Justice and Access to Health Care

First published Mon Sep 29, 2008; substantive revision Mon Feb 11, 2013

Many societies, and nearly all wealthy, developed countries, provide universal access to a broad range of public health and personal medical services. Is such access to health care a requirement of social justice, or is it simply a matter of social policy that some countries adopt and others do not? If it is a requirement of social justice, we should be clear about what kinds of care we owe people and how we determine what care is owed if we cannot possibly meet every health need. We should be clear about what constitutes appropriate access to that care, given that there are diverse barriers to access. We must also be able to say why we owe these things as a matter of justice, and, of course, different accounts of social justice will bake and serve this cake in different ways.

In what follows, we shall address these questions in the following order. In Section 1, we describe briefly what some societies actually do to assure universal access to health care. Although health care is more equally distributed in these societies than other social goods, nevertheless health inequalities persist across demographic groups. This implies a question we shall have to address: if universal access cannot assure equality in health status, because there are other important social determinants of population health and its distribution, then is universal access a requirement of justice after all? We shall also examine some of the consequences of unequal access to care, for these may compound the effects of inequitable distributions of other determinants of health. In Section 2, we examine more carefully the concept of access to care. How, for example, do we actually tell if access to care is equal or equitable? The problem of measuring access to care aside, we might think that the concept of equal access is straightforwardly analyzed, and the concept of equitable access depends in a more complex way on what inequalities in access are permissible. We shall see, however, that considerations of justice bear on judgments about equal access as well as on those about equitable access. In Section 3, we examine three different lines of argument for universal access. In Section 4, we consider what kinds of care these views, especially the opportunity-based account, imply that we owe each other. In Section 5, we consider whether we have a right to health or health care, in light of those views of justice, and what entitlements follow from such a right if there is one.

1. What Societies Do About Access to Care

We might seek guidance from how some societies assure access to care, keeping in mind that what societies actually do may not coincide with what they should do as a matter of justice. If, however, there is widespread belief that people owe each other access to certain kinds of care, and this belief is embodied in institutions that attempt to do that, it may give us some evidence about what people think they owe each other. Of course, we find different institutional provisions of access in different settings, and the differences may not reflect differences in belief as much as differences in resources or social history.

Nearly all developed countries provide all their residents with access to a broad set of public health and individual medical interventions. In these countries access to care is assured despite income and wealth inequalities through universal coverage health systems. The method of financing these universal access systems, as well as their organizational structure, varies considerably. Some systems are funded through general tax revenues as in Canada; others through payroll taxes, as in several European countries; and others through a mix of public and private insurance schemes, as in Germany. Thus some systems are more progressively financed than others, since general tax revenues are more progressive than social security or payroll taxes, and these in turn are more progressive than insurance premiums. (In a progressive tax scheme, the rate increases as the amount that is taxable increases.) Some systems have public ownership of hospitals, with physicians and nurses as salaried employees of the public system, as in the United Kingdom or Norway. Others contain a mix of public and private institutions, though with extensive public regulation of the benefit packages available to people, as in Germany. Some systems allow no insurance schemes except the universal coverage scheme, as in Canada and until recently Norway; others allow supplementary insurance, as in the United Kingdom.

Though all of these health care systems assure universal access to all citizens, their benefit packages vary. Sometimes, the variations occur at the level of specific treatments. For example, one system might decide a particular drug for Alzheimer's is not cost-worthy, whereas other systems might provide it. Sometimes the differences involve whole categories of service. For example, the Canadian national law requires coverage only for inpatient drugs, not outpatient ones; different provinces provide different levels of coverage for what is omitted from the national schemes. Similarly, long-term care is not part of the national Canadian system, though some Canadian provinces, but not all, provide long-term care. The U.S. Medicare system provides nearly universal coverage to the American elderly, but until 2006, when the 2003 Medicare Modernization Act became effective, it excluded drugs from its benefit package (Medicare 2003). All universal coverage systems exclude certain categories of service, such as cosmetic surgery (as opposed to reconstructive plastic surgery). In general, then, where systems provide universal access, it is access for all to a specific set of benefits that varies from country to country, not to every service people may need or want.

It is not only the wealthy, industrialized countries that assure universal access to a broad range of personal medical services. Recently, middle-income countries such as South Korea and Taiwan have adopted universal coverage insurance schemes. Thailand and Mexico have also added insurance schemes aimed at covering the nearly half of their populations that had not been covered in the social security schemes and other insurance schemes that are used by civil servants or large employers. The benefit package in these different schemes is often not equal across these components of the health system, but the avowed goal is to close gaps in access and incrementally to approach equality of access.

The WHO advocates universal coverage in low- and middle-income countries (WHO 2010). A key issue in these efforts is the comprehensiveness of the benefit package, which in some reforms is a “thin” benefit package that may not cover many needed services and that requires significant out-of-pocket payments even for covered services. An ongoing policy debate will have to address efforts to “thicken” the benefit package along the three dimensions that define it: the number of people covered, the types of services covered, and the amount of co-pays or deductibles for covered services. Reasonable people will disagree how to trade improvements on each dimension against the others, and a process will be needed to resolve these disagreements. A related issue is whether the health system can sustainably deliver the benefit package the insurance scheme is committed to deliver.

For many years, the United States stood alone among wealthy developed countries in not providing universal coverage through some form of health-care insurance. Nearly 50 million people, mostly the employed poor and near poor (Selden and Sing 2008), were uninsured as of 2010. The uninsured are not shut out of health care altogether, since they obtain some care at public hospitals (EMTALA 1986) and neighborhood clinics, but, according to the Institute of Medicine (IOM 2002), the medical care they receive is “too little, too late.” Being sicker when care is obtained, or getting inadequate continuity of care has a significant impact on their health outcomes, leading to higher morbidity and mortality rates.

In 2010, however, The Patient Protection and Affordable Care Act (PPACA) passed into law. It contains an individual mandate requiring all individuals to purchase health care insurance on penalty of a having to pay a special tax, expands Medicaid (a means-tested health insurance program for the poor jointly funded by states and the Federal government) coverage by approximately 16 million people, establishes insurance exchanges to sell insurance, much of it subsidized, to another 16 million people, prohibits insurers from denying coverage because of prior medical conditions, and allows children to be on their parents' insurance until age 26. Together, these provisions can significantly expand access to insurance coverage in the U.S.

