Incompatibilist (Nondeterministic) Theories of Free Will

First published Thu Aug 17, 2000; substantive revision Mon Jan 21, 2013

To have free will is to have what it takes to act freely. When an agent acts freely—when she exercises her free will—it is up to her whether she does one thing or another on that occasion. A plurality of alternatives is open to her, and she determines which she pursues. When she does, she is an ultimate source or origin of her action. So runs a familiar conception of free will.

Incompatibilists hold that we act freely in this sense only if determinism is false. Some say little more about what, besides indeterminism, free will requires. And, indeed, the task of providing an incompatibilist account is not an easy one. If the truth of determinism would preclude free will, it is far from obvious how indeterminism would help.

The incompatibilist theories that have been offered fall into three main groups, depending on which type of indeterminism (uncaused events, nondeterministically caused events, agent- [or substance-] caused events) they require. Further variations among accounts concern where in the processes leading to decisions or other actions they require indeterminism and what other conditions besides indeterminism they require. The first three sections below examine recent versions of each of the three main types of incompatibilist view. The fourth section considers the evidence regarding whether in fact there exists what any of these accounts requires.


1. Noncausal Theories

Some incompatibilist accounts require neither that a free action be caused by anything nor that it have any internal causal structure. Some views of this type require that a free action be uncaused; others allow that it may be caused as long as it is not deterministically caused. Since any such account imposes no positive causal requirement on free action, we may call views of this type “noncausal.”

Carl Ginet (1989, 1990, 1997, 2002, 2007, and 2008) and Hugh McCann (1998 and 2012) have set out the most fully developed noncausal theories of free will. Other recent accounts of this type are advanced by Stewart Goetz (1988, 1997, and 2000), E. J. Lowe (2008: chs 6–9), Storrs McCall (1994: ch. 9), and Thomas Pink (2004: chs. 7–8)..

Proponents of noncausal accounts generally hold that each intentional action is or begins with a basic mental action. A decision or a choice is commonly said to be such a basic action. An overt bodily action, such as raising one's arm, is held to be a nonbasic, complex action that is constituted by a basic mental action's bringing about a certain motion of one's body. The basic action in this case is often called a volition, which is said to be the agent's willing, trying, or endeavoring to move a certain part of her body in a certain way.

Basic actions are said to be intrinsically active doings and to have an intrinsic purposiveness or intentionality. According to McCann (1998: 163–64), when one makes a decision, intrinsic to the decision is one's intending to make that very decision. (E.g., when one decides to A, one intends to decide to A.) One's so intending is not a matter of the content of the intention that is formed in deciding, nor is it a matter of one's having any further intention in addition to the one formed in making the decision. Rather, McCann holds, it is a matter of a decision's being, by its very nature, an act that one means to be performing. Ginet emphasizes what he calls the “actish phenomenal quality” of basic actions, which he describes (1990: 13) as its seeming to the agent as if she is directly producing, making happen, or determining the event that has this quality.

As is characteristic of proponents of noncausal accounts, neither Ginet nor McCann places any additional positive requirements on free action; the further requirements are instead that certain conditions be absent. Both require that the action not be causally determined. Ginet requires, further, that in performing the action, the agent not be subject to irresistible compulsion.

Two main problems arise for noncausal accounts of free will; both are problems, in the first instance, for noncausal accounts of intentional action. The first concerns control. Performing an action—even acting unfreely—is exercising active control over what one does; acting freely is exercising an especially valuable variety of such control. An account of free will ought to say what this latter variety of control is or in what its exercise consists. A common objection is that noncausal accounts fail to meet this requirement.

The second (and related) problem concerns acting for a reason. Intentional actions can be (and commonly are) things done for reasons. An action performed for a reason is something for which there is a true reason-explanation. Again, it is often objected that noncausal theories of action and free will cannot provide an adequate account of this phenomenon.

1.1 Control

Accounts of active control often appeal to causation. An agent's exercising such control when she acts, it is said, consists in her causing some event (her action, or an event internal to that action). It might be further held that this causation by the agent consists entirely in causation by mental events or states of certain kinds, such as the agent's desiring, believing, or intending something in particular. Of course, noncausal theories reject any such view; let us consider the alternatives.

On Ginet's view, each basic action is characterized by an actish phenomenal quality, its seeming to the agent as if she is directly making happen the event that is her basic action. Ginet stresses the “as if” nature of this appearance; it does not, he says, literally represent to the agent that she is causing the event in question. And in fact, he holds, it cannot be true that we really are agent-causes of what we do, and it need not be the case that any events involving us cause our actions.

Might the actish feel of some occurrence itself constitute that event's activeness, or the agent's exercise of active control? The answer seems plainly to be negative. Indeed, as Ginet (1990: 9) appears to allow, an event with the indicated intrinsic quality might be brought about by direct stimulation of someone's brain, in the absence of any relevant desire or intention on the part of that person. An occurrence produced in this way and in these circumstances would hardly seem to be an exercise of the subject's agency.

McCann (1998: 180) holds that an agent's exercise of active control has two aspects: any basic action is a spontaneous, creative undertaking on the part of the agent, and it is intrinsically intentional. Again, the intentionality of a basic action is said to be a matter of its being intrinsically an occurrence that is meant, by the individual undergoing it, to be her doing. However, where intentionality is divorced from an appropriate causal production, it does not seem that it can, by itself, even partly constitute the exercise of active control. If intrinsic intentionality is at all possible, then it would seem possible for an event with this feature to be brought about in the manner and in roughly the circumstances (in the absence of any relevant desire or prior intention) just considered in discussing Ginet's view. Again, such an occurrence, even if intrinsically something the individual undergoing which means to be an exercise of agency, hardly seems to be that.

The other aspect of the control that is said to be exercised in basic action—the spontaneity or activeness of such an occurrence—thus appears to be the crucial one. This aspect, too, McCann holds, is intrinsic to basic actions, and he maintains that “it has a certain sui generis character that renders it incapable of being reduced to anything else” (1998: 185).

