Philosophy in Al-Andalus developed later among Muslims than among Jews, although both communities were nurtured by a common Oriental philosophical tradition in Arabic. The Muslim community was much larger and it defined the cultural space. The great figure of Medieval Judaism Shelomo Ibn Gabirol or Avicebron (1021–1058) was also a talented philosopher; he was active in Saragossa. He preceded, by over two generations, the first Muslim philosopher of Al-Andalus, Ibn Bâjja (d. 1139), active also in that town. The reasons for the later development of philosophy in Muslim Al-Andalus, therefore, cannot be explained by the fact that the country was situated far away from that nurturing source.
The cause is likely that philosophy was never central to the Islamic intellectual constellation and that it flourished in peripheral areas, geographical as well as doctrinal. The greatest evidence is Ibn Sînâ (d. 1037) who lived in the Iranian provinces and in a Shiite environment. Al-Andalus was peripheral in geographical, but not in doctrinal, terms. The country followed Sunni orthodoxy and the Malekite school of law prevailed while Ash‛arite theology was weakly cultivated. When Abû l-Qâsim Ṣâ‛id Ibn Ṣâ‛id (d. 1070) devoted a chapter of his world history of the sciences and philosophy to Al-Andalus, his information about philosophy was significantly scarce (Ṣâ‛id 1998, pp. 96–108; 1991, pp. 58–78). In spite of the circumstances, philosophy in Al-Andalus blossomed into maturity with Ibn Bâjja.
Abû Bakr Muḥammad Ibn Yaḥyà ibn aṣ-Ṣâ’igh at-Tûjîbî Ibn Bâjja was known to the Latin philosophers as Avempace. We can assume that he was born in Saragossa around 1085, when the city was the capital of the Taifa kingdom of the Banû Hûd; Yûsuf al-Mu’tamin Ibn Hûd reigned from 1081–1085, and his successor al-Musta‛în II reigned until the year 1110 when he was killed in the battle of Valtierra. Alfonso the Christian King of Aragon won this battle. Avempace may have been in the service of al-Musta‛în II Ibn Hûd (Maqqarî 1968, vol. 7, p. 25). He was followed by ‛Imâd ad-Dawla Ibn Hûd who stayed in power only for a few months. In the same year, 1110, he was overthrown by the Almoravid Sultan ‛Alî ibn Yûsuf Ibn Tâshufîn (ruled 1107–1143), who sent Abû ‛Abd Allâh Muḥammad Ibn al-Ḥâjj, governor of Valencia (and the East province), with the Almoravid army to conquer Saragossa. ‛Imâd ad-Dawla had to leave the town and retire to Rueda, a fortress located some distance from Saragossa.
After Ibn al-Ḥâjj's death in 1114, the Almoravid Sultan appointed his brother-in-law Abû Bakr ‛Alî ibn Ibrâhîm aṣ-Ṣahrawî, known as Ibn Tîfilwît, as the governor of the province. The connection of Avempace to Ibn Tîfilwît is well attested by both Ibn Ḥaqân and Ibn al-Khaṭîb. Avempace composed panegyrics for Ibn Tîfilwît who rewarded him lavishly. Avempace also wrote poems of the muwasshaḥa kind that pleased him, and they both enjoyed music and wine. Abû Bakr Ibn Tîfilwît nominated Avempace his vizier, and Avempace went to meet the deposed ‛Imâd ad-Dawla Ibn Hûd King in his castle apparently in a diplomatic mission, but he ended up in jail for some months. Ibn Tîfilwît died in 510 AH/1116 CE in an operation against the Christians and Avempace composed moving elegies in his memory.
King Alfonso the Battler conquered Saragossa from the Almoravids on December 18, 1118, after a long blockade. It is not clear whether Avempace then left town or had already left. We know that he looked for shelter in Xàtiba in the court of Abû Isḥ’âq Ibrahîm ibn Yûsuf Ibn Tâshufîn, known as Ibn Tâ‛yâsht because Tâ‛yâsht was the name of his Berber mother. Ibrahîm was a brother of the caliph, and governor of Murcia and the Eastern part of al-Andalus. Avempace was again imprisoned and we may guess the causes. Abû Marwân ‛Abd Malik bn Abî l-‛Alâ’ Zuhr (d. 1161) was a famous physician in the service of Ibrâhîm (he wrote for him the Kitâb al-Iqtiṣâd), and al-Maqqarî informs us that there was an extreme enmity between Avempace and the father of ‛Abd al-Malik, also a physician, named Abu l-‛Alâ’ Zuhr (d. 1130) (Maqqarî 1968, vol. 3, pp. 432–434). Even worse for him, Abû Naṣr al-Fatḥ Ibn Muḥammad Ibn Khaqân (d. 1134?) was also a courtier of Ibn Ta‛yâsht, to whom he devoted the Qalâ’id al-iqyân a poetry anthology where he contemptuously put Avempace in last place (Ibn Khaqân 1966, pp. 346–353). The court of Ibrâhîm ibn Yûsuf was not a welcoming place for him.
In spite of the incident, Avempace remained within the Almoravid circle for the rest of his life and for approximately twenty years served as vizier of the mentioned Yaḥyà ibn Yûsuf Ibn Tâshufîn, another brother of the Sultan ‛Alî Ibn Yûsuf Ibn Tâshufîn (d. 1143) in the Maghrib. Vincent Lagardère has done the most extended research on the Almoravids in recent times and provided us with information on all the children of Yûsuf Ibn Tâshufîn (Lagardère 1989, pp. 80 and 174–178). Nevertheless, he has not found any information on Yaḥyà other than he was a son of Yûsuf and his wife Zaynab, and that he was born around 477 AH/1084 CE. Thus, he was of a similar age to Avempace.
From around 1118 until 1136, we have no information on Avempace's life. In 1136, he was in Seville and his disciple Abû l-Ḥasan Ibn al-Imâm was in his company (Ibn Bâjja 1983, p. 87). Three years later, in Ramadan 533 (May 1139), Avempace died in Fez.
As for the causes of his death, several sources point to poisoning. Al-Maqqarî recounts that Ibn Ma‛yûb, a servant of the physician Abû l-‛Alâ’ Ibn Zuhr, his enemy, was suspected of poisoning him with an eggplant (Maqqarî 1968, vol. 4, pp. 12–13), but Abû l-‛Alâ’ Zuhr (not Ibn Zuhr) had already died in 1130 at Cordova, and lived in Seville most of his life.
The Almoravids bestowed their support on Avempace and other non religious scholars in spite of being very reverential to the Malikite jurists. Abû ‛Abd Allâh Mâlik ibn Yaḥyà Ibn Wuhaib al-Azdî (1061–1130) (Dunlop 1955b, Predecessors, 100–116) cultivated all sciences including philosophy but none of his works is extant. Nevertheless, the Amîr al-Mu’minîn ‛Alî ibn Yûsuf Ibn Tâshufîn made him his vizier and his friend. Al-Maqqarî informs us that ‛Alî called him from Seville to Marrakech and appointed him qâḍî of Marrakech. He ordered him to discuss religious matters with Ibn Tûmart, the founder of the Almoravid dynasty (Maqqarî 1968, vol. 3, pp. 479–480). Al-Maqqarî says that Avempace supported him, but we do not know anything more about their relationship (Maqqarî 1968, vol. 3, p. 434).