But how much increased coverage is actually provided by the PPACA remains to be seen, given the ongoing opposition of many states to the Federal legislation, States have the prerogative of increasing Medicaid coverage to the ACA limits, but they will have to commit to accepting some of the costs after three years. Additionally, some states are refusing to establish state insurance exchanges (as embodied in the model for this legislation, the Massachusetts universal health plan, which achieved 97 per cent coverage by 2012). Without state-run insurance exchanges, the burden will fall entirely on federal exchanges. This burden may make it harder to expand coverage to those who are not Medicaid eligible, but we won't know until the problem is studied. One of the largest groups of people excluded from access to insurance coverage under the PPACA is the group comprised of unauthorized immigrants (who are also excluded from universal coverage plans in most countries). Given that many of the estimated 12 million long-term unauthorized immigrants in the U.S. count as members of the society, even if they are not citizens, coverage in the U.S., even if the PPACA is fully implemented, will not be truly universal. To be sure, unauthorized immigrants still have access to emergency care at all U.S. hospitals because of EMTALA.

Aside from financial barriers to access, there are several important kinds of non-financial barriers. These include forms of discrimination and exclusion, such as racism and gender-bias; geographical barriers; and language and cultural barriers, including cultural attitudes toward disease and medical care. In the United State, for example, we know that the prevalence of certain health conditions is much higher among African Americans than whites. Controlling for insurance coverage, income, and educational differences, African-Americans are still less likely to receive important treatments for a range of serious illnesses, including heart disease and certain kinds of organ failure (IOM 2002). Just how to explain these utilization disparities is a matter of ongoing research, some of which focuses on conscious and unconscious attitudes and racial stereotypes. Until advocacy groups for women, such as the National Breast Cancer Coalition, lobbied successfully to alter research funding policy, some women's diseases were systematically under funded in the U.S. Similarly, there are significant differences in access to care that derive from the geographical maldistribution of providers, including physicians, and services. Thus physicians concentrate their practices in wealthier urban and suburban areas, leaving poor urban and rural areas underserved. Many hospitals face the problem of overcoming language barriers because of the large and diverse immigrant populations that they serve, and striking examples abound of failures to meet health needs because of cultural views about disease and medical care (Fadiman 1997).

All of these kinds of barriers to access act as obstacles to providing adequate health care both in the U.S and in many developing countries. If justice requires providing universal access to health care, then these barriers must be addressed as a matter of justice. Some of these barriers to care, such as geographical and cultural barriers, remain as such even in systems that aim to provide universal access. All of them would have to be specifically addressed by any effort to move the U.S. system toward the provision of universal access.

It might be thought that the provision of universal access to a range of public health and personal medical services would go a long way toward reducing health inequalities among different social groups, whether ethnic or divided by socio-economic status. But, careful studies in many countries, most dramatically in the United Kingdom, have shown that health inequalities by class have not been reduced by the presence of universal coverage through the British National Health Service (Marmot 2004). Two longitudinal studies of British civil servants, known as the Whitehall Studies, have shown a pronounced socio-economic gradient of health across different categories of workers: the higher a worker's occupational status, the longer and healthier her life. In addition, this difference is not explained by risk factors associated with occupational status, such as smoking rates or lipid levels or other “lifestyle choices.” Nor is the gradient simply a result of “deprivation”—for none of the civil servants are poor, lack basic education, or medical care—and the gradient is present across all occupational levels.

The Whitehall results are very robust and reveal a strong gradient of health across a wide range of morbidity and mortality measures. They are also consistent with findings found in many countries, both with and without universal coverage. All these findings show a strong impact of non-health care determinants of health: income and wealth, education, inclusion and exclusion, social cohesiveness, and others. An important focus of research is to explain the mechanisms that might be at work in creating these health inequalities. The WHO Commission on the Social Determinants of Health issued a final report in 2008 that called for various policy measures that improve daily living conditions and distribute more equitably money, power, and resources, as well as research aimed at better measuring the influence of these factors and evaluating the impact of measures to redistribute these determinants of health more fairly (CSDH 2008).

For our purposes, however, the lesson to be drawn from the literature on the social determinants of population health is that we cannot expect health inequalities to disappear solely as a result of providing universal access to care. Health care is not the only socially controllable factor affecting population health and its distribution. This leaves us with a question we shall have to address: if other factors besides health care are important determinants of health, then is the focus on providing universal access to health care misplaced? Even if justice requires us to promote or protect health, does it require us to do so through the provision of access to health care, or should we now modify our view of the importance of health care in light of what we have learned from social epidemiology? We return to address this issue in Sections 3 and 4.

It will help to summarize the key points that emerge from this sketch of what different societies do to provide access to care.

  1. If we focus on developed countries, we find a nearly universal commitment to assuring universal access to care. The methods of financing and organization may differ, and the actual kinds of care provided may vary somewhat, but there are avowals that universal access is a social obligation, even a right, and there are institutions that approximate such coverage. To be sure, some barriers to access remain even in these countries, especially geographical maldistribution of services and inequalities in access for some indigenous or minority groups.
  2. Serious limitations on access remain in developed and developing countries alike. In some, there remain financial barriers, for example the 12 million unauthorized immigrants in the U.S. and elsewhere who cannot buy insurance assured to others; in all countries, there are non-financial barriers to care, often geographical, but also in many there are racial barriers as well.
  3. The commitment to universal access is hardly limited to developed countries, for various middle income countries have recently provided universal access or attempted to do so incrementally, and there is a recent effort to include low-income countries in the effort to secure universal coverage.
  4. Nevertheless, the actual explanations of why institutions have been developed that provide approximations to universal access may be as varied as the local social histories of these countries, and there is no simple way to infer from the presence of these institutions to the conclusion that these are all efforts to promote conceptions of social justice.
  5. Despite the belief that probably accompanied the introduction of universal access, namely that it would reduce health inequalities in the population, we know from the social epidemiology literature that health inequalities persist, that they are correlated with the distribution of a wide set of non-health care goods, and that they are present across a broad spectrum of the population.