Other proponents of noncausal theories of intentional action (e.g., Pink 2004: ch. 8) likewise take the exercise of active control to be an ontologically fundamental or irreducible thing. Whether it could be is perhaps best addressed by considering the phenomenon of acting for a reason. For active control is typically exercised in response to reasons for action.

1.2 Reason-Explanation

Again, accounts of acting for a reason and of reason-explanation often appeal to causation. An agent acts for a certain reason, it is said, only if the agent's recognizing that reason causes, in an appropriate way, the agent's behavior; and citing a reason contributes to a (true) reason-explanation of an action only if the agent's recognizing that reason caused, in an appropriate way, the action. Proponents of noncausal theories generally go for one or another of two alternatives, appealing either to the content of an intention that the agent is said to have concurrently with performing the action in question, or to the intentional content of the action itself.

To examine the first of these strategies, suppose that S wants her glasses, which she has left in her friend R's room, where he is now sleeping. S also wants to wake R, because she desires his company, but she knows that R needs some sleep, and hence she desires, too, not to wake him. S decides to enter R's room and does so, believing as she does that her action will contribute to the satisfaction of both the desire to get her glasses and the desire to wake R. (The example is adapted from Ginet 1990: 145.) What further facts about the situation could make it the case that, in entering the room, S acts on her desire to get her glasses, and that citing that desire provides a true reason-explanation of her action, while she does not act on her desire to wake R, and citing this latter desire does not give us a true reason-explanation of what she is doing?

Ginet's account of reason-explanations that cite antecedent desires (1990: 143) implies that the following conditions suffice for the truth of the explanation that cites S's desire to get her glasses:

(a) prior to entering the room, S had a desire to get her glasses, and

(b) concurrently with entering the room, S remembers that prior desire and intends of her entering the room that it satisfy (or contribute to satisfying) that desire.

Given the indicated circumstances, citing S's desire to wake R will fail to give us a true reason-explanation, Ginet holds, just in case S does not intend of her action that it satisfy (or contribute to satisfying) that desire.

Several objections may be raised against this account. Suppose that, although conditions (a) and (b) are fulfilled as S enters the room, her desire to get her glasses plays no role at all in bringing about (causing) her entry, while her desire to wake R, of which she is fully aware when she acts, does play such a role. Causalists (e.g., Mele 1992: ch. 13) will then deny that S really acts on her desire to get her glasses and that citing it truly explains her action. Indeed, even some noncausalists deny that having a concurrent intention of the sort required by Ginet (together with awareness of the antecedent desire) suffices for acting for the reason in question. As McCann (1998: 163) suggests, one might have such an intention but fail to carry it out. An account that requires a concurrent intention of this sort, then, will need to provide for its implementation.

Further problems attend the concurrent intention that is required. First, the required intention is a second-order attitude, an attitude about (among other things) another of the agent's own attitudes (a certain desire of hers). But it seems that S might act on her desire to get her glasses even if her only intention when she enters the room is to retrieve her glasses. Second, intention-acquisitions themselves can be explained by citing reasons. Since Ginet's account of the reason-explanation of an action appeals to an intention, the question arises what can be said about the reason-explanation of the acquisition of that intention. Repeating the same sort of account here would generate a regress.

McCann (1998: ch. 8 and 2012) takes a different approach. On his view, an agent decides for a certain reason, and citing that reason explains the decision, just in case, in cognizance of that reason, and in an intrinsically intentional act of intention formation, the agent forms an intention the content of which reflects the very goals presented in that reason. When S decides to enter R's room, for example, she decides for the reason of getting her glasses only if the intention that she forms in making that decision is an intention to enter for the sake of getting her glasses. (Ginet [2008] offers a similar account of reasons-explanations of decisions.)

Here, again, there will be a clash of intuitions between causalists and noncausalists, with the former maintaining that if S's desire to get her glasses plays no role at all in bringing about her decision, then even if the content of her decision is to enter for the sake of getting her glasses, she does not really decide for that reason and citing it does not truly explain her decision. One does not, the objection goes, make it so just by intending it to be so, not even by intrinsically intentionally intending it to be so.

Moreover, the required correspondence between the reasons for which one decides and the content of one's decision is unnecessary. Sometimes prior to making a decision, an agent considers a large number and variety of factors. Her decision might then be made for many different reasons. It is implausible that each and every one of the reasons for which she makes her decision must enter into the content of the intention that she forms in making that decision. (For the same objection to a similar account of reason-explanation, see Mele 2003: 42–43.)

We have considered problems for noncausal accounts of action. However, since the noncausal views examined here place no positive requirements on free action beyond those that are placed on action, if they fail as adequate accounts of action, then a fortiori they fail as adequate accounts of free action.

2. Event-Causal Theories

Compatibilist accounts of free action are typically event-causal views, invoking event-causal accounts of action. The simplest event-causal incompatibilist theory takes the requirements of a good compatibilist account and adds that certain agent-involving events that cause the action must nondeterministically cause it. When these conditions are satisfied, it is held, the agent exercises in performing her action a certain variety of active control (which is said to consist in the action's being caused, in an appropriate way, by those agent-involving events), the action is performed for a reason, and there remains, until she acts, a chance of the agent's not performing that action. (It might be required that there remains, intil the action is performed, a chance that the agent will perform a different action instead right then.) It is thus said to be open to the agent to do otherwise, even given that (it is claimed) its being so open is incompatible with the truth of determinism.

One common objection against such a view is that the indeterminism that it requires is destructive, that it would diminish the control with which an agent acts to the extent that responsibilty would be undermined. A second common objection is that the required indeterminism is superfluous, that it adds nothing of value that could not exist in a deterministic world. We shall examine these objections below. First, let us consider a type of event-causal incompatibilist account that is advocated by writers who accept a qualified version of the first of these objections.

2.1 Deliberative Indeterminism

Some writers accept that indeterminism located in the immediate causation of a decision or other action would diminish the agent's control but hold that indeterminism confined to earlier stages in the process leading to a decision need not do so. Laura Ekstrom (2000: ch. 4 and 2003) and Alfred Mele (1995: ch. 12, 1996, 1999b, and 2006: 9–14) have advanced the most fully developed accounts of this sort. Such views have also been sketched by Daniel Dennett (1978) and John Martin Fischer (1995).

