Notes to Inheritance Systems

1. More broadly, a trait is hereditary if offspring have a higher probability of resembling the corresponding trait of the parent (e.g., eye color) than would otherwise be the case, or if similarity between parent and offspring is caused by inheritance processes. I am sidestepping various complications, for example the effects of sexual reproduction and phenomena such alternation of generations, which are handled differently by the various conceptual frameworks discussed below. For a useful recent discussion of the notions of heredity and reproduction, see Godfrey-Smith (2009).

2. DST proponents argue that some developmental resources are not easily represented as channels, especially persistent resources, that holism is more heuristically productive, and that channels are not statistically independent information carriers (Griffiths and Gray 2001). See also the useful discussion by Griesemer et al. (2005, p. 526).

Copyright © 2012 by
Ehud Lamm <>

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