2. Conceptualizing and Measuring Access to Care

Arguably, the goal of universal access to health care, as embodied in health systems in nearly all developed countries, is to secure equal or at least equitable access to needed care. How can we tell whether or not access to care is equal? What should we count as equitable access, if this involves departures from equal access? We might hope that it is relatively unproblematic to determine when access to care is equal, as it is, for example, with income, and that equitable access would then consist of allowable or justifiable inequalities in access. As we shall see in this Section, giving an account of equal access, let alone equitable access, is not so easy.

Conceptualizing and measuring access to care is more complex a task than it might seem at first. In part, this is because health care is non-homogeneous in its function, for it does quite different things for us. In addition, there is disagreement about the nature of health care as a social good: some think it is just a commodity, to be purchased in a market like other commodities; others claim it has a special moral importance that distinguishes it from some other market goods. If we are to make sense out of claims that we owe each other equal or at least equitable access to care, and this means we must overcome various barriers to access to care that create inequitable access, then we need to be clear how to determine when access is unequal or unjustifiably unequal.

2.1 When is Access to Care Equal?

It is tempting to think that we can give a completely non-controversial definition of equal access to health care—much as we can do for equality of income—and reserve all controversy for debates about which departures from equality conform to acceptable principles of justice. If A earns $10,000 less than B, the inequality might be thought equitable by some if B works longer or harder than A, by others if B's skills have a higher market value than A's, and by others if B needs more than A does. Here our moral disagreements about appropriate distributive principles show up as disagreements about just or equitable income distribution, though there is no controversy about whether incomes are equal.

The situation is arguably different for the notion of equal access to health care: to arrive at a notion of equal access, we must already have made various decisions about what considerations ought to count in judging when access is equal. These decisions reflect our purpose or interest in making the judgment about equality, and some of these discriminations are themselves moral. So moral considerations are already embedded in the specification of equal access and are not held at bay until we get to decisions about equity.

To see the point, consider what may seem to be a trivial example. Is there equal access among department colleagues to the coffee in the lounge not far from Prof. A's office? If there is no wheelchair access to the lounge, then a paraplegic colleague can readily claim unequal access—and this claim has force even if she drinks as much coffee as she wants because someone is willing to fetch it for her. What should we say about the fact that the coffee is only ten feet from Prof. A's office, but thirty from her junior colleague's? Does it matter if one colleague hates the color of the paint in the lounge but others do not? Does it matter that one colleague has had negative experiences in the coffee lounge on a previous job but other colleagues have not? If we view access to coffee as meeting an important need, then we might worry about the unequal distances or the psychic burden of seeking the coffee, but if we think coffee is only an amenity (leave aside addiction), then we might not care about these other issues, even if they lead to differences in preferences for obtaining coffee and in coffee consumption. How we think about the importance of drinking coffee matters to us when we consider whether access to it is equal.

The same point applies to judgments about equal access to health care: such judgments presuppose some view about the moral importance of health care. Nevertheless, it is probably fair to say that all that most people have in mind when they talk about equal access to health care is a negative criterion, specifically that certain traditional constraints on access, mainly financial, geographical, or discriminatory, should play a minimal role in determining whether people who need health care get it. There may be implicit in this negative characterization a positive ideal—for example, “any any two persons of comparable health status who want appropriate care have an equal chance of getting it.” But nothing so schematic may be in anyone's mind at all; there may be only a moral complaint against a particular inequality. Thus in many cases there is agreement about what to call equal access only because there is agreement not to accept a particular kind of inequality.

2.2 Conceptualizing and Measuring Equity of Access to Care

The dominant conceptualization of equitable access to health care among health service researchers builds on the idea that the utilization of services should reflect actual needs for care (Aday and Anderson 1974, 1975, Aday 1975, Aday, Anderson and Fleming 1980, Aday 2001, Aday et al. 2004). A prominent competing view, especially in the United States, is a modified market view that focuses on the availability in the market of a decent basic minimum of care (cf. Enthoven 1980). This modified market account is not to be confused with a pure market view that allows all care to be determined by market forces, which might mean that some people do not even get a decent basic minimum of care. However, even the modified market view allows for many inequalities of access to care that would be judged inequitable by the use-per-need view. It will be useful to examine the implications of these two prominent views of equity of access.

Consider first the use-per-need view. On this view, use-per-need should not be distorted by certain structural features of the health system, such as the distribution of providers or facilities or exclusionary attitudes they harbor, or by inappropriate disposing or enabling factors of individuals, such as their information about health care or their inability to communicate with providers, or their income, or by such “process variables” as travel and waiting time. The approach allows us to test whether or not a factor potentially affecting access, such as waiting time, actually does, for example, if it produces an effect on actual utilization of the services where need is held constant. Where distorting factors mean that utilization of services is not determined by need, the use-per-need view judges the access inequitable. In this way, the view can be used analytically to test how important certain potential access factors are, and it can be used normatively to make judgments about equity of access.

The use-per-need approach is quite sensitive to what actual measures of both need and utilization are used. A process variable—for example, time spent in a waiting room—may have a significant effect on measures of satisfaction with care (a subjective measure of actual access), but have relatively little effect on utilization rates (an objective measure of actual access). So the choice of objective or subjective measures of realized access may yield different assessments of the importance of a process variable and, ultimately, of the equity of access to health-care services. Even if we are inclined to use an objective measure, however, it matters which one. For example, cultural attitudes toward entering a sick role might have a greater impact on disability days, as a measure of need, than they do on the more serious level of need, bed-disability days.

Critics of the use-per-need account argue that some process variables are important determinants of equity of access even if they do not have a significant impact on utilization of services (Sloan and Bentkover 1979). For example, even if waiting time does not interfere with utilization, it may impose a significant burden on those seeking care, and that burden may be inequitable. Another criticism of the use-per-need account is the claim that uniformity in utilization rates is not even a necessary condition for equity of access. If some people are informed, yet averse to the utilization of medical services, then differences in their utilization rate from others should not count as an inequity of access. A further objection is that the approach abstracts from the effectiveness of care—it does not look at health status as an outcome, only the utilization of services. People with different utilization rates may have the same health status as an output simply because the care was ineffective, so measuring its rate of utilization does not tell us what really matters.