Overt action is sometimes preceded by a decision, and decision is sometimes preceded by a deliberative process in which the agent considers reasons for and against alternatives and makes an evaluative judgment concerning which alternative is best (or better or good enough). Focusing on decisions that follow such deliberation, Mele advances a view that allows (but does not require) the deterministic causation of the decision by the making of the judgment, and of the overt action by the decision. Indeterminism is required only at an earlier stage of the deliberative process. For example, the account is satisfied when it is undetermined which of a certain subset of the agent's nonoccurrent beliefs come to mind in the process of deliberation, where their coming to mind combines with other events to bring about the agent's evaluative judgment. (The subset in question consists of “beliefs whose coming or not coming to mind is not something that one would control even if determinism were true” [1995: 216].)

Mele argues that indeterminism of the sort required here does not diminish (at least not to any significant extent) what he calls “proximal control,” a variety of control constituted by the relatively direct causation of behavior and one that is compatible with determinism. The required indeterminism nevertheless suffices, he holds, to provide the agent with “ultimate control” over her decision, which an agent has only if at no time prior to the decision is there any causally sufficient condition for the agent's making that decision that consists entirely of events or states external to the agent.

Ekstrom's account emphasizes preference rather than evaluative judgment. A preference, as she understands it, is a desire “formed by a process of critical evaluation with respect to one's conception of the good” (2000: 106). The formation of a preference, she maintains, is an action. She requires indeterminism only in the production of these preferences. A decision or other action is free, on her view, just in case it is brought about, in an appropriate way, by an active formation of a preference (favoring that decision or action), which preference-formation is in turn the result of an uncoerced exercise of the agent's evaluative faculty, the inputs to which nondeterministically cause that preference-formation.

Ekstrom holds that an agent is her preferences and acceptances (reflectively held beliefs), together with her faculty of forming these by reflective evaluation. When the formation of a preference is nondeterministically caused and it deterministically causes a decision and subsequent action, then a preference that partly constitutes the agent, one that is generated by an evaluative faculty that partly constitutes the agent, and one that the agent could have prevented (by not forming that preference) causally determines the decision and subsequent action. What the agent does is then, Ekstrom holds, up to her.

Both Mele's and Ekstrom's deliberative theories allow that a decision or other action can be free even if it is causally determined by events none of which is a free action, and to none of which has the agent contributed by performing any prior free action. Indeed, given the basic features of these accounts, both of them must (on pain of regress) allow this. Incompatibilists do not typically allow such a thing.

If an event is not itself a free action, and if no free action by the agent in question contributed to that event, then, we may say, it is not up to the agent whether that event occurs. Incompatibilists generally hold that if one event determines another, then it is not up to anybody whether if the first event occurs then the second event occurs. And arguments for incompatibilism often employ a principle like the following: if it is not up to a given agent whether a certain event occurs, and it is not up to that agent whether if that event occurs then the agent performs a certain action, then it is not up to the agent whether she performs that action. Given this principle, it will have to be said of certain decisions that deliberative theorists count as free that it is not up to us whether we make those decisions. Deliberative theorists, then, apparently reject this principle; but the rejection raises the question whether their incompatibilism is well motivated.

2.2 Centered Accounts

Event-causal accounts of a more typical sort require that at least some free actions be nondeterministically caused by their immediate causal antecedents. Since these views require indeterminism centered on the production of free actions themselves, we may call them “centered accounts.” The most widely discussed such view is that advanced by Robert Kane (1985, 1989, 1994, 1996a, 1996b, 1999a, 1999b, 2000a, 2000b, 2000c, 2002, 2004, 2005: chs. 11–12, 2007a, 2007b, and 2011). Other accounts of this type are proposed by Mark Balaguer (1999 and 2004), Christopher Franklin (2011a and 2011b), David Hodgson (2012), Alfred Mele (2006: ch. 5), Robert Nozick (1981:294–316), Richard Sorabji (1980: chs. 2 and 14), Peter van Inwagen (1983: 137–50), and David Wiggins (1973). John Searle (2001: ch. 9) endorses a view of this sort as best capturing our experience of acting.

Consider an illustration of a simple centered incompatibilist theory. Suppose that Elena is considering whether to A or to B. She recognizes what she regards as a fairly strong reason to A, and she recognizes what she regards as a somewhat weaker reason to B. At a certain time, t, she decides to A. The account requires simply that the prior deliberative events (such as Elena's judging the reason to A to be stronger) that cause the decision to A nondeterministically cause it, and that until Elena makes that decision, there remains a chance that she will instead at t decide to B (in which case, prior deliberative events, such as her recognizing a reason to B, will have nondeterministically caused this alternative decision).

Accounts of this sort are widely thought to be vulnerable to the following argument from luck. If a decision is nondeterministically caused, and if there remains until it occurs a chance that the agent will instead (at that moment) make a different decision, then there is a possible world that is exactly the same as the actual world up until the time of the decision, but in which the agent makes the alternative decision then. There is, then, nothing about the agent prior to the decision—indeed, there is nothing about the world prior to that time—that accounts for the difference between her making one decision and her making the other. This difference, then, is just a matter of luck. And if the difference between the agent's making one decision and her instead making another is just a matter of luck, she cannot be responsible for the decision that she makes. (Arguments of this sort are advanced by Almeida and Bernstein [2003], Ekstrom [2000: 105], Haji [1999a, 1999b, 2000a, 2000b, 2000c, and 2001], Levy [2011: ch. 3], and Strawson [1994]. Mele [1998, 1999a, 1999b, 2005, and 2006: chs 1 and 5] discusses the argument but rejects its conclusion.)

Some proponents of centered incompatibilist theories have added to the requirements of the rather simple view we have been considering, with the aim of rebutting this argument. We shall examine here the account advanced by Robert Kane.

