Supplement to Justice and Bad Luck

Bad Luck Versus Good Luck

Many discussions of justice and bad luck assume that bad (brute) luck somehow calls for compensation. This raises the question whether justice is not concerned with good (brute) luck. Does good luck call for reverse compensation such as taxation? Interestingly, this way of approaching justice's preoccupation with luck makes the ideal of justice seem less attractive: it may suggest that envy lies behind that ideal (Nozick 1974, 240). Yet egalitarian justice is not best formulated this way.

Assume again, for the sake of simplicity, that a just distribution is an equal one; and assume that we are dealing with thick control luck. We can then distinguish between the following two views:

  1. It is in itself bad if X is worse off than Y through bad luck on X's part.
  2. It is in itself bad if Y is better off than X through good luck on Y's part.

It might be thought that the difference between these views is merely nominal. For if X is worse off than Y through bad luck on X's part how can it fail to be the case that Y is better off than X through good luck on Y's part, and vice versa? However, this is a mistake.

Suppose X and Y are equally well off. X is unable to alter his level of benefits, while Y is offered a benefit that he accepts. X is now worse off through bad luck, i.e., through circumstances over which he exercised no control. Y, on the other hand, might not be better off than X through his own good luck: he may not have controlled whether he would be offered the benefit, but he controlled, we can assume, his acceptance of it. Thus, if we subscribe to (10), we should be concerned with the resulting inequality in this scenario, but we need not be if we subscribe to (11).

Suppose again that X and Y are equally well off. X, but not Y, is then offered an avoidable gamble, which he decides to take, and as a result he ends up worse off than Y. Although it is a matter of luck for Y that he is now better off, it is not a matter of bad luck for X that he is worse off. X controlled whether he ended up worse off than Y, because he controlled his decision to gamble, and if he had not gambled, he would not have ended up worse off than Y. If we subscribe to (10), we might be indifferent to the resulting inequality in this scenario, but we may not be if we subscribe to (11).

These cases show that egalitarians can resist the envy-attributing formulation of their view. They need not be hostile to some people being better off than others through good luck. Consistently with this, they can disapprove when some are worse off than others through bad luck. This is not to deny that, as a matter of fact, one person’s being worse off than another through bad luck tends to go hand in hand with the latter being better off through good luck (compare Temkin 1993, 127; Lippert-Rasmussen 2005).

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Copyright © 2014 by
Kasper Lippert-Rasmussen <lippert@ps.au.dk>

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