We are better informed about his friends Abû Ja‛far Yûsuf ibn Ḥasday and Abû l-Ḥasan ‛Alî ibn ‛Abd al-‛Azîz Ibn al-Imâm al-Anṣârî. Ibn al-Imâm was from Saragossa too and was vizier of Abû Ṽâhir Tamîm Ibn Yûsuf Ibn Tâshufîn al-Mu‛izz, (1072–1126) the eldest son of Yûsuf Ibn Tâshufîn, brother of the ruling Sultan and governor of Granada and later of the whole al-Andalus. Tamîm was a hero, being the winner in the battle of Uclés in 1108.
Ibn al-Imâm and Avempace were friends for years; we have several letters that Avempace wrote to him on philosophical issues. Dunlop translated the beginning of an incomplete letter of Avempace to Ibn al-Imâm in which Avempace refers to a treatise he composed during his second imprisonment. As Ibn Khaqân reported, Avempace was imprisoned by Abû Isḥ’âq Ibrahîm ibn Yûsuf Ibn Tâshufîn for a second time, after 1118.
Avempace's works are mainly preserved in five manuscripts: Oxford Bodleian Pococke 206, Berlin Ahlwardt 5060 WE87 (now Krakow, Biblioteka Jagielloska), Tashkent 2385/92, Cairo, Dâr al-kutub, Akhlâq 290, Ankara, Library of the Faculty of History and Geography, Ismail Saib I 1696 (Taylor 1982). The copyist of manuscript Pococke 206 wrote on folio 120a that he copied his text from an original that included the handwriting of Ibn al-Imâm. “The vizier finished the reading of this section under him [Avempace] on the 15th of Ramadan 530” (June 17, 1136) and the place was Seville (Ibn Bâjja Rasâ’il, p. 87). Ibn al-Imâm was governor (‛âmil) of the town and in charge of the poll-tax, the copyist added.
Ibn al-Imâm decided to move to the East. Avempace composed the Epistle of the Farewell Message as a spiritual companion for the travel. Since Avempace died in May 1139, Ibn al-Imâm left al-Andalus between 1136 and 1139, after he finished copying many texts of Avempace which he took with him. From his manuscript another one, the Pococke 206, was copied in Qûṣ, in the upper Egypt in 547 AH/1152 CE by al-Ḥasan ibn Muḥammad ibn Muḥammad ibn Muḥammad Ibn an-Naḍr when Ibn al-Imâm was alive. Thus, 1152 is the earliest date for Ibn al-Imâm's death.
Abû Ja‛far Yûsuf ibn Ḥasdây is also the recipient of a letter from Avempace in which he refers to the astronomer az-Zarqâlluh, Azarquiel (d. ca. 1000), and also writes about his own order of learning. Ibn Abî Uṣaybi‛a includes in his biography his history of physicians, and reports his friendship with Avempace. Ṣâ‛id Ibn Ṣâ‛id gives a biography of probably his grandfather, Abû l-Faḍl Ḥasdây ibn Yûsuf (fl. 485 AH/1092 CE), “of the city of Saragossa and of the Jewish nobility in al-Andalus” who was first to read Aristotle's Physics and De caelo in al-Andalus.
Abû Ja‛far Yûsuf ibn Ḥasdây moved to the East and from 1121 to 1125 he worked for al-Ma’mûn al-Baṭâ’ihî, a vizier of the Fatimid Caliph al-Âmir. He wrote for him commentaries on Hippocrates and was involved in building an observatory at Cairo known as the Ma’mûnî Observatory (Maqrizî 1913, pp. 174–176). The observatory was demolished when the vizier fell into disgrace in 1125. Dunlop added a few names to the circle of Avempace, like Abû l-Ḥasan Ibn Jûdî, a younger friend, but Mâlik Ibn Wuhaib, ‛Alî Ibn al-Imâm and Abû Ja‛far Ibn Ḥasday are the outstanding figures in his circle.
Ibn al-Imâm (Avempace 1968, 177–178) produced the first list of Avempace's writings, followed by Ibn Abû Uṣaybi‛a (1886, 2001), and the extant ones are found in the manuscripts Escorial, Derenbourg 612, Oxford, Pococke 206, Berlin, Ahlwardt, 5060 (now Krakow), and Tashkent 2385. A scholarly account was first made by the late Jamâl ad-Dîn al-‛Alawî (1983) who not only analyzed manuscripts and printings, but also tried to establish the chronology of the writings and, on this basis, a developmental account of his thought.
Al-‛Alawî based his chronology on the before mentioned letter which Avempace sent to his friend Abû Ja‛far Yûsuf ibn Ḥasdây in which he explained that he first learned about mathematical sciences, music and astronomy. He went on to study logic using the books of Alfarabi and later devoted himself to physics, the philosophy of nature. We understand that Avempace had not worked with metaphysics yet. Al-‛Alawî distinguished three stages in Avempace's development and classified his writings according to these stages. His writings on music, astronomy and logic belong to the first stage; those on natural philosophy to the second; and those most representative of his thinking—the Rule of the Solitary, the Epistle of Conjunction and the Farewell Message—to the third and last stage.
Avempace himself tells us how these sciences are organized. Ibn Bâjja followed other Andalusians in turning to Abû Naṣr al-Fârâbî, Alfarabi (d. ca. 950), for instruction in logic and in classifying the sciences. Alfarabi is the author of a treatise “enumerating” the sciences (Fârâbî 1952) and some books of the introductory genre: Epistle with which the book on logic begins (Dunlop 1957b, Risâlah), Sections containing all what needs the beginner in logic (Dunlop 1955a, Introductory), and the Book of the Eisagoge or Introduction (Dunlop 1956).
Avempace wrote commentaries on many of them, beginning with his annotations on the Chapters and on the Eisagoge, mixed with ones on the Categories. His annotations are preserved in two manuscripts: Oxford Pococke 206 and, to a larger extent, Escorial Derenbourg 612. These annotations on the three books belonging to the introductory genre are often intermingled and may offer different versions (‛Alawî 1983, pp. 80–83).
Porphyry's Eisagoge was translated into Arabic by Abû ‛Uthmân Ya‛qûb ad-Dimashqî (fl. 914) and his translation was used by Alfarabi in his Book of the Eisagoge (Îsâghûjî) or Introduction (Madkhal). In his Eisagoge, Porphyry established five universal “meanings”: genus, species, differentia, property, and accident, as the foundations of logic, the first element of a chain, the highest development of which is the syllogism. Alfarabi opened his Introduction with the following statement:
Our purpose in this book is the enumeration of the things of which judgments are composed and into which they are divided, i.e., the parts of parts of the syllogistic expressions employed in general in all the syllogistic arts (Dunlop, Eisagoge, 1956, p. 127; Arabic, p. 118: 3–4).
Avempace comments on his words but when he comes to “in all the syllogistic arts”, he moves to another treatise of Alfarabi (Dunlop 1957b, Risâlah, Arabic, pp. 225–225, English transl. 230–231), and seizes the opportunity to expound on their common classification of the syllogistic arts. There are five: “philosophy and the [four] arts”. The four arts are dialectic, sophistic, rhetoric, and poetry. He uses Alfarabi's words and explains what makes them syllogistic: “It is in the nature of the syllogistic arts to be employed [for their own sake] once they are assembled and completed, and not to have an action as their end”.
Philosophy embraces all beings “insofar as it knows them with certain science” (Ibn Bâjja 1994, p. 27). Thus, two requirements are to be followed: certainty of knowledge and universality of scope, and these requirements hold only for the five divisions of philosophy: metaphysics, physics, practical philosophy, mathematics, and logic.
Metaphysics aims at those beings which are the ultimate causes; they are neither a body nor in a body. Physics or natural science aims at the natural bodies, the existence of which does not depend on human will at all. Practical philosophy—which Avempace calls “voluntary science”—aims at beings produced by the human will and choice.