2.3 Efforts of Will

Kane holds that a free decision or other free action is one for which the agent is “ultimately responsible” (1996b: 35). Ultimate responsibility for an action requires either that the action not be causally determined or, if the action is causally determined, that any determining cause of it either be or result (at least in part) from some action by that agent that was not causally determined (and for which the agent was ultimately responsible). Thus, on Kane's view, an agent can be ultimately responsible for a decision that is causally determined by her possessing certain character traits. But somewhere among the events that contributed (however indirectly) to her having those traits, and thus to her decision, there must have been some free actions by her that were not causally determined. Kane calls such “regress-stopping” actions “self-forming actions” (74). All self-forming actions, he argues, are acts of will; they are mental actions. He thus calls them “self-forming willings” (125), or SFWs.

Kane identifies six different types of SFW, giving the most detailed treatment to what he calls moral choices or decisions and prudential choices or decisions. We shall focus here on the former; the two are sufficiently similar that the points made can be easily transferred to the latter.

In a case of moral choice, there is a motivational conflict within the agent. She believes that a certain type of thing morally ought to be done (and she is motivated to do that), but she also has a self-interested desire to perform an action of a type that is, in the circumstances, incompatible with her doing what she believes she ought to do. Given her commitment to her moral belief, she makes an effort of will to resist temptation, an effort “to get [her] ends or purposes sorted out” (1996b: 126). If the choice is to be an SFW, then it is required that the strength of this effort be indeterminate; Kane likens its indeterminacy to that of the position or momentum of a microphysical particle. And the effort's indeterminacy is held to be the source of the required indeterminism in the causal production of the choice. Again an analogy is drawn with an indeterministic understanding of microphysics. Just as whether a particle will penetrate a barrier might be undetermined because the particle does not have both a determinate position and a determinate momentum, so “[t]he choice one way or the other is undetermined because the process preceding and potentially terminating in it (i.e., the effort of will to overcome temptation) is indeterminate” (128).

Kane further requires that any choice that is an SFW satisfy three plurality conditions. These require that the choice be made for a reason (which Kane takes to consist partly in the choice's being caused by the agent's recognizing that reason) and that it not be a result of coercion or compulsion. Each plurality condition also requires that, when the agent makes the choice, she wants more to act on the reason for which she makes that choice than she wants to act on any competing reasons. An agent wants more to act on a certain reason, he holds, when her desire to act on that reason has greater motivational strength than have any desires she has to act on competing reasons, and when it is settled in the agent's mind that that reason, rather than her reasons for doing otherwise, is the one that she will now and in the future act on. This wanting more to act on a certain reason is, on Kane's view, brought about by the choice in question. Finally, the plurality conditions require that, whichever choice is made, there must have been at least one alternative choice that the agent was able to make such that, had she made it, it too would have satisfied the previously stated conditions.

In a situation of moral conflict, Kane maintains, the requirements for being an SFW can be satisfied by either choice that is made—the choice to do what one believes one ought to do or the choice to do what one is tempted to do. Where this is so, whichever choice the agent makes, she has chosen for the reason that she wants more to act on, free from coercion and compulsion. If she has chosen to do what she believes she ought to do, then her choice is the result of her effort. If she has chosen to do what she was tempted to do, then she has not allowed her effort to succeed. Whichever choice she has made, she could have made the other. She is then ultimately responsible for the choice she has made.

What, then, of the argument from luck? Kane offers a complex response to this problem. First (1996b: 171–72), he counters that with indeterminate events, exact sameness is not defined. If an agent's effort of will was indeterminate, then it cannot be that in the actual world and in some other possible world she made exactly the same effort. An objection that assumes that such exact sameness is possible, he holds, does not apply to his view. Kane infers from this point that free will requires a form of indeterminism in which there is chance as well as indeterminacy, with the former stemming from the latter. (He calls worlds with such indeterminism “non-Epicurean.”) The chance in an Epicurean world (an indeterministic world without indeterminacy), he implies, would constitute control-diminishing luck.

Kane's claim that indeterminacy precludes exact sameness has been contested (see Clarke 1999, 2002, 2003a, and 2003b: 86–87, and O'Connor 1996). Moreover, Ishtiyaque Haji (1999a) and Alfred Mele (1999a and 1999b) contend that the argument from luck is just as effective if we consider an agent in worlds that are as similar as can be until the moment of choice, given the indeterminacy of efforts. Indeed, the argument might be advanced without any appeal at all to other worlds: given that nothing prior to the choice accounts for the difference between the agent's choosing one way and her choosing another, it may be said, this difference is just a matter of luck.

A further response by Kane to the argument from luck appeals to the active nature of efforts of will. When an agent in a case of moral conflict makes an effort to resist temptation, he says, she is trying to make the choice to do what she believes she ought to do. If the agent then makes that choice, she succeeds, despite the indeterminism, at doing what she was actively trying to do. And Kane points out that typically, when someone so succeeds, indeterminism of this sort will not undermine responsibility (and hence it will not so diminish the agent's control that there is not enough for responsibility). He describes a case (1999b: 227) in which a man hits a glass tabletop attempting to shatter it. Even if it is undetermined whether his effort will succeed, Kane notes, if the man does succeed, he may well be responsible for breaking the tabletop.

If left here, the reply would fail to address the problem of luck in a case in which the agent chooses to do what she is tempted to do rather than what she believes she ought to do. In response to this shortcoming, Kane (1999a, 1999b, 2000b, 2000c, 2002, 2005: ch. 12, 2007, and 2011) has proposed a “doubling” of effort in cases of moral conflict. In such a case, he holds, the agent makes two, simultaneous efforts of will, both indeterminate in strength. The agent tries to make the moral choice, and at the same time she tries to make the self-interested choice. Whichever choice she makes, then, she succeeds, despite the indeterminism, at doing something that she was actively trying to do.

Although it is common to try to make a choice whether to do something or not—for example, to try to decide whether to A—it is unclear what sense can be made of trying to make some specific choice—e.g., trying to decide to A. Further, supposing that sense can be made of this, it would not seem to be rational to try, at one time, to make each of two obviously incompatible choices.