The rationale for the use-per-need view might appeal to an argument from function of the following sort: “The (main) function of health-care services is to prevent and cure illness, i.e., to meet health-care needs. A distribution of health-care services that is not determined by the distribution of health-care needs is therefore unreasonable in some important sense. One sense in which it is unreasonable is that it would defeat the purpose of meeting health needs to provide access in ways not determined by the level or kinds of need people have. Another sense in which it is unreasonable is that it ignores similarities and differences—here in health status—between persons which, given the function of health care, ought to be relevant to establishing its reasonable distribution. Ignoring such relevant similarities and differences is what it means for a distribution to be inequitable.” A version of this argument is clearly foreshadowed in Bernard Williams' (1971: 27) now classic discussion of equality in which he concluded that, “leaving aside preventive medicine the proper ground of distribution of medical care is health; this is a necessary truth.”

Unfortunately, this argument from function falls short of providing a basis for the use-per-need view. The function of food processors is to meet food processing needs, but no one believes that willingness to pay for food processors is an inappropriate basis for distributing them and that we must do so in proportion to the presence of vegetable-slicing needs in the population. The problem here is that meeting some needs, but not others, matters as a concern of justice or equity. In the next section, we shall return to seek more persuasive foundations for the use-per-need view.

Consider next the modified market view, according to which we have equity of access to health care when a decent minimum is available to all in a market. Unlike the utilization rate approach, the market view is not really a position represented in the empirical literature on access but rather a composite abstracted from views that are common in the economics and health planning literature. Its interest lies in the quite different limits it places on the notion of equitable access and because of the quite different underlying view of health care and distributive justice.

I earlier noted that one objection to the utilization rate approach is that similarity in intergroup use-per-need rates is not even a necessary condition for equitable access (or distribution). One rationale for this claim is the view that health-care services are commodities like any others. On this view, there is nothing so ‘special’ about these services that cannot be accommodated by allowing a market for them to respond to people's preferences for them. On such a view, equity of access is assured if three main conditions obtain: (1) the commodity must be available at something like “true social cost;” (2) individuals are capable of making rational (informed) decisions about using the system; (3) income distribution must be (approximately) equitable. The second condition requires that information about alternatives—for example, therapies or insurance schemes—is available and that people are competent and informed enough to make use of the information. Some access inequities arise when this condition is not met and these must be addressed by public policy. (We shall see how these conditions affect the philosophical arguments about prudential insurance in the Section 3.)

Aside from the problem of subsidies to the poor to guarantee equitable income distribution, the central problems of access are those brought about by departures of the medical market from the ideal of a truly competitive market (Arrow 1963). In particular, there may be various distortions on the supply side which amount to the market's not delivering services at their “true social cost.” For example, rural populations or inner city minorities may not be able to get the care they want and can afford. They may not be able to get it in the desired quantities, or at the desired times with the characteristics they desire.

Viewed in this way, the problem is that the market is unresponsive to consumer preferences on the supply side and interventions may be needed to correct the problem, generally by addressing structural problems in capital expenditure policy. A central problem here is the way in which the choice of a health insurance plan is tied to features of employment and the unavailability of an adequate range of plans—for example, ones that cover people between jobs. The central issues of access and equity of access are concerned with these supply malfunctions of the market. (In Section 3, we shall see how Dworkin (1994, 2000) attempts to avoid these market limitations.)

The third condition, about equitable income distribution, is rarely addressed in the literature. Obviously, if income redistribution brings people only to the officially defined poverty level, it is inadequate to cover the costs of a decent basic minimum of care (this notion is discussed further later in this section). If the transfer falls short of this, we have an inequitable transfer. So the modified market view I am sketching is not that of the pure libertarian who might reject all such transfers, but rather one in which there is implicit acceptance of some important moral claims that might loosely be characterized as “welfare rights.”

Assuring equitable access in the ways defined by the market approach leaves extensive room for all sorts of departures from equitable access as defined by the use-per-need approach. Surely, there may be variations in the amenities that accompany healthcare services, if that is how we want to look at (some) process variables such as waiting time. Equal quality in these dimensions is surely not required, any more than everyone prefers equal quality in, say, automobiles. Similarly, use-per-need rates may vary with suspect variables like income or race and yet not indicate any inequity of access, contrary to the use-per-need formulation. Rather, the unequal distribution of health care in quantity and quality can be viewed merely as the expression of different preference curves, just as food budgets might vary among a welfare recipient, a factory worker, and a wealthy industrialist. If we take the underlying income distribution to be morally acceptable, its expression in terms of utilization of health services need indicate no inequity.

Put succinctly, then, the market approach I am considering here comes to this: access to health care is equitable if and only if there are no information barriers, financial barriers, or supply anomalies that prevent access to a reasonable or decent basic minimum of health-care services. How plausible such an account is depends on the characterization of such a decent minimum and the moral arguments maintaining that provision of such a minimum is all that justice or equity demands. The problem facing the 'market' proponent thus appears to be the other side of the coin from the problem facing the use-per-need account. If the market view suggests we owe each other on grounds of justice only a decent minimum, the use-per-need view suggests we owe much more—both require clear rationales. One central problem with that account was its simplifying assumption that health care is relatively homogeneous in function and that the proper basis for its distribution must be the realization of that function. A related problem for that account is its working assumption that access can be equitable only if services of all kinds that happen to be offered in the system are distributed according to need. If, however, we want to treat health-care services as non-homogeneous in function, and we are willing to ground equity claims only by reference to some features of some of those services, we owe an account of how to draw the lines.

There are three ways to elucidate the notion of a decent basic minimum: (1) the provision of a general criterion by reference to which we can tell if services are within the minimum or are above it; (2) the simple listing the types of services included; or (3) the description of a fair procedure for determining the minimum. In the market literature—indeed in much of the literature — there is little attempt to give a general criterion or describe an appropriate, fair procedure. What attempts we get are far too vague. Charles Fried, in an early effort at characterization (1976:32), suggests that the “decent minimum should reflect some conception of what constitutes tolerable life prospects in general. It should speak quite strongly to things like maternal and child health which set the terms under which individuals will compete and develop.” The characterization is not developed enough to tell when prospects are tolerable and for whom.