Mathematics deals with beings abstract from their matters, although endowed with number and measure, and is divided into arithmetic, geometry, optics, astronomy, music, mechanics or the science of weights, and the “science of devices,” which studies:
How to bring into existence many of the things proved theoretically in mathematics, where the worth of the device consists of removing hindrances that, perhaps, hindered their existence. There are numerical devices—like the algebra, geometrical ones—like those for measuring the surface of bodies which are impossible to access, astronomical devices, optical—like the art of mirrors—musical, and mechanical (Ibn Bâjja 1994, p. 28, ll. 9–11).
We shall soon see that astronomy occupies a particular place in the system because its subject results from optical observation. Logic is the fifth and last division of philosophy and focuses on properties that beings acquire in the human mind; “because of such properties and their knowledge [logic] becomes an instrument for apprehending the right and the truth in beings” (Ibn Bâjja 1994, p. 28, ll. 13–14). Avempace remarks that for this reason some people consider logic to be only an instrument and not a part of philosophy, but insofar as these properties have real existence, logic can be integrated into philosophy. He concludes that logic is both part and instrument of philosophy.
Since a distinguishing feature of philosophy is the use of the apodictic syllogism (burhân) (the only one that yields certain knowledge), not all syllogistic sciences can be considered parts of philosophy. Avempace enumerates four such non-philosophical arts: Dialectic relies only on opinion and negates or asserts something through methods of general acceptance. Sophistry aims at beings insofar as it misrepresents them and deceives us: it makes the false look true, and the true, false. And following the tradition initiated by the Greek commentators on Aristotle, Avempace includes Rhetoric and Poetics in logic (Ibn Bâjja 1994, pp. 28–29). These four arts use other kinds of syllogism but only to convince another, not to infer the truth, whereas philosophy causes man to convince another and to infer the truth for himself.
The classification of the sciences, indeed, is not complete because the aforementioned arts are all theoretical and arts like medicine or agriculture have not been considered. Alfarabi distinguished, at the beginning of his Risâla, between syllogistic and non-syllogistic arts and aligned medicine, agriculture, carpentry with the second. They were non-syllogistic because, once their parts were assembled they resulted in doing something, not in employing a syllogism (Dunlop 1957b, Risâlah, p. 225). He admitted, nevertheless, that some parts of these non-syllogistic arts were brought out by syllogisms, and he mentioned medicine, agriculture and navigation.
Avempace was not as systematic as Alfarabi but he picked up the forgotten non-syllogistic arts, changed them into “practical arts”, and wrote:
If some of them [the practical arts] employ syllogisms as medicine and agriculture do, they are not called syllogistic because their purpose is not [to convince another] nor to employ syllogisms, but to do some activity (Ibn Bâjja 1994, p. 29, ll. 17–20).
Avempace wrote nine medical treatises (Forcada 2011, pp. 113–114). Forcada has edited, studied, and translated one of them, his “Commentary on Aphorisms”, a supercommentary on Galen's commentary on Hippocrates' Aphorisms which illustrates Avempace's view about medicine. Medical syllogisms have their premises specifically obtained by means of experience. Experience is obtained on its turn by means of perception through one's life time. Avempace defines experience:
As man reliance on perception to know particular [aspects, juz‛îyât] of some matter so that some science results from this perception.
Experience is said in general and in particular. If it is said in general, it points out that perception intents knowing particular [aspects] of a mater, from which a universal proposition results. The particular [instances] may take place either by man's will or naturally (Forcada 2011, p. 146).
Therefore Avempace ranks experience not a as high in certitude as the first intelligible but second to it, and he makes it essential part of medicine, insofar as it can yield universal propositions.
Avempace inserted his classification of the sciences into the Eisagoge, a treatise whose aim is to discover the simple universal categories underlying the parts of the sentences. His master Alfarabi added the chapters on definition, borrowed from the Aristotelian Analytica Posteriora. Alfarabi had also introduced, at the beginning and in his enumeration of the parts of the sentence, the distinction between “sound” (lafẓ) and “meaning” (ma‛nà) and said:
Every predicate and every subject is either a sound signifying a meaning or a meaning signified by a certain sound, and every meaning signified by a sound is either universal or individual (Dunlop 1956, Eisagoge, p. 119, ll. 1–2).
Avempace observes that “subject” and “predicate” are ambiguous terms because they may refer to meanings as well as to sounds, and what Alfarabi considers in this book are the meanings not the sounds (Ibn Bâjja 1994, p. 30, ll. 6–8). According to their meaning, both parts of the sentence are either universal or individual. Avempace then follows Alfarabi and divides universal parts into simple and composite: simple parts of the sentence are genus, species, specific difference, property, and accident. Composite parts are the definition, the description, and “an expression the composition of which is restricted, and is neither a definition nor a description” (Ibn Bâjja 1994, p. 30, ll. 16–17). Avempace's meaning here can only be understood by reading Alfarabi's Eisagoge. Alfarabi defined it as an expression which “is made up of species and an accident, as when we say of Zaid that he is a white man and sometimes it is made up of accidents, as when we say of Zayd that he is an excellent secretary”.
The nine categories or sorts are parts of the syllogisms (Ibn Bâjja 1994, p. 30, ll. 18–19), according to Avempace and his observations on “subject” and “predicate” are linked to the sciences which are built on syllogisms. The philosophical sciences, dialectic and sophistry, have universal subjects and predicates. Poetry and rhetoric have individual subjects and universal predicates. Rhetoric employs one or more individual subjects as well as predicates in cases in which the syllogism resorts to an image or to corroboration.
Avempace knew the difficulties of bringing together the Porphyrian Eisagoge with the Aristotelian corpus as well as the need to classify and organize the sciences. He did not leave us a systematic treatise, but only wrote comments on Alfarabi's writings. In spite of it, we can perceive a model that starts with the division of “meaning” into individual and universal, continues with the distinction between simple and composite universals, inserts the doctrine of the categories, moves toward the construction of syllogisms, and develops into the variety of sciences according to their syllogistic nature or not. Let us deal with the place of the categories.
The Oxford manuscript marks a new chapter in the text with the heading “Of his discourse at the beginning of the Eisagoge”. Here, Avempace divides “meanings” into two kinds: intelligibles (ma‛qûlât) and individuals (Ibn Bâjja 1994, p. 42, l. 7). Intelligibles can exist either in the mind or in something outside of it and they are associated mainly with the universals. Avempace quotes Aristotle's definition of the universal: “That which is by its nature predicated of more than one thing” (Interp. 17a 39) but he borrows the quotation from Alfarabi who commented on the sentence (Dunlop 1956, Eisagoge, p. 119, ll. 4–13). Avempace has two interpretations for the passage. The first says: “that which is by its nature” refers to an actual resemblance so that universals contain similar individuals “at one and the same time”. By contrast, the second interpretation does not limit the universals to any moment, and Avempace writes:
[Aristotle] intended with the expression “that which is by its nature” the natural [character of the universal] and its disposition to resemble more than one, which does not imply that the resemblance exists in its actualization. For it is not impossible for the eclipse, insofar it is intelligible, to have a resemblance; further it is not impossible for the eclipse to be predicated of many (Ibn Bâjja 1994, p. 46, ll. 4–6).
The concepts of possibility and impossibility come into action and the universal is defined as having the possibility to resemble more than one, “the possibility inhering in the meaning insofar as it is intelligible” (Ibn Bâjja 1994, p. 46, ll. 10–11). On the contrary, the individual lacks such possibility; rather, it is impossible for the individual to resemble more than one.