A more fundamental problem concerns the efficacy of the appeal to the active nature of such efforts. In the case of the man who breaks the tabletop, his breaking the tabletop is free (if it is) not just because it results from an active effort to break the tabletop, but because it results (we are to presume) from a free effort to break the tabletop. A successful effort to make a certain choice can contribute in an analogous way to the choice's being free, then, only if the effort itself is free. If the appeal to these efforts is to accomplish anything, then, what is needed is an account of the freedom with which the agent acts in making these efforts of will (Clarke 2002, 2003a, and 2003b: 89–92; Mele 2006: 51–52).

In recent work, Kane (e.g., at 2007b: 174–75) accepts that responsibility for choices that are SFWs requires that we be responsible for the efforts of will that produce these choices. We generally are responsible for these efforts, he maintains, because they are influenced by character and motives resulting from our prior free choices, and because we generally endorse the outcome of such an effort when it succeeds—the resulting choice. The second of these observations seems not to the point, since one's responsibility for an action cannot depend on whether, subsequent to that action, one endorses one of its results. The first observation raises a regress problem: what about an agent's earliest SFWs, in which case no prior free choices have influenced the efforts of will preceding the SFWs? Kane says that we are responsible for the efforts in these cases as well. But aside from appealing to our endorsement of the resulting choices, he does not explain how this can be so.

Kane's appeal to indeterminate efforts of will, and the appeal thereby to non-Epicurean indeterminism, do not appear to help meet the luck objection. (Neither does it appear that help comes from his requirement that, in making a choice that is an SFW, the agent come to want more to act on the reason for which she makes that choice. For, on Kane's view, this wanting more is brought about by the choice. And if an event-causal view is on the right track, the agent's control over the making of the choice is a matter of the production of the choice, not of what the choice produces.) A simpler centered incompatibilist account, then, may fare just as well against the argument from luck.

2.4 Building Responsibility

How might a simpler theory be defended against that argument? Mele (2006: 117–33) has responded to it by invoking an agent's influence, by way of her past actions, on which options are currently open to her and what their respective probabilities are. Given her responsibility for those past actions, the agent might be responsible for the current probabilities of her pursuing these alternatives. For example, Elena might be responsible for the present chance that she will decide contrary to her ranking of her reasons, because she is responsible for past actions that led to her now having features—character traits, desires, and so forth—that ground that chance. An agent might, in this fashion, accumulate over the course of her lifetime greater responsibility for what she does, by increasingly shaping the probabilities of her acting in various ways.

Of course, the manuever raises a question about how the agent could be responsible for her earlier actions, given that the account in question will require that some of these, too, were nondeterministically caused. Ultimately, we must consider how an agent can be responsible, on such a view, for her earliest free decisions.

These earliest free decisions, Mele observes, will be those of a relatively young child. Responsibility comes in degrees, and any responsibility such a child has for what she does will be slight. The argument from luck might seem threatening if we think that full responsibility is in question, but it loses its bite when we consider a case in which only a small degree of responsibility is at issue. It is implausible, for example, to say that a young boy who decides not to snatch away his sister's toy deserves no credit at all for making the right decision, just because there remained until he so decided a chance that he would instead decide to take the toy. Kane (e.g., at 2007b: 174–75) makes a similar appeal to the build-up of responsibility stemming from slight responsibility for one's earliest free choices.

2.5 Is Anything Gained?

If this strategy succeeds in showing that the required indeterminism would not undermine responsibility, it leaves unaddressed the charge that the requirement is superfluous, that it secures nothing of value that could not exist in a deterministic world. And it is hard to see how this charge can be answered.

Recall Elena's decision. She deliberates about whether to A or to B. She recognizes reasons favoring each alternative and judges those favoring A-ing to be better. She decides to A, and prior deliberative events, including her judging the reasons for A-ing to be better, nondeterministically cause her decision. Until she decides to A, there remains a chance that she will instead decide to B (in which case prior deliberative events, including her recognizing reasons favoring that alternative, will nondeterministically cause that decision).

Suppose that, as incompatibilists might hold, had the causes of Elena's decision determined that outcome, it would not have been up to Elena whether she decided to A. It is puzzling how the introduction of the required indeterminism can make a difference here, such that now with that indeterminism, it is up to Elena whether she makes this decision.

On the view of agency in play here, Elena's decision is an exercise of active control in virtue of being caused by prior mental events, such as her recognizing certain reasons. It is an exercise of such control whether these prior events cause it deterministically or nondeterministically. Granted, if the causation of the decision is undetermined as we are now imagining, then there is (until the decision is made) a chance that different prior mental events will cause a different decision. But this indeterministic picture seems to give us just an actual exercise of active control of a sort we could have on a deterministic picture, plus the chance that this same kind of control would be exercised differently, in making the alternative decision. If it is not up to Elena on the deterministic picture whether she decides to A, adding just this chance does not seem to leave this any more up to her.

An event-causal incompatibilist might respond that Elena exercises a different kind of active control on the indeterministic picture: she exercises plural—in this case, dual—control, a control that can be exercised in either of two different ways, whereas on the deterministic picture the agent's control can be exercised in only one way (Kane 1996: 109–11). But the “can” here seems to be just a matter of chance: Elena actually exercises active control one way, and there remains, until she does, a chance that she will exercise such control a different way. The required indeterminism does not seem to render it any more up to her whether she exercises that control one way or exercises it the other.

A similar doubt arises concerning moral responsibility. The causes of the decision on this indeterministic picture are the same things that might be said to cause it on a deterministic picture. The difference is just that although, on the deterministic picture, these prior mental events deterministically cause the decision, now we are to suppose that they cause it but there was a chance that other mental antecedents would cause a different decision instead. How is this supposed to make a difference to whether the agent can be morally responsible for making the decision?

If the required indeterminism does not hurt, it is not clear that it helps, either.

