H.D. Robinson, New York: Burt Franklin, 1970.
  • Le Bons-Sens, London, 1772.
  • La politique naturelle, London, 1773.
  • Système social, 3 volumes, London, 1773.
  • La moral universelle, 3 volumes, Amsterdam, 1776.
  • Ethocratie, Amsterdam, 1776.

Other Primary Sources

  • Bergier, abbé, Examen du materialisme, 2 volumes, Paris, 1769.
  • Goethe, J.W. von, Werke, 14 volumes, Hamburg, 1967.
  • Hobbes, Thomas Leviathan, ed. Edwin Curley, Indianapolis: Hackett, 1994.
  • Locke, John, An Essay Concerning Human Understanding, ed. Peter Nidditch, Clarendon: Oxford, 1975.
  • Spinoza, Benedictus, Spinoza Opera, Volume 2, ed. Carl Gebhart, Heidelberg: Carl Winters, 1925.

Secondary Literature

  • Fonnesu, Luca (2006), “The Problem of Theodicy,” in The Cambridge History of Eighteenth Century Philosophy, ed. Knud Haakonssen, 2 volumes, New York: Cambridge University Press, Volume 2, pp. 749–778.
  • Israel, Jonathan (2006), Enlightenment Contested: Philosophy, Modernity, and the Emancipation of Man 1670–1752, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Kors, Alan (1976), D'Holbach's Coterie, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • ––– (2005), “Atheism and Scepticism in the Late French Enlightenment,” in Scepticisme et modernité, eds. Marc André Bernier and Sébastien Charles, Saint-Étienne: Publications de l'Université de Saint-Étienne.
  • Ladd, Everett C., Jr. (1962), “Helvétius and d'Holbach,” Journal of the History of Ideas, 23 (2): 221–238.
  • Llana, James (2000), “Natural History and the Encyclopédie,” Journal of the History of Biology 33 (1): pp. 1–25.
  • Onfrey, Michel (2007), Athiest Manifesto: The Case against Christianity, Judaism, and Islam, trans. Jeremy Leggatt, New York: Arcade Publishing.
  • Vercruysse, J. (1971), Bibliographie descriptive des écrits du baron d'Holbach, Paris.

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