Any relation, i.e., the Aristotelian category, in order to exist needs two possibilities, one for each subject of the relation in contrast to the other nine categories, in which one possibility in one subject is sufficient. Resemblance is a relation, since it is to be predicated on two, and both are properties of the classes of intelligibles as well as of their individuals. The intelligible relations exist in the categories, not because of their own essence. To sum up, only the intelligibles possess the possibility of resembling more than one and are predicted to possess many.
For Avempace, the main purpose of the Eisagoge is to explain the concepts that underlie the ten Aristotelian categories. The first interpretation of “that which is by its nature” is more appropriate to this purpose because the second interpretation affects all beings, but the categories do not affect all beings and they deal with existents insofar as the mind acquires them. These concepts are of two kinds: simple and composite. The simple ones are the five universals and the three composite are the definition, the description and the aforementioned. “restricted composition”.
Avempace affirms that the five predicables are not primitive concepts, but constitute correlations between two universals falling within the rules of individuals and classes. He says: “Genus, species, property and accident are correlates (iḍâfa) which are inherent to the intelligibles regarding the quantity of their subjects” (Ibn Bâjja 1994, p. 50). Genus, species and property are essences inhering in a shared subject; by contrast, the accident is not an essence and exists outside the subject. The specific difference is related only to the individual and may be grasped without reference to the universal.
Avempace's annotations to Alfarabi's Kitâb al-Madkhal are more innovative than they might seem at first. He points out that the Eisagoge should not be limited to the exposition of the five “sounds”—maybe six, if the individual is added—and that a particular science was needed to lay the foundations for the Organon. He conceives this science as a formal theory of individuals and classes that is followed by the theory of definition and description.
Al-‛Alawî's exposition of three steps in the intellectual development of Avempace does not conflict with Avempace's view of the sciences. In fact, Alfarabi was active in the three fields in addition to the preparatory logic. The first of the three syllogistic sciences is mathematics that deals with objects deprived of matter but endowed with number and measure. Mathematic contains various sciences, among them music and astronomy.
The biographical sources are informed by Avempace's expertise as a musician and as a composer of muwashshaḥa poetry. In addition, he has left us a brief composition on the melodies. Avempace expounds on the therapeutic effect of playing the ‛ûd, lute, on the basis of universal harmony existing between the heavenly spheres and the bodily nature, the humors. Each chord of the lute is related to one of the four elements: fire, air, earth, water, and each chord has a beneficial influence on each disease caused by one of the humors. The chord called zîr acts on the bile, the chord mathnà on the blood, the chord mathlath, on the black bile, and the chord bamm, on the phlegm. Avempace instructs the player how to place the lute on his body and which finger plays which chord. If the musician plays the lute in the right way, his day will be most beautiful.
In his letter to Abû Ja‛far Yûsuf Ibn Ḥasdây (Ibn Bâjja 1983, Rasâ’il, pp. 77–81), Avempace blames the astronomer az-Zarqâlluh for not having properly understood astronomy and attacks him for his “Treatise to refute the method employed by Ptolemy to calculate the apogee of Mercury”. This work of az-Zarkâlluh is not extant. J. Samsó informs us that Ptolemy's calculation of the apogee was wrong by approximately 30º and that az-Zarkâllah calculated the apogee in another work only with an error of 10º (Samsó 1993–1994, pp. 676–677). Avempace, however, criticizes the method that az-Zarkâlluh employed.
Avempace wrote a letter to Abû Zaid ‛Abd ar-Raḥmân Ibn Sayyid al-Muhandis (Ibn Bâjja 1983, pp. 84–87) about a preliminary question from the first book of the Conic Sections of Apollonius of Perga (ca. 200 BC). In another letter to his disciple ‛Alî Ibn al-Imâm (Ibn Bâjja 1983, 88–96) Avempace mentions Ibn Sayyid as the discoverer of new procedures in geometry. In addition to this letter, one passage in his Commentary on the Physics and another in The Book of animals (Ibn Bâjja 2002a, Ḥayawân, p. 74) deal with the Conic Sections in a sketchy way. Ahmed Djebbar studied Ibn Sayyid and Avempace and gathered that both Andalusians were innovative in their study of warped surfaces resulting from the intersection of conic and non-conic surfaces.
Avempace commented very freely on the Aristotelian works and wrote independent articles on various subjects of personal interest. We are not always sure which source he read and whether it was the complete translation or an abridgment. In the case of his commentary on the Meteorology, we know from Paul Lettink's edition and translation of the commentary. Lettinck proved that Avempace read the altered version of the Meteorology made by Yaḥyà Ibn al-Biṭrîq (d. ca. 830. Petraitis 1967).
The Aristotelian treatises dealing mainly with natural philosophy are the Physics, Coming-to-be and Passing-away, On the Heavens, and Meteorology. This is the traditional order of their arrangement within the corpus, and the books on the Animals are last. Avempace followed the order for his reading of the corpus, wrote his commentaries accordingly and thus we should review his commentary on the Physics first.
Avempace defines this science as theoretical, the subject of which is the natural body and says that most of its subject is known by the senses (Ibn Bâjja 1973, p. 15, ll. 7–9). Physics works on the basis of principles insofar as it is theoretical and searches for causes as its demonstrative science. We should not leave aside a long discussion on the essence and position of physics in Avempace's introduction to his Book of Animals.
Every theoretical science is composed of principles and problems. The results may be called problems (masâ’il). The principles can be concepts (taṣawwur) and they are uttered by spoken sounds that are individual in potency or in actions. The principles can be assents (taṣdîq) and they are uttered by sentences that are statement-making and necessary.
There are sciences like geometry where the principles are more general and anterior. By “principles”, I mean the concepts: the triangle is anterior to the equilateral triangle and to other kinds of triangles (Ibn Bâjja 2002a, Ḥayawân, p. 65, ll. 5–11).
Anteriority can be either in itself or in relation to us because of our assent that objects equal to a third one are equal is anterior to our assent that the sides of the triangle the vertex of which is exchangeable are equal. In these examples, the predicates in the principles are the causes of the predicates in the problems, and they are anterior in both aspects (Ibn Bâjja 2002a, Ḥayawân, p. 65, l. 16–p. 66, l. 4).
Avempace refers to mechanics and optics as theoretical sciences which are similar to geometry in the anteriority of their problems. They differ from astronomy because the subject of astronomy is sensible; it needs examination and the astronomer has to try to find out the causes. Therefore, the object is posterior. Avempace sees the matter of physics as even more arduous. “This science must employ all the potencies [capacities] developed previously in mathematics and logical and it employs them only insofar they belong to a common genus” (Ibn Bâjja 2002a, Ḥayawân, p. 69, ll. 5–7). Avempace finally affirms that natural science has various kinds of principles and problems, and that it contains objects that are not sensible at all, like the intellect.
Avempace makes clear that natural science or physics is a theoretical science which requires mastering other sciences. It is not a science like geometry the objects of which are anterior, both in knowledge and in reality. Its objects are posterior in knowledge, but Avempace remarks that some are not related to the senses.
Avempace made some contributions to the development of philosophy of nature, and I shall mention two. The first is his contribution to the theory of mechanics. Book VII of the Aristotelian Physics does not fit into the sequence of Books V, VI and VIII and its chapters deal with subjects not related to each other. One of the subjects mentions that every movable or mobile is moved by a mover different from itself (Phys. VII.1, 241b 24). Avempace considers the tenet that everything is moved by something else, and says:
It is evident that the rest of the whole because of the rest of one of its parts takes place in so far as the movable is other than the mover, and when the influence of the latter ends, it comes to rest. Its influence ends because the mover ceases to act either on its own or because something else exerts resistance on it. Whenever the mover ceases to act on its own, this happens due either to its destruction, or to exhaustion (kalâl) of the power of the mover, or because the cause disappears, or because the motion is complete, since the movable has reached the end toward which it was moving (Ibn Bâjja 1973, p. 99; Lettinck 1994, pp. 532–533).