3. Agent-Causal Theories

A number of incompatibilists have maintained that a free decision (or some event internal to such a decision) must be caused by the agent, and it must not be the case that either what the agent causes or the agent's causing that event is causally determined by prior events. On what are called agent-causal views, causation by an agent is held not to consist in causation by events (such as the agent's recognizing certain reasons). An agent, it is said, is a persisting substance; causation by an agent is causation by such a substance. Since a substance is not the kind of thing that can itself be an effect (though various events involving it can be), on these accounts an agent is in a strict and literal sense an originator of her free decisions, an uncaused cause of them. This combination of indeterminism and origination is thought to capture best the idea that, when we act freely, a plurality of alternatives is open to us and we determine, ourselves, which of these we pursue, and to secure the kind of freedom needed for moral responsibility.

George Berkeley ([1710] 1998) and Thomas Reid ([1788] 1969) held views of this type in the early modern period. In recent years, agent-causal accounts have been advanced by Roderick Chisholm (1966, 1971, 1976a, 1976b, and 1978), Randolph Clarke (1993 and 1996), Alan Donagan (1987), Meghan Griffith (2005 and 2007), T. J. Mawson (2011), Timothy O'Connor (1995, 1996, 2000a, 2000b, 2002, and 2005), William Rowe (1991, 2000, 2003, and 2006), Helen Steward (2012), Richard Taylor (1966 and 1992), John Thorp (1980), and Michael Zimmerman (1984). Derk Pereboom (2001, 2004, and 2007) has argued that only if we are agent-causes can we have free will, but that the evidence is against the existence of agent causaton.

Setting aside (for the moment) the question of evidence, agent-causal theories face three main problems. One concerns acting freely for a reason and the reason-explanation of free actions; the second is the problem of luck; the last concerns the intelligibility of the notion of agent causation and whether causation by an agent (where this is understood to be causation by a substance) is possible.

3.1 Agent Causation and Reason-Explanation

We saw in section 1.2 that serious difficulties confront accounts of acting for a reason and of reason-explanation that do not appeal to the causation of action by the agent's recognizing certain reasons. Standard agent-causal views deny that events such as the agent's recognizing certain reasons cause any free action (or whatever event the agent directly causes when she acts freely). Such views must, then, offer some alternative account of the phenomenon in question.

The most sophisticated such proposal is that advanced by Timothy O'Connor (2000b: ch. 5). At the core of the proposal is an account of the reason-explanation of free decisions. As O'Connor sees it, agents do not cause free decisions; rather, a free decision is a causally complex event, consisting of the agent's causing her coming to have a certain intention. (Such a causally complex event is, in turn, a component of any free overt action, such as one's freely raising one's arm.)

Suppose, then, that someone freely decides to A right now. The decision can be explained by citing an antecedent desire, O'Connor maintains, if

(a) prior to making that decision, the agent had the desire in question and believed that A-ing would satisfy (or contribute to satisfying) that desire; and

(b) the intention to A that the agent comes to have in making the decision is caused by the agent and is an intention to A here and now in order to satisfy the desire in question (adapted from O'Connor 2000b: 86).

One objection to such a view (raised by Feldman and Buckareff [2003]) is that it appeals to something that is not necessary for the truth of the kind of explanation we are considering. One can decide on the basis of a certain desire, and citing that desire can yield a true reason-explanation of one's decision, even if the intention that one forms in deciding is not a second-order attitude, an attitude that is about (in part) another of one's attitudes (a certain desire). O'Connor might accept this point and propose that we will have a true reason-explanation as well if the intention that is acquired represents, not the desire in question, but rather the object of that desire. The proposal would then resemble McCann's account of reason-explanation. However, one can decide on the basis of a desire even if the intention that one forms in making that decision does not represent, in its content, the object of that desire. As was observed in examining McCann's view, an agent sometimes makes a decision for many reasons, and it is implausible that each and every one of the reasons for which a decision is made must enter into the content of that decision.

A further objection is that O'Connor's account of reason-explanation commits him to an implausible view of the explanation of causally complex events. As he has it, whether an explanation citing a state of an agent truly explains the agent's causing her acquisition of a certain intention depends crucially on whether the effect component of this causally complex event has a certain feature, and the truth of the explanation does not require that the agent's being in the cited state cause either the causally complex event, the cause component of that event, or the effect component of that event. But we do not find this sort of thing to be so in cases of any other kinds of causally complex event.

Consider a case that is in important respects analogous to what we are examining here. Suppose that a flash of lightning has caused a brush fire. A drought, let us say, had left the brush dry, and had this not been so, the lightning flash would not have caused the fire, or at least would have been less likely to do so. Now suppose that the dryness of the brush is cited as an explanation of the flash's causing the fire. Does the truth of the proffered explanation hinge on whether the fire has a certain feature, and can the explanation be true even if the brush's being dry did not cause either the flash, the fire, or the flash's causing the fire? Surely not.

The difficulty here stems from O'Connor's requirement, like that imposed by most proponents of agent-causal views, that only the agent cause what is directly agent-caused in a free action. On an alternative account, it is required that a free action be caused by the agent and nondeterministically caused by certain agent-involving events, such as the agent's recognizing certain reasons and having a certain intention. Such a view, it is said, can provide the same accounts of acting for a reason and of reason-explanation as can event-causal theories of free will. And since the event causation that is posited is required to be nondeterministic, the view secures the openness of alternatives, even on the assumption that this openness is incompatible with determinism. Finally, the required agent causation itself is still held to be distinct from causation by any events, and so this view secures the origination of free actions that seemed an appealing feature of standard agent-causal accounts (Clarke 1993, 1996, 2003b: ch. 8, and 2011; Mawson [2011: ch. 5] and Steward [2012: 217–219] also allow that events can play a [nondeterministic] causal role in the production of free actions in additional to the causal role played by the agent).