Efforts to specify a decent basic minimum more commonly appeal to a list of categories of services or to some “average” level of services in a particular health system. Neither of these approaches provides a criterion that clarifies why these services are viewed as decent and basic. Where there is appeal to a list, as in an early proposal by Enthoven (1980), the Consumer Choice Health Plan that significantly influenced the Clinton Administration efforts at health reform, it may derive from an earlier effort at regulation, such as the 1973 HMO Act. It is typical of such appeals to lists that there is no rationale offered for why items are on the list. If mental health services are included, we are often not told which ones; and there may be categorical omissions, such as dental care, without explanation.

Appeals to an “average” insurance package similarly provide no clear basis for deciding whether a set of benefits is truly appropriate to a decent minimum. For one thing, the average may reflect many features of a market that is not working well, capturing much that is wasteful, ineffective, or inappropriate in a system providing care. It may also be the case that an average package omits some crucial features of care, for example, certain mental health services. Indeed, by focusing on services provided within a given system to “average” users, the concept of what we owe people, that is, what counts as equitable treatment, is turned into a completely “interstitial” notion. We are told, “within the confines of this system, equity requires making this package available, since it happens to be available on average” but we are not in a more general way told that the system provides people with what they should get, as a matter of justice. We are, in effect, told that a system that aims to meet certain needs should treat people equitably in addressing those needs, but we are not told that a system that is fair to people should perforce meet certain health needs. Nor are we given a process that might help us decide what to provide as a matter of justice where there may be disagreement about equitable coverage. In short, neither lists nor averages substitute for an appeal to a defensible rationale or to a fair process for determining what should be covered. (We shall consider in Section 3 how the insurance approaches of Dworkin (1994) and Gibbard (1982) address these issues.)

To conclude this section, we shall briefly consider what each of the two approaches to access has to say about some race inequalities in health and health care that are found in the U.S. A first point to note is that these accounts of access to health care do not inform us about the origins of some important inequalities in health. For example, certain health conditions, such as high blood pressure, diabetes, and asthma are more prevalent among African Americans than among other racial groups in the U.S. However the differences are best explained—by income differences, educational differences, lifestyle choices, some other environmental exposure to risks, or biological differences in the susceptibility to those illnesses—if the difference is not the result of differences in access to preventive services or treatments, then inequity in access to care is not the source of the health difference. A higher prevalence rate—or need—should lead to a higher utilization rate for relevant services, or else the use-per-need rates would differ between African Americans and other groups. What the use-per-need approach counsels us to do is to consider whether differences in the use-per-need rate are best accounted for by certain structural features of the system (e.g. inadequate supplies of providers in the areas where the population in need resides, organization of care that induces discontinuity of care, discriminatory attitudes of providers, including conscious or unconscious stereotyping), or by enabling or disposing features of the individuals (income differences, insurance level differences, educational differences, age differences, attitudes toward disease and treatment). If factors other than differences in need affect the use-per-need rate, then we have strong grounds for thinking there is an unfair inequality in access to care.

How would the modified market view judge such differences? Differences across types of insurance coverage (above the decent basic minimum level) that the use-per-need view would judge problematic might be dismissed as preference differences by the modified market view. Just as the household preferences and budget for food or clothing might differ across income and education levels, so too utilization of health services might differ—above the decent minimum—without the raised eyebrows evoked by unfair inequalities. If there is a quality difference—which might even take the form of additional protection against health risk through better diagnosis or more continuous care—that might not be problematic for the modified market view when it would be for the use-per-need view.

3. Does Justice Require Universal Access to Health Care?

In this Section we shall examine three lines of argument that aim to show that universal access to (at least some forms of) health care is a requirement of justice. If one or more of these views establishes its claim, then the practice we have noted in many countries of financing institutions aimed at providing such access can be construed as an effort to meet, however imperfectly, a requirement of justice. We shall not spend time, however, assessing views that deny such claims altogether—noting only that some libertarian accounts of justice would reject redistributive efforts to promote health just as they would redistributive efforts to promote other social objectives.

3.1 Health, Opportunity, and Universal Access

One prominent line of argument in favor of universal access to some forms of health care builds on the contribution made by health—and derivately by health care—to the opportunities people can exercise. The most explicit version of this argument extends Rawls's appeal to a principle assuring fair equality of opportunity (Daniels 1981, 1985, 2008). Variants on that argument can be extrapolated from Sen's (1980, 1992) work on capabilities or from Arneson's (1988) and Cohen's (1989) versions of “equal opportunity for welfare or advantage,” though there will be differences among these variants in what kinds of care are covered and under what conditions.

The fair equality of opportunity argument for universal access can be sketched as follows:

  1. Suppose health consists of functioning normally for some appropriate reference class (e.g. a gender specific subgroup) of a species; in effect, health is the absence of significant pathology.
  2. Maintaining normal functioning—that is health—makes a significant—if limited—contribution to protecting the range of opportunities individuals can reasonably exercise; departures from normal functioning decrease the range of plans of life we can reasonably choose among to the extent that it diminishes the functionings we can exercise (our capabilities).
  3. Various socially controllable factors contribute to maintaining normal functioning in a population and distributing health fairly in it, including traditional public health and medical interventions, as well as the distribution of such social determinants of health as income and wealth, education, and control over life and work.
  4. If we have social obligations to protect the opportunity range open to individuals, as some general theories of justice, such as Rawls's justice as fairness, claim, then we have obligations to promote and protect normal functioning for all.
  5. Providing universal access to a reasonable array of public health and medical interventions in part meets our social obligation to protect the opportunity range of individuals, though reasonable people may disagree about what is included within such an array of interventions, given resource and technological limits.

Some comments will clarify the main points in this sketch. First, the narrow concept of health does not preclude the broad range of determinants of health noted in (3), yet the narrower notion is about what epidemiologists and public health planners measure and care. This narrower concept of health avoids conflating health with well being more generally, which the WHO definition of health arguably does (“Health is a state of complete physical, mental and social well-being and not merely the absence of disease or infirmity”) (WHO 1948). Obviously, though, normal functioning includes cognitive and emotional functioning and not just physical health, for we are complex social animals. Health remains a “limit” or “ceiling” concept, unlike income, for we cannot increase health indefinitely but must aim only for normal functioning for all.