The movements involved here are so-called “violent” movements, as opposed to “natural” ones, discussed below. Ibn Bâjja sketches a theory of dynamics based on a notion of “power” different from the Aristotelian notion of dynamis: they are mechanical forces which can join another force or counteract it by offering resistance. Shlomoh Pines introduced the term “dynamics” to define his views, which no doubt were influenced by the tradition linked to John Philoponus (d. ca. 566). There is a minimum amount of moving power for each movable. For instance, to move a boat a minimum of power is needed, otherwise “one grain of sand could move the boat” (Ibn Bâjja 1973, 112: 27).
When two opposing powers are equal, there is no motion, and when one power “overcomes” the other, the body moves until it suffers “exhaustion” (kalâl), because any body moved “violently” creates a contrary power stronger than the one imposed by the mover, and also because the imposed force becomes “exhausted”. The moving power is also subject to time and distance factors and the mobile can offer almost no resistance, so that the absolute terms of proportionality do not apply.
The second contribution is related to motion in the void. Avempace analyzes “natural” movements such as a stone's falling through air and water. They are the movements of the four elemental bodies: fire, air, water and earth. These movables need a moving power capable not only of moving them, but also of displacing the medium through which they pass. Dust particles stay suspended in the air because, although they possess enough power to go down, their power is insufficient to displace the air.
Aristotle rejected the possibility of motion in the void because the medium was essential to natural movement at finite speed. John Philoponus had already expressed the view that the medium is not a necessary condition, but only provides resistance. The different velocity with which the stone passes through the air or the water is only caused by the different density of the medium; it is not connatural to the medium. As a proof that motion without any medium, namely, through a void, is possible, Avempace adduces the movement of the spheres:
[In the heavens] there are no elements of violent motion, because nothing bends their movement, the place of the sphere remains the same and no new place is taken by it. Therefore circular movement should be instantaneous, but we observe that some spheres move slowly—such as the sphere of fixed stars—and others fast—the daily movement—and that there is neither violence nor resistance among them. The cause for the different velocities is the difference in nobility (sharf) between mover and movable (Ibn Bâjja 1973, p. 116, ll. 13–17).
The role of the medium is not essential, but is only a kind of resistance, and thus motion in the void is both theoretically possible and confirmed by the observation of the spheres. Avempace contradicts Aristotle and advances a doctrine that Galileo will later prove to be right. I dare to say that Avempace was reading the Arabic version of Philoponus' commentary on Aristotle's Physics, andvery likely for want of the latter, so that Philoponus deserves recognition for inspiring the doctrine.
The treatise On the Heavens followed next in the Aristotelian order but no commentary of Avempace has reached us, and the following extant commentary is on Coming-to-be and Passing-away (Ibn Bâjja 1995). Avempace followed Philoponus in a preliminary remark observing that Aristotle proved in his book On the Heavens the existence of four elementary bodies. Since one of the subjects of Coming-to-be and Passing-away is the mutual generation of these bodies, it is the logical continuation. Thus, Avempace's lost commentary On the Heavens likely comes after the one on Physics and before the one on Coming-to-be and Passing-away.
This commentary runs parallel to the Aristotelian text. After explaining changes in quality, Avempace suddenly starts a discourse on force or power (qûwa) and on the moving power (qûwa muḥarrika; Ibn Bâjja 1995, pp. 26–40). Avempace defines movements as the movable moves because of a natural power. Some qualities are moving powers, such as heaviness or heat, but Avempace here focuses on the soul as a moving power (elemental bodies do not have souls; instead, they have natures). The case of the human soul interests him most and he wants to explain how intellectual apprehension moves man in reasoning and action. Avempace will deal, in a more satisfactory way, with the issue of rank of ideas and forms in relation to human activity in other works.
Avempace's reflections on absolute coming-to-be and passing-away start with a linguistic analysis of the term kawn “coming-to-be” which echoes Alfarabi's method and itself is a novelty (Ibn Bâjja 1995, pp. 41–44). Avempace stresses that coming-to-be is only possible if the metaphysical structure of act and potency are admitted (Ibn Bâjja 1995, pp. 46–47).
At the beginning of his treatise of Meteorology, Aristotle summarizes his preceding research: he has established the four causes of nature and dealt with all natural motion in Physics. He has investigated the ordered movement of the stars in the heavens in De caelo, and changes of the four elements into one another, growth, and perishing in De generatione et corruptione. What still has to be investigated is that which takes place “in the region nearest to the motion of the stars such as the Milky Way” (Meteo, 338b 3–4).
Avempace's commentary presents his own theory of the Milky Way. Aristotle explained it as the ignition of the fiery exhalation of some stars which were large, numerous and close together. The ignition takes place in the upper part of the atmosphere, in the region of the world which is continuous with the heavenly motions (Meteo, 346b 11–12). The version transmitted by Ibn al-Biṭrîq diverges and considers the Milky Way to be a phenomenon exclusively of the heavenly spheres, not of the upper part of the atmosphere. The light of those stars makes a visible patch because they are so close.
Avempace considers the Milky Way to be a phenomenon both of the spheres above the moon and of the sublunar region. The Milky Way is the light of many stars which almost touch one another. Their light forms a “continuous image” (khayâl muttaṣil) on the surface of the body which is like a “tent” (takhawwum) under the fierily element and over the air which it covers. Avempace defines the continuous image as the result of refraction (in‛ikâs) and supports its explanation with an observation of a conjunction of two planets, Jupiter and Mars which took place in 500 AH/1106–7 CE. He watched the conjunction and “saw them having an elongate figure” (Lettinck 1999, p. 434) although their figure is circular.
Avempace wrote a treatise on animals related to the Aristotelian books Generation of Animals, Parts of the animals and Description of animals, and another one on plants (Asín Palacios 1940) and probably a third one on minerals, all following the Pseudo-Aristotelian corpus.
The Book of Animals was edited by Jawâd al-‛Imâratî (Ibn Bâjja 2002a). Avempace begins his book situating it in the context of the theoretical sciences, and then within natural science. The science of the living animals is a species of the natural philosophy (Ibn Bâjja 2002a, Ḥayawân, p. 71). Avempace wonders whether the relationship of its subject, the animal, is similar to the relationship of arithmetic to numbers. Arithmetic is a discipline where the pattern of genus and species applies smoothly: It establishes ten units, and then it combines them and gives them accidents like being odd or a pair, etc. Since numbers are made one of another “ten is made of the five multiplied by the two” and they are “simple forms” which can be continuously incremented (Ibn Bâjja 2002a Ḥayawân, p. 73) and animals have a completely different existence, Avempace denies the relationship.