Here is a brief illustration of a freely made decision, as this type of view would have it. Suppose that on some occasion a certain individual, Leo, is deliberating about whether to tell the truth or to lie. He recognizes reasons favoring each alternative and has an intention to make up his mind now. Suppose that there is a nonzero probability that Leo's recognizing the reasons favoring telling the truth (together with his having the indicated intention) will nondeterministically cause his deciding to tell the truth; and suppose that there is, as well, a nonzero probability that his recognizing the reasons favoring lying (together with his having the intention) will instead nondeterministically cause his deciding to lie. Then, given all prior conditions, it is open to Leo to make the former decision and open to him to make the latter one instead. Now suppose that, as a matter of nomological necessity, in the circumstances, whichever of the open decisions Leo makes, that decision will be made, and it will be caused by his recognizing the reasons that favor it, only if Leo—the agent—causes that decision. Finally, suppose that, in fact, Leo decides to tell the truth. His decision is caused by him, and it is nondeterministically caused by his recognizing reasons favoring the action decided upon (and his having the intention to make up his mind). He would make that decision only if he caused it. On this view, Leo's exercising control over which decision he makes—his determining which of the open decisions he makes—consists in his decision's being (appropriately) caused by him and by these mental events involving him.

It is a matter of some dispute whether event causation and agent causation can be combined in this fashion and, if they can be, whether the combination would provide what incompatibilists think necessary for free will. (For discussion of these points, see Clarke 2003b: 144–48 and 2011; Ginet 2002; O'Connor 2000b: 76–70; and O'Connor and Churchill 2004.)

3.2 Luck, Again

While the appeal to agent causation might be thought to solve the problem of luck, the objection has been raised that in fact it does not help at all (Haji 2004; Mele 2005 and 2006: ch. 3; van Inwagen 1983: 145 and 2000). Consider Leo. At a certain moment he agent-causes a decision to tell the truth, and until he does there remains a chance that he will instead, at that moment, agent-cause a decision to lie. There is, then, a possible world that is exactly like the actual world up until the time at which Leo agent-causes his decision but in which, at that moment, Leo agent-causes a decision to lie. Nothing about the world prior to the moment of the agent-causing accounts for the difference between Leo's causing one decision and his causing the other. This difference, then, is just a matter of luck. And if this difference is just a matter of luck, Leo cannot be responsible for his decision.

If in fact Leo's causing his decision constitutes his exercising free will, then the difference between his causing a decision to tell the truth and his causing a decision to lie is not just a matter of luck; it is a matter of how Leo exercises his free will. But what can be said to support the claim that an agent's causing a decision is his exercising free will? Recall the familiar conception of free will with which we began. When one exercises free will, it is up to oneself whether one does one thing or another. A plurality of alternatives is open to one, and one determines, oneself, which alternative one pursues. When one does, one is an ultimate source or origin of one's action. An agent-causal account may be said to nicely realize this familiar conception of free will. On the assumption that incompatibilism is correct, the account's requirement of indeterminism is needed to secure the openness of alternatives. And its requirement of agent causation may be thought to secure the agent's determining, herself, which alternative she pursues, as well as her originating her action. (Unlike what we have with any event-causal view, with an agent-causal account, the agent is quite literally an ultimate source or origin of her action.) If the account satisfactorily realizes this familiar conception, then it may be credibly claimed that the difference in question between worlds is a matter of Leo's exercising his free will differently.

3.3 Causation by a Substance

All theorists who accept a causal construal of agents' control over what they do—and this includes most compatibilists as well as many incompatibilists—hold that, in a sense, agents cause their free actions (or events internal to those actions). However, most hold that causation by an agent is just causation by certain events involving the agent, such as the agent's recognizing certain reasons and having a certain intention. But, as we have seen, the agent causation posited by agent-causal theories is held not to be this at all. It is said by some agent-causal theorists to be fundamentally different from event causation. And this raises the question whether any intelligible account of it can be given. Even some proponents of agent-causal views (e.g., Taylor 1992: 53) seem doubtful about this, declaring agent causation to be strange or even mysterious.

In contrast, O'Connor (1995, 1996, 2000a, 2000b, and 2002) and Clarke (1993, 1996, and 2003b), though differing on details, have both suggested that agent causation might be characterized along the same lines as event causation, if the latter is given a nonreductive account. Familiar reductive accounts characterize event causation in terms of constant conjunction or counterfactual dependence or probability increase, and if event causation is so characterizable, then agent causation would have to be fundamentally different. But if causation is a basic, irreducible relation, then we might with equal intelligibility be able to think of substances as well as events as causes.

O'Connor takes causal powers to be ontologically fundamental features of the world, constituting the properties that things have. Causation, whether by an event or by a substance, is said to be the manifestation of such a power. In a case of event causation, he maintains, an object's causal power is exerted by nature; given that the object has certain properties and is in certain circumstances, it is necessary that its having those properties—that event—cause a certain effect, or that there be a certain determinate probability that this event-causal transaction take place. In contrast, with agent causation, the agent has both a power to cause a certain effect and a power not to cause it. If she does cause it, her causal power is freely exercised, or exercised at will. Further, agent causation is said to be essentially purposive; its exercise is an agent's causing her coming to have a certain intention for a certain reason (O'Connor 2000b: 68–74; Donagan 1987: 168 makes similar claims).

Clarke proposes that agent causation be thought of as a species of a broader genus, substance causation, with agent causation distinguished by its role in intentional action. With regard to substance causation in general, the recommended view stresses the similarity with causation by events, taking the relation between cause and effect to be the same in the two cases, the only difference being the ontological category of the cause. For an account of causation, he suggests, one might, as O'Connor does, appeal to causal powers as ontologically basic. Alternatively, one might take the causal relation to be an irreducible theoretical entity that can be defined by a set of postulates that specify the role that this relation (if it exists) occupies within the domain of properties and events. If this strategy succeeds in defining a real, irreducible relation, then a claim that an agent causes some event may be explicated as a claim that the agent stands to that occurrence in the relation defined by the indicated postulates (Clarke 2003b: 186–91).

Even if one or another of these approaches leaves us with an intelligible notion of agent causation, there remains the objection that it is impossible for a substance to cause anything. The best known argument for impossibility concerns the timing of causal effects. When something is caused, it is caused to occur at a certain time. There must then be something about the cause that “enters into the moment” from which the effect issues. A cause, then, must be someting to which the notion of date, or time, applies; and such a notion has application only to events (Broad 1952: 215).