Second, protecting and promoting normal functioning is not the only factor affecting the range of opportunities open to people. Income, education, and basic liberties, as well as other factors, do so as well. Nevertheless, the loss of functioning or premature death that may come with ill health clearly diminishes the range of plans of life people can reasonably choose among in a given society. Accordingly, protecting health protects opportunity, even if it is not the only thing that does so. A crucial feature of the argument is that we are concerned about the health of all because we are concerned about protecting the opportunity range of all.

Third, we have learned much in the last several decades about the broader social determinants of health (see entry by Sreenivasan on Health Inequalities and Justice), especially that the presence of universal access in a society does not eliminate or significantly reduce health inequalities in it. Does the importance of other socially controllable factors that affect population health and its distribution mean that providing universal access to an appropriate set of public health and personal medical services is less important (see Sreenivasan 2007)? Suppose we learn that some expensive individual interventions contribute less to protecting the opportunity range of individuals than redistributing some other important goods that are determinants of health. That might well mean that we should spend less on health care and redefine the benefit package we provide in a universal access system. But it should not mean that we abandon universal access to care, even if it means we ought to shrink the range of medical services open to people in light of other ways to reduce risks of loss of functioning. No matter how justly we distribute the broader determinants of health, some people will become ill and others not. Universal access to reasonable care (given its relative effectiveness compared to other things we may do) is still the only way to assure people that certain health needs can be equitably met.

Fourth, the extension of Rawls's theory introduces some modification in the account of opportunity, but the modification is not inconsistent with the thrust of justice as fairness. Justice as fairness abstracts from health status differences in its assumption that agents are choosing principles to govern people who are fully functional over a normal lifespan. This simplification drew criticism from Arrow (1973) and later Sen (1980), for it means the method of judging inequality, the index of primary social goods, would fail to account for the inability of people in some health states to convert those goods into the same level of well-being as people functioning normally. Rawls's (1971) notion of opportunity is primarily geared to the strategic importance of access to jobs and offices; health, viewed as normal functioning, clearly has a bearing on access to jobs and offices, but we also need a broader account of opportunity if we are to address the impact of health on other important aspects of life. In borrowing justification for a principle assuring fair equality of opportunity, then, and then using it to apply to a broader notion of opportunity, the argument involves a modification of Rawls's own arguments. Nevertheless, he seems to have adopted this view of how to extend his theory (Rawls 1995: 184, n.14; Rawls 2001: 175, n.58).

Despite this modification, the approach preserves a key feature of Rawls's original idealization away from consideration of health states: in aiming to keep all in a population functioning normally over a normal lifespan, we aim to keep the real world as close to the idealization as possible. A crucial consequence of this is that we are not simply focused on equalizing opportunity, but on promoting the broadened range of opportunity that comes with normal functioning for everyone. The view aims at promoting population health and not simply equalizing it: equally bad health is not the goal of the argument. Put another way, the ultimate goal of health policy is that all people function normally: but that means the ultimate goal is both egalitarian and maximizing (though short of the ultimate goal, we face important trade-offs).

Finally, we must consider how we can meet health needs fairly when we cannot meet them all. The question is especially difficult because we have reasonable disagreements about what interventions to include in a universal access system, as we noted earlier when we noted how reasonable disagreements will arise about the tradeoff between improved financial protection, say by reducing the co-pays or deductibles a benefit involves, and coverage of more types of services during deliberations about the comprehensiveness of a universal coverage benefit package. This is true even if we accept the principle of fair equality of opportunity principle as the appropriate principle to govern health and health care.

The problem is that the fair equality of opportunity principle is too general and indeterminate to address a family of “unsolved rationing problems” (Daniels 1993). For example, when we are thinking of investing in a new service or technology, we may agree that we should give those who are worst off in their health some priority over those who are better off. But we may wonder how much priority we should give them if we can produce much bigger improvement in health for those who are somewhat better off. Similarly, we may agree not to allow many trivial benefits to outweigh significant ones, but we may still disagree about when do modest benefits for larger numbers of people outweigh significant benefits for fewer people. In these and other problems, reasonable people—people seeking reasons that can form the basis for a mutual justification of policy—will disagree about how to make the tradeoffs among the competing values at issue, even if they agree that the overall goal of health policy should be to protect opportunity. We lack prior agreement on more fine-grained principles that tell us how best to protect opportunity in this context. Because we lack a consensus on such principles, we should engage a form of procedural justice or fair process to yield fair outcomes.

One version of such a process is called “accountability for reasonableness” (Daniels and Sabin 2008). It requires a search for mutually justifiable reasons, publicity about the grounds for decisions, revisability of decisions in light of new evidence and arguments, and assurance that the process is adhered to. The specific features of such a fair process would have to be adapted to the institutional level at which it is used to make decisions about what to cover. Specifically, decisions about the content of a universal access benefit package should be specified through a fair, deliberative process that conforms to these general conditions. In Section 5 we shall return to consider in more detail what kinds of interventions are in general supported by this account.

Accountability for reasonableness can arguably be thought of as a form of pure procedural justice (Rawls 1971) because we lack prior consensus on the fine-grained principles needed to resolve disputes about these resource allocation issues, though we may arrive at mutually acceptable justifications through deliberation about specific cases. It differs from gambling, Rawls's example of a case of pure procedural justice, in two ways. First, the appeal to process is constrained by some prior moral principles. For example, an outcome should not contradict what fair equality of opportunity requires by discriminating against some subgroup by race or gender. A local decision-making body could not engage in gender or race bias and consider that a fair outcome. One might claim that the same constraint applies to the gambling case: if only whites and no blacks were allowed to gamble, then the outcome of a spin of a fair roulette wheel would also not be fair—though some might reply this is a constraint on who plays the game, not on whether we view the outcome of the spin of a fairly balanced wheel as fair outcome. Second, we can imagine philosophical reasoning persuading us to adopt a principle that renders the appeal to a fair process unnecessary, but we cannot imagine such a philosophical “proof” of the fairness of a gambling outcome that would lead us to think the spin of a fair roulette wheel or a throw of a properly balanced die can be rendered unnecessary in the same way. Though fair equality or opportunity, including non-discrimination, constrains acceptable outcomes of fair process, it is too general an idea to settle what counts as an acceptable outcome. That requires agreement, in general by a range of stakeholders, on reasons for thinking an allocation is an acceptable way to meet needs fairly and so protect opportunity for those involved. The point behind insisting on what we call the “relevance” condition is to search for mutually justifiable reasons for thinking that a particular resource allocation is an acceptable way to aim at fair equality of opportunity. The condition takes us beyond mere consistency with fair equality of opportunity since that principle does not determine what to do in the face of disagreements about priorities, aggregation, and other problems.