Geometrical objects are similar to numbers, but they differ insofar as their species are infinite. Avempace mentions infinite figures “resulting from [intersecting] the straight line with the circle, either cylinder or conic”. Primary genera of geometry are the line, the surface and the body, and Avempace denies any parallelism to the swimming, walking and flying characteristics of animals. As for a possible similarity to the numbers, numerical specific differences are anterior and actively dividing, not divisible. On the contrary, according to Avempace, the science of the animals goes another way: “We must take the first contrariety inherent to the animals and by which they are divisible, and whether it belongs to the essential universal opposite accidents by which the primary species come to stand” (Ibn Bâjja 2002a, Ḥayawân, p. 75, ll. 1–3). Avempace inquiries further about these basic contrarieties to establish the furthermost species and make possible a demonstrative science. “We predicate of the animals contrary specific differences, like having blood or not, and then we can prove. If we talk about man and about bull, we cannot make any specific distinction” (Ibn Bâjja 2002a, Ḥayawân, p. 76, ll. 7–9).
Aristotle, according to Avempace, classified the science of animals into four sections: 1) properties of the sensible parts of animals, 2) properties of their limbs, 3) properties of their homogeneous sensible parts, and 4) properties of their non-homogeneous sensible parts (Ibn Bâjja 2002a, Ḥayawân, p. 76).
If we go into the material content of the book, we find some remarkable contributions of Avempace. Remke Kruk points to his description of the copulation of insects and to the male and female role in the procreative process (Kruk 1997, pp. 172–175). However, the theoretic endeavor of Avempace in his Book of animals seems to be more relevant. Avempace wants to draw a theoretic system embracing all reality. Reality is plenty of forms, and their perfection consists of motion and action (Ibn Bâjja 2002a, Ḥayawân, p. 79). He divides forms into natural and artificial. The specific difference is that natural forms possess power or potency which moves bodies and by which bodies move themselves while artifacts only move accidentally (Ibn Bâjja 2002a, Ḥayawân, p. 79).
Avempace also takes modal factors into account for his design and introduces necessity as a concept in his discourse. Necessity is predicated on immovable forms in its primary sense, and metaphysics deals with them. The natural scientist deals with forms subject to motion and, for this reason, necessity is predicated “by convention” bi-l-waḍ‛. Avempace gives the example “If there is a house, there is a need for a foundation” (Ibn Bâjja 2002a, Ḥayawân, p. 81), and in this way he explains relative necessity as characteristic to the sublunar world.
We have read above that physics has not only sensible objects (supra, p. 13), but also spiritual ones—which allows us to introduce Avempace's book on the Soul. The book was edited (Ibn Bâjja 1960) and translated by Muḥammad Ṣaghîr Ḥasan al-Ma‛ṣûmî (Ibn Bâjja 1961) who unfortunately could use only the Oxford manuscript; the Berlin manuscript is longer although its composition is less coherent.
When Avempace starts the book, he proceeds in a similar way to the one on animals, namely with a global framing of the subject. Bodies are either natural or artificial; all they have in common the presence of matter and form; and form is their perfection. Natural bodies have their mover inside the whole body, because the natural body is composed of mover and moved.
Most of the artificial bodies are moved by an external mover, although automats or machines have their motor inside, and Avempace adds “I have explained it in the science of Politics” (which is lost) (Ibn Bâjja 1960, p. 25, l. 4; 1961, p. 15). The mover is identical with the form. He distinguishes two kinds of perfecting forms, namely forms moving by means of an instrument or not (Ibn Bâjja 1960, p. 28; 1961, p. 17). The first kind is nature, the second, the soul.
To define the soul as operating through an instrument, i.e., the body “in an ambiguous sense”, as Avempace does (Ibn Bâjja 1960, p. 29, l. 2), implies it is autonomous. Avempace defines the soul also as first entelechy (istikmâl), as opposed to the last entelechy of the geometer, i.e., its being geometer in act. Soul appears as an incorporeal substance, of highest rank. The science of soul is considered by Avempace as superior to physics and mathematics, only inferior to metaphysics. Avempace is not disturbed by Aristotle's hylemorphic view of the soul which he may have known. He affirms that all philosophers agreed that the soul is a substance and portrays Plato as the adequate source:
Since it was clear to Plato that the soul is assigned to substance, and that substance is predicated on the form and matter which is body, and that the soul cannot be said to be a body, he fervently defined the soul in its particular aspect. Since he had established that the forms of spheres are souls, he looked for the commonality of all [souls], and found that sense perception is particular to animals, [but] that movement is particular to all, and therefore he defined the soul as “something which moves itself” (Ibn Bâjja 1960, p. 40, l. 5–p. 41, l. 1; 1961, p. 26).
Aristotle's treatise is relevant for Avempace in its description of the various powers of the soul, i.e., nutritive, sense-perceptive, imaginative, rational faculties, although Avempace may have not had any Arabic translation of Aristotle's De anima. Avempace often digresses into general reflections; for instance, at the beginning of his chapter on the nutritive faculty he talks about possibility and impossibility. But, in other places, there are some references to Aristotle, for instance, when it comes to the imaginative faculty. Avempace writes that “The imaginative faculty is the faculty by which the ”reasons“ (ma‛ânî) of the sensibles are apprehended” (Ibn Bâjja 1960, p. 133, l. 3; 1961, p. 106).
Ma‛nà can translate various Greek words, and the Stoic lektón “meaning” is the most relevant. The Arab grammarians used the term ma‛nà, plural ma‛ânî to point to the content of the word, to its semantic component, in contrast to lafẓ, its phonic part; the pair ma‛nà/lafẓ is already found in Sîbawayhi (d. ca. 796). Ma‛nà was frequently used by Islamic theologians too, to express the concrete cause or “reason” of a thing. The Latin intentio of medieval philosophy is used to translate ma‛nà, and the concept of intentio appears close to that intended by Avempace since ma‛nà has two characteristics: it is some form or figure dissociated from matter but having reference to the thing the figure of form of which it is (Blaustein 1986, p. 207).
Imagination apprehends the internal contents of the sensations and animals operate with them. “It is the most noble faculty in irrational animals, and through it animals move, have many arts, and look after their progeny”. Avempace gives as examples ants and bees, which are exactly the kind of animals to which Aristotle denies the faculty! (Ibn Bâjja 1960, p. 140; 1961, p. 111).
Avempace begins his chapter on the rational faculty by asking whether this faculty is always actual or sometimes potential and actual. He answers that it is sometimes potential and sometimes actual (Ibn Bâjja 1960, p. 145–146; 1961, pp. 117–118). It is just a note without continuation.
The main activity of the reasoning faculty is to enquire and to learn. Avempace introduces here the discursive faculty (al-qûwa al-mufakkira) which binds subject and predicate. The text is confusing and the Oxford manuscript ends inconclusively. The Berlin-Krakow manuscript, that Joaquín Lomba used for his Spanish translation has a few more pages (176rº–179rº). At the end of the fragment, the unknown editor writes that it is a treatise on intellect and is a continuation of Avempace's discourse on the soul.
The intellect, Avempace affirms, apprehends the essence of something, not something material and individual. The essence of any object is its “reason” (ma‛nà ) which corresponds to its form linked to matter in this case. If we go back to a former passage of the same book, we read how the distinction is:
The difference between the reason and form is that form and matter become one thing without existing separately, whereas the reason of the thing perceived is a form separated from matter. So the reason is the form separated from matter (Ibn Bâjja 1960, p. 94, ll. 11–13).
Then the intellect apprehends it in such a way that they both—essence and intellect—are “one in the subject and two in expression”. The speculative intellect searches for the essences of material beings, but it is not satisfied with their apprehension. It realizes that they are material intelligibles which need further foundation and Avempace contends that the intellect knows that there are superior intelligibles which found them and strives for them (Ms. Berlin 176 v). The fragment contains these and other notes which are difficult to bring together although they are in harmony with other writings of Avempace. We may refer to his exposition of the “spiritual forms” in the Rule of the Solitary as more relevant.