Proponents of agent causation typically hold that when a substance causes something, it does so at least partly in virtue of possessing at that time certain properties, which ground its power to cause that thing. The cause might then be said to “enter into the moment” in virtue of possessing those properties at that time. But taking this line seems tantamount to accepting that the cause is, after all, an event—the thing's having those properties then (see, e.g., Clarke 2003: 202).

A related point concerns causal tendencies and their impact on the chances of future events. An entity that can cause an effect of a certain type has a tendency of some strength to produce such an effect. If that effect had previously been unlikely, the coming-to-be of the cause can alter the chance of that subsequent event. For example, taking an antibiotic now can increase the likelihood that one will soon recover from a bacterial infection.

Now suppose that properties are what ground causal powers. Suppose that some property P grounds a power to cause an effect of a certain sort. Imagine that a certain substance s comes to possess P, and that until s acquires P the chance of the effect in question is very low. The occurrence of the event s's acquiring P, or the obtaining of the state of affairs s's possessing P, will typically raise the chance of the effect's subsequent occurrence. There is nothing of this sort left for the substance to do; the event or state of affairs takes care of it! If things that can cause have tendencies to cause, and if such things are the sort of thing whose coming-to-be can alter the chances of their subsequent effects, then causes must be events or states of affairs, not substances.

Finally, there is a consideration of uniformity. In recent years, free-will theorists who appeal to agent causation typically accept that causation is commonly causation by events or states of affairs. Causation by substances is supposed to be something special. Such a view thus has it that causation is a fundamentally disjunctive phenomenon. It is said that commonly an object's coming to have, or its possessing, a given property is what causes the effect, whereas in special cases the object itself is the cause. But if the first of these claims is correct, it seems rather implausible that any relation that obtains between substance and effect in the second sort of case merits being called causation. Moreover, in the special case, it appears that the object's possessing the property at that time has an impotence uncommon to events.

Some agent causalists have insisted that substance causation is actually quite widespread and that we have good reason to embrace a diverse causal ontology which allows that members of various ontological categories can be causes (Steward 2012: ch. 8 is a recent example). And Lowe (2008) has recently argued that only substances can be causes, on the grounds that only substances have causal powers. The ontology of causation remains a disputed matter.

4. The Evidence

Our assessment of incompatibilist accounts so far has focused on whether they satisfactorily characterize what free will would be, if there is such a thing. However, even if one or another of these views characterizes well the freedom that we value, and even if what that account characterizes is something that is possible, the question remains whether there is good evidence that what is posited by that account actually exists.

Incompatibilist accounts require, first, that determinism be false. But more than this, they require that there be indeterminism of a certain sort (e.g., with some events entirely uncaused, or nondeterministically caused, or caused by agents and not deterministically caused by events) and that this indeterminism be located in specific places (generally, in the occurrence of decisions and other actions). What is our evidence with regard to these requirements' being satisfied?

It is sometimes claimed (e.g., by Campbell 1957: 168–70 and O'Connor 1995: 196–97) that our experience when we make decisions and act constitutes evidence that there is indeterminism of the required sort in the required place. We can distinguish two parts of this claim: one, that in deciding and acting, things appear to us to be the way that one or another incompatibilist account says they are, and two, that this appearance is evidence that things are in fact that way. Some writers (e.g., Mele 1995: 135–37) deny the first part. But even if this first part is correct, the second part seems dubious. If things are to be the way they are said to be by some incompatibilist account, then the laws of nature—laws of physics, chemistry, and biology—must be a certain way. (This is so for overt, bodily actions regardless of the relation between mind and body, and it is so for decisions and other mental actions barring a complete independence of mental events from physical, chemical, and biological events.) And many find it incredible that how things seem to us gives us insight into the laws of nature.

The scientific evidence for quantum mechanics is sometimes said to show that determinism is false. Quantum theory is indeed very well confirmed. However, there is nothing approaching a consensus on how to interpret it, on what it shows us with respect to how things are in the world. Indeterministic as well as deterministic interpretations have been developed, but it is far from clear whether any of the existing interpretations is correct. Perhaps the best that can be said here is that there is currently no good evidence that determinism is true.

The evidence is even less decisive with respect to whether there is the kind of indeterminism located in exactly the places required by one or another incompatibilist account. Unless there is a complete independence of mental events from physical events, then even for free decisions there has to be indeterminism of a specific sort at specific junctures in certain brain processes. There are some interesting speculations in the works of some incompatibilists about how this might be so (see, e.g., Kane 1996b: 128–30, 137–42, and the sources cited there); but our current understanding of the brain gives us little evidence one way or the other about whether it is in fact so. At best, it seems we must remain, for the time being, agnostic about this matter.

If free will requires agent causation, and if such a thing is possible, that is another requirement about which we lack evidence. Indeed, it is not clear that there could be any empirical evidence for or against this aspect of agent-causal views (though see Pereboom 2001: ch. 3, for argument that there could be evidence favoring agent causation but in fact there is not).

In sum, we do not have good evidence that any incompatibilist account is true. Some incompatibilists (e.g., van Inwagen 1983: 204–13) hold that we nevertheless have good reason to believe that we have an undetermined free will, since we have good reason to believe that we are morally responsible, that moral responsibility requires free will, and that free will requires indeterminism. However, lacking empirical evidence for the required indeterminism, if we justifiably believe the last two of the just mentioned propositions, then we have a good reason not to treat each other as morally responsible. For if we are not responsible, then whenever we treat someone as responsible, we do that individual an injustice. And if indeterminism of a certain sort and in a certain location is required for responsibility and we lack evidence for the required indeterminism, then we risk this injustice whenever we treat someone as responsible. That, many would argue, is a strong moral reason (for incompatibilists) not to do so.

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action | causation: probabilistic | compatibilism | determinism: causal | free will | incompatibilism: arguments for | moral responsibility | quantum theory: and consciousness

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