The argument for universal access sketched earlier specifically embraces Rawls's fair equality of opportunity principle. It is worth remarking that the variations on this argument might retain steps 1–3 but modify the principle that is appealed to in 4, provided there is a reasonable connection between any substituted principle and the central observation in 3, that health affects the opportunity range open to people. For example, Sen has argued that the appropriate target of concerns about equality is a space of capabilities, thought of as functionings we can choose to exercise. A principle requiring us to protect the range of capabilities for people (either equally or to some sufficient level) would also provide a basis for keeping people functioning normally through universal access to interventions that reduce the health risks to them or that treat them for departures from normal functioning. Though Sen has not developed this account into a theory of justice that articulates a set of principles of justice, the central point here is that a concern to protect a space of functionings we can choose to exercise is equivalent to the focus of the earlier argument on protecting opportunities that it is reasonable for people to exercise (Daniels 2009b).

A third alternative version of the earlier argument might (in 4) invoke a principle assuring equal opportunity for welfare or advantage (Arneson 1988; Cohen 1989), a view that later came to be called “luck egalitarianism.” Arguably, such a principle would also support a universal access system that included a broad range of preventive and treatment services. This particular principle, however, will differ in terms of what is covered from the opportunity-based account described earlier for it more explicitly leaves room to exclude coverage for conditions for which an individual is substantively responsible. It says we do not owe each other assistance or compensation for bad “option” luck in the way we do for bad “brute” luck. At the same time, it might include access to services that correct for some disadvantages (e.g. lower manual dexterity or lower intelligence) that might be considered normal functioning by the account sketched earlier. Still, this is a universal access system, even if it excludes coverage for conditions for which society holds individuals responsible (see Daniels 2009a). Nevertheless, some luck egalitarians reject the appeal to opportunity proposed in the account sketched here (Segall 2010).

3.2 Universal Access to Prudentially Defined Care

A second general line of argument in favor of universal access to some forms of health care builds on the idea that prudent individuals would insure themselves against the prospect of needing certain kinds of health care. We shall consider two versions of this argument, Dworkin's (1981, 1994, 2000) effort to spell out the implications of treating people with equal respect, and Gibbard's (1982) appeal to an ex ante pareto optimality principle combined with an assumed right to a decent basic minimum of income. As we shall see, though both arguments use different assumptions to support universal access to different health care benefit packages, their main point is to counter certain implausible views about what benefits should be included in a universal access system.

Dworkin's argument can be sketched as follows:

  1. We have an obligation to treat people as equals.
  2. Treating people as equals is best achieved by giving people equality of resources (and this idea can in theory be shown to be coherent by devising an appropriate initial auction, combined with appropriate post-auction trades and insurance schemes against disadvantaging outcomes).
  3. Suppose we had equality of resources in the U.S., for example, that income and wealth were equally distributed, and that all people had information about health care interventions and their effects as good as what the best doctors have, and that no one has prior information about the specific risks faced by specific individuals.
  4. Then each person could act prudently to buy insurance protection against various health needs without government subsidies or otherwise distorted markets.
  5. What most people would prudently insure themselves against ought to be included in a universal access health system. (Some kinds of protection would thus be imprudent to include and we should abandon a rule of rescue that included them.)
  6. Where there is disagreement about what people count as prudent insurance (some would buy it, others not), then we need to consult with representative people of different views and make decisions about universal coverage that reflect that consultation.

Some comments will clarify key aspects of this argument. First, the first two premises involve both a strong egalitarian assumption, though one that is widely held (treating people as equals) and a very strong (specific and detailed) way of achieving it (equality of resources). Discussion of the details of these claims would take us well beyond the scope of this essay. Suffice it to say that this argument cannot proceed to an account of universal access to health care without some more general assumptions for a view of justice. In that regard, it shares with the fair equality of opportunity account the need to borrow justification for universal access from more general concerns of justice.

Second, the specific assumptions in (3) are very strong and arguably cannot be realized. The argument that presupposes them should thus be seen as an analytic tool and not an attempt to say anything very specific about how real institutions could be designed. Without, for example, knowing what level of resources would result from equalizing resources, we can say little about what levels of insurance coverage for specific conditions are welfare enhancing for individuals. Since there is no feasible way to meet the assumptions about the distribution of medical knowledge or the exclusion of knowledge of individual risks, these assumptions make the argument completely hypothetical and theoretical rather than practical. Third, the assumption that there is an ideally competitive insurance market postulated in the fourth step of the argument adds to the hypothetical nature of the argument as a whole.

Fourth, the argument focuses primarily on personal medical services and not broader public health measures that reduce overall risk or distribute that risk more fairly. There is no mention of interventions beyond individual treatment or prevention measures, and the thrust of 4 and 5 make it clear the argument is about an insurance market only for those measures. The thrust of steps 5 and 6 make it clearer that the point of the argument is to clarify what a defensible content of a universal access benefit package would include. Specifically, the argument aims to establish that we need a more plausible view of what we owe each other by way of providing health care than the indefensible view that what rescues someone from death or disability must be provided regardless of costs or opportunity costs.

The other version of a prudential insurance argument for universal coverage rests on a weaker assumption that we have a right to a decent minimum of income. In Gibbard's (1982) discussion, the assumption is invoked but not argued for. Like the other argument, the main thrust of Gibbard's argument lies in its implications for the content of a universal access benefit package.