Finally, we should mention his text in defense of Alfarabi, accused of denying survival after death. There, Avempace argues that since man has knowledge of intelligibles beyond sense-perception and since it occurs by means of introspection, it is a divine gift to man who has no need for the matter of his survival.
Avempace illustrated for us his views on how knowledge is organized and how the world of nature is structured, but we have not yet expounded on his proper ideas on metaphysics, nor on the sciences that aim at beings produced by the human will and choice, namely, ethics and politics.
Avempace's most representative works are the Rule of the Solitary. the epistle of the Farewell Message, and the Epistle of Conjunction of Intellect with Man. The latter work contains references to Rule of the Solitary and to the epistle of the Farewell Message (as well as to his book on the Soul).
Alfarabi's major work is Book of the opinions of the inhabitants of the righteous city. It is an exposition of a Neo-Platonist emanationist system as well of the different kinds of societies. Alfarabi wanted a perfect city, ruled by a righteous man parallel to the rule of the universe by the perfect One. His connecting cosmogenic explanations and political plans were known to Avempace who did not follow him. Avempace does not quote this or other works by Alfarabi which have a similar content. He quotes Plato but follows the opposite way. While Plato in the Republic would take the human soul as the model for the perfect city, so that the perfect organization inside it tells how the city has to be organized, Avempace starts from the ideal city and wants to transfer its organization to the individual (Abbès 2011, p. 86). Avempace echoes Plato and mentions his division of cities, or societies, into a perfect one and others which are corrupted (Ibn Bâjja 1946, pp. 5–6; 2010, p. 123; Berman 1963, p. 125). One assumes that Avempace is referring to the four imperfect cities, namely, timocracy, oligarchy, democracy, and tyranny (Republic, viii–ix) although Asín Palacios interpreted them as the four imperfect cities cited in Alfarabi's works (Ibn Bâjja 1946, p. 37, note 6), and Genequand accpts both possibilities (Ibn Bâjja 2010, p. 256).
The virtuous city is the only that can make its inhabitants happy because they achieve their perfection. It is characterized by the absence of the art of medicine and the art of judication. Avempace follows Plato, but his version is also characterized by the absence of weeds (Ibn Bâjja 1946, p. 10, ll. 16–18; Berman 1963, p. 126). Avempace explains that in imperfect cities there are false opinions, but that the majority of inhabitants accepts them as right, or that there are contradictory positions and that there is no way to know which one is true.
Now the people who discover a right action or learn a true science that does not exist in the city belong to a class that has no generic name. As for the ones who stumble upon a true opinion that does not exist in the city or the opposite of which is believed in the city, they are called weeds (Rule of the Solitary, Ibn Bâjja 1946, p. 10, ll. 8–11; 2010, p. 126. 31; Berman, 1963, p. 127).
E.I.J. Rosenthal already pointed to the different evaluation of the “weeds” by Alfarabi and Avempace (Rosenthal 1951). Avempace borrows the concept from Alfarabi who saw these men as a danger in the imperfect as well as the perfect city. Avempace saw the virtuous city free of weeds, because it is free from false opinions. Weed-men spring up only in the imperfect cities, and they can help in correcting their views. However, he realized that they were strangers in the cities or societies of his time, which all belonged to the corrupted types, and he did not believe that these societies could be rehabilitated; he abandoned Alfarabi at this point and addressed the “weed-men”.
Avempace wrote a book of a genre similar to that which physicians write to preserve and acquire health, the so called tadbîr aṣ-ṣiḥḥa. He referred to Galen and what Galen wrote in the Preservation of Health as a model for his Rule of the Solitary. To preserve physical health requires knowledge of the natural science about delivering justice, for example, and knowledge of political science. Avempace concluded that since his treatise aims at acquiring and preserving spiritual health, “it reverts to the natural and political science” (Ibn Bâjja 1946, p. 12, ll. 15–16; Berman, 1963, p. 129). What binds natural and political science? Forms, insofar as men have similar and different forms, and forms are related to nature.
“Form” acquires a broad sense to Avempace who distinguishes various kinds of it. Forms are known as the intelligible essences of objects. Avempace accepts this meaning. For him, however, forms have something in common, namely, moving power, and forms are integrated into a participating hierarchy. Avempace's doctrine of the forms is no doubt original, although antecedents are found in the Neo-Platonist tradition. He once quotes a treatise “On the Spiritual Forms” misattributed to Alexander of Aphrodisias (1968, p. 166, ll. 16–17; Asín Palacios 1942, p. 18) which S. Pines (1955) demonstrated to belong to Proclus. Alfarabi's Risâla fî l-‛aql (1938) and other of his works contain the principles of the participating hierarchy of intellects and intelligibles (cf. Davidson 1992; Ramón Guerrero 1992).
Thus, man's actions belong to different levels according to the different forms found in man: physical, animal and spiritual. The latter are specific to man; we can know which actions are most appropriate to man only if we know what is his essence, namely, his most excellent form. Therefore, Avempace accompanies his Regimen sanitatis with a following Treatise on the spiritual forms, lengthier than the former. Steven Harvey already insisted that his epistemology allows us to understand his attitude about politics, and that is not something accidental (Harvey 1992, p. 212). Avempace assigns the term “spiritual” to the soul insofar as it is “a moving soul”. This may be too broad a definition, but he then specifies the various kinds of “spiritual forms”—all having the capacity to move:
The spiritual forms are of various kinds: the first are the forms of the circular [i.e., heavenly] bodies, the second are the active intellect and the acquired intellect, the third are the material intelligibles (ma‛qûlât), the fourth are the “reasons” (ma‛ânî) existent in the faculties of the soul, i.e., existent in common sense, in the imaginative faculty and in the memory (Rule of the Solitary, Ibn Bâjja 1946, p. 19, ll. 2–5; 1968, p. 49, ll. 16–19; 2010, p. 132. 58).
The heavenly bodies are not only immaterial for Avempace and the long Aristotelian tradition, but they are also the most spiritual and are followed in rank by the class of the active intellect and the acquired. The active intellect is immaterial, but the acquired intellect has some connection to matter “because it perfects (mutammim) the material intelligibles” (Ibn Bâjja 1946, p. 19, l. 10). The latter are “not spiritual per se because their existence takes place in prime matter” (Ibn Bâjja 1946, p. 19, ll. 7–8), and we assume that they are the internal counterpart of the substantial forms. We see that spiritual forms differ from similar forms which are joined to matter and determine the substances.
Avempace does not give us any instance of “material intelligibles”, but we may well think of the idea of a tree or a horse in our mind. In his later treatise on the Conjunction of Intellect with Man, Avempace differentiates between intelligibles of real existing beings such as the horse, and intelligibles of inexistent beings, such as an one-legged man, and he further differentiates between intelligibles of real existing beings which one has seen, and intelligibles of existing being which one has not seen. For Avempace, the latter are intelligibles in a derivate sense or by analogy (Asín Palacios 1942, p. 15; Ibn Bâjja 1968, p. 163). “Material intelligibles” should contain both categories.
The objects of common sense, imagination, and of memory are not intelligibles; they are “reasons”. The term is ambiguous, but it is clear that a “reason” is the cognitive product of any of these three faculties; it is also clear that “reason” is some spiritual form.
According to Avempace, spiritual forms divide into universal and particular forms: universal forms are found in the active intellect and the individual intellect apprehends them too. Particular forms are found in common sense, and Avempace gives the instance of a certain mount in Arabia. The “spiritual” content of the forms in the common sense is lower than in the forms of the imagination, and that of the latter ones is lower than in the forms of the memory insofar as their content is more and more “corporeal”. The forms of the rational faculty—we may say, the material intelligibles—are not corporeal (Ibn Bâjja 1946, p. 21, ll. 2–3; 1968, p. 48). Avempace seems to be aware of the difficulties of his explanation, and later on the same treatise he summarizes the views:
We say: The form of any generated corruptible being has three grades of existence, the first is that of the universal spiritual form which is the intelligible form and is the species, the second is that of the particular spiritual form, and the third that of bodily form.
The particular spiritual form has again three grades, the first is that of the “reason” existing in the memory, the second is that of the picture (rasm) existing in the imaginative faculty, and the third is the image (ṣanam) or the common sense (Rule of the Solitary, Ibn Bâjja 1946, pp. 31:13–32:1; 1968, p. 58, ll. 10–15; 2010, pp. 141–142.90).
Particular spiritual forms may be true or false; if they have come to us through the common sense, they are mostly true. Spiritual forms play a role in every aspect of human life, even in the prophetic revelation. The inspiration received by the prophets belongs to the category of particular spiritual forms, which do not pass through the common sense, but are received directly from the active intellect. Avempace wrongly refers to Aristotle in support of his view and ends by saying “These instances go beyond the natural world, they are divine gifts” (Ibn Bâjja 1946, p. 24, l. 7; 1968, p. 53).
As for the Sufis, their experiences belong to the level of the particular spiritual forms, where common sense, imagination and memory are active, but they mistake them for universal spiritual forms, and wrongly believe that the coincidence of the three faculties is the source of supreme happiness (Ibn Bâjja 1946, pp. 26–27; 1968, p. 55).
Man has to organize his various faculties—from the rational to the nutritive—and there are categories of men according to the prevalence of each of the three faculties. In some of them, corporeality prevails; in a select few, spirituality does. Ibn Bâjja counts some ascetics and Sufis among the latter—but for most, the situation is mixed. Man is moved by spiritual forms that may be as basic as clothing, housing or food. Clothing, for instance, acts on two levels, the protective and the ornamental. Virtues are attached to the spiritual forms found in the imaginative faculty because the purpose of virtuous actions is generating positive feelings and admiration in the souls of those who see them. The spirituality of most men is, however, limited to particular forms. Only philosophers attain the highest degree of spirituality, the immaterial and universal intelligibles. Although philosophers have to take due care of the corporeal and particular spiritual forms in order to live, and live honorably, their main concern is the universal separated forms:
Spiritual acts render him nobler, and the intellectual acts render him divine and virtuous. The man of wisdom is therefore necessarily a man who is virtuous and divine. Of every kind of activity, he takes up the best only. He shares with every class of men the best states that characterize them. But he stands alone as the one who performs the most excellent and the noblest of actions. When he achieves the highest end—that is, when he apprehends simple substantial intelligences (‛uqûl) that are mentioned in the [Aristotelian] Metaphysics, the book On the Soul, and On Sense and the Sensible—he then becomes one of these intelligences. It would be right to call him simply divine, and he will be free from the mortal sensible qualities, as well from the [particular] spiritual qualities (Rule of the Solitary, Ibn Bâjja 1946, p. 61, ll. 11–18; 1968, p. 77; 2010, pp. 163–164, 164–165; Berman 1963, pp. 131–132).
In his later treatise Conjunction of Intellect with Man, Avempace reformulated his theory. He described how man first acquires the spiritual forms, then he apprehends the intelligibles, and by means of the latter he approaches the final intelligence (al-‛aql al-âkhir). He calls it the natural way: each man has a material intellect which receives them and the intelligibles are relative to each material intellect (Asín Palacios 1942, Ittiṣâl, p. 17; 1968, p. 164). He distinguished two stages, the first is that of the common people and the intelligibles are linked to the material objects; the second is that of the scientists and the intelligibles are linked to the spiritual forms.
Avempace is not satisfied with an indirect approach to the last intelligence and wants to reach the absolute intelligibles, with no relation to the material intellects and free of any spiritual form (particular or universal). We see that absolute intelligibles are the true existence and that they merge into the one last intelligence.
Avempace never says that God is the last intelligence, which he compares with the sun and its light. The felicitous person who succeeds in reaching the highest step of knowledge becomes light himself (Asín Palacios 1942, Ittiṣâl, p. 19; Ibn Bâjja 1968, p. 168). But, it leaves any detailed scientific knowledge behind and becomes unarticulated mystical experience.
By contrast, practical intelligibles play a minor role in spite of the import they have in ethics and politics. Avempace includes among them the ruling of the city or of the armies and considers them “intermediate forms”. They exist in the solitary only for the sake of one of the three spiritual forms, corporeal, particular spiritual and universal spiritual (1968, p. 91; 2010, p. 179.210).
As we said above, Avempace presented his Rule of the Solitary (Tadbîr al-mutawaḥḥid) as a Regimen sanitatis in order to acquire and preserve spiritual health, which obviously equals to happiness (Ibn Bâjja 1946, p. 11; 1968, p. 43; Berman 1963, p. 128). The companion he gave to Ibn al-Imâm for his travel, the Epistle of Farewell, was intended to help him attain this happiness. Avempace enumerates the different degrees of pleasure, the highest being science. Man suffers from ignorance and when he reaches the truth, pain goes away and pleasure seizes him. However, intellectual pleasure is also caused by the very fact of knowing.
But when we strive for knowledge, we do it not because of pleasure but pleasure is some profit (ribḥ) we gain as it follows the existence of the truth, because every pleasure is like the shadow of something else (Asín Palacios 1942, p. 23, ll. 5–7; Ibn Bâjja 1968, p. 123, ll. 2–4; 2010, p. 98.29).
Avempace enquires further on the issue of pleasure and knowledge, and we can abbreviate it by saying that the highest form of pleasure requires continuity and that continuous pleasure is attained only by intellectual knowledge, and by knowledge of an eternal object. Metaphysical knowledge is man's uppermost stage and source of highest pleasure. Averroes (d. 1198), however, would express doubts whether man's uppermost stage is a natural perfection or divine gift for Avempace, an issue which Alexander Altmann researched (1965). Altmann concluded that Avempace defended the uppermost stage as a mystical experience, similar to that preached by the Sufis, and we can agree that Avempace saw the uppermost stage as a divine gift.
Avempace concluded his enquiry moving out of the rational and leaving many loose ends. He was a busy man. When he finished his treatise On the Conjunction of Man with Intellect he apologized for not having been able to produce a demonstrative argument, burhân, on the issue and uttered his hope that the addressee of the epistle would be able to grasp its sense and meaning (Asín Palacios 1942, pp. 22–23; Ibn Bâjja 1968, 172–173). Still, the outlines of his system are visible. Inspired by the Porphyrian division of the five voices, knowledge starts with the opposition universal/individual, and develops into syllogistic and non-syllogistic sciences which can explain all aspects of reality. Reality consists of matter and forms, but form differentiates into a stairway of forms, according to their distance from matter. Forms are essences as well as active potencies, and any form is a mover. In addition, the ascension of spiritual forms inside man runs parallel to the ascension of forms in nature. They both unite in separate substances, pure intelligibles, and true beings, and at the summit, man merges into the Active Intellect. Avempace's intention appears clear, but if the conjunction is possible and how it occurs remains obscure.
For more information about the sources for Ibn Bâjja's bibliography, see the supplement on “Sources for Ibn Bâjja's Bibliography.”
For more information on Aristotle's on the Soul in the Arabic tradition see the supplement on “Aristotle's On the Soul in the Arabic tradition. ”
Sources, editions and translations: Books
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