  1. Assume the Ex Ante Pareto Principle which says: If both a) the prospects of someone are better under policy P than Q, and b) no ones' prospects are worse under Q than P, then P is better than Q. (There are no opposed interests in the cases where this principle applies.)
  2. Assume there is a right to a decent minimum of economic welfare. (Gibbard does not argue for this right, only that this precept plus the Ex Ante Pareto Principle are sufficient to establish there ought to be equal access to a decent minimum of care.)
  3. Health insurance that it is prudent for all to buy from their decent minimum defines essential health care, i.e., the decent minimum of health care.
  4. There should be universal access to a decent minimum of health care, for everyone is better off with such access and no one is worse off.
  5. There should not, however, be equal access to all health care, assuming the Ex Ante Pareto Principle, for the overall package of health care it is prudent to buy will differ above the decent minimum. Further, the Ex Ante Pareto Principle implies that some health care may not be worth purchasing insurance for by anyone.

Some comments will help clarify this argument sketch. First, Gibbard is concerned to show that this weak ethical principle has health policy implications that are significant (and are noted in steps 4 and 5). He defends the principle against anti-utilitarian arguments and against some intuitions that run counter to it but that may be irrational (on his view). Second, to arrive at the main conclusion in 4—supporting universal access to a decent minimum of care—Gibbard adopts an ethical precept that is sufficient to support provide a basis for a universal level of insurance purchasing. He does not, as noted, argue for the specific right articulated here. He might, however, try to derive some support for it from utilitarian arguments about decreasing marginal utility of income and wealth, for it is weaker than the more egalitarian view that Brandt (1979) defends on utility maximizing grounds and for which Gibbard expresses some sympathy.

Third, the crux of the argument for the conclusion in step 4 is the idea that if everyone acts prudently at the decent minimum economic threshold of welfare to buy some kinds of health care, what they buy, assuming they bear the inclusive social cost of the insurance (including any losses of efficiency), will constitute the decent minimum of care. To say it is prudent for a person to buy the insurance (while bearing those costs) is (using the Ex Ante Pareto Principle) to say the person has better prospects with the insurance than without and that no one is worse off as a result. Presumably, however, this requires that there be a competitive market for such insurance (an assumption Dworkin had to make in his argument), and it is not obvious how to achieve that in light of the pervasive uncertainties that exist in medical markets (cf. Arrow 1963), a point Gibbard notes.

Fourth, above the decent welfare minimum, it is unlikely that access to the some broader insurance package is prudent for all people to buy. That is the reason Gibbard says it is not equitable to require equal access to all health care. Here equity is equated with ethically acceptable, and what counts as ethically acceptable is (among other things) what is endorsed by the Ex Ante Pareto Principle. The same principle shows that some kinds of care are not prudent for anyone to buy—prospects are better for all people if they do not buy insurance for that care—and so a defense is made for some implications of cost effectiveness analysis.

Fifth, unlike Dworkin, who admits there may be disagreements about what it is prudent to do, Gibbard does not make that concession. Consequently, he is not concerned, as is Dworkin (or the proponent of accountability for reasonableness, in the earlier argument), with developing a way of resolving disputes about what counts as prudent.

3.3 Access to a Decent Minimum of Health Care

A different kind of argument in favor of universal access to a decent minimum of health care does not turn on support of general principles of justice (fair equality of opportunity, treating peoples as equals, or a right to a decent minimum of economic welfare), but rather on a pluralism of moral considerations plus an argument for state coordinated (coerced) beneficence (Buchanan 1984). In his discussion, Buchanan first dismisses various accounts that try to ground a universal right to a decent minimum of care, but here we shall concentrate on the positive argument supporting the idea of universal access through a legal entitlement to such care despite the absence of any moral right to it.

The argument can be sketched as follows:

  1. There are a set of special rights to a decent minimum of care that are held by these groups: members of groups, such as African Americans and Native Americans, that are owed compensation for long-standing injustice done to them; individuals harmed in their health by private or corporate actions, such as polluting public spaces or exposing workers to toxins; members of groups that have made exceptional sacrifices for the good of society as a whole, such as wounded veterans.
  2. Access to some forms of preventive services derive from a Harm Prevention Principle that justifies the use of public funds for certain public health measures plus a constitutional argument that requires equal protection from harms that the public acts to prevent.
  3. Access to some forms of beneficial services is justified by such prudential considerations as the importance of some forms of health care to producing a productive work force and a citizenry fit for national defense.
  4. Together these considerations would justify a legal entitlement to some forms of health care.
  5. In addition, there are two arguments for state enforced beneficence that can be used to support a legal entitlement to a decent minimum of care: Assuming there is a duty of charity to assist those in need of health care, then
    1. Enforcing contributions can lead to producing the public good of a decent minimum of health care for all whereas not enforcing contributions would lead many to choose alternative ways of maximizing the good they can produce through individual actions, undermining the production of the public good;
    2. Enforcing contributions produces an assurance that others will contribute to the decent basic minimum and that ones own contribution to it therefore is worth making since others will do the same.

Some points of clarification are in order. First, it remains unclear just how the special rights argued for combine to produce a decent minimum for all. Only some people hold them, and it is not fully clear what these rights entitle their bearers to. Second, it is unclear that when we add the entitlements of these special rights bearers to the content of what follows from the Harm Prevention Principle or the prudential considerations, we end up with what people would call a decent minimum of care. How the broader entitlements of the special rights bearers (if they are broad) get combined with the care that ought to universally be provided according the Harm Prevention Principle and the prudential considerations? No clear account is offered. Put another way, these pluralist considerations might suffice to establish some legal entitlements by some people to some forms of care, but it is not obvious that what emerges is a universal legal entitlement to a decent minimum of care.

Third, the arguments for enforcing beneficence seems to imply that there is a collective duty to engage in beneficent actions, whereas the duty the argument explicitly mentions is an individual duty of beneficence. The fact that individuals might fail to produce certain public goods through individual (unenforced) beneficence is a limitation that enforced coordination overcomes, but it is not a failure that results from their not discharging their duty. To treat it as if it is seems to presuppose a collective responsibility to do as much good as possible.

3.4 Lessons About Rationales for Universal Access

Several lessons can be learned from this review of lines of justification for universal access to care. One such lesson is that rationales for universal access derive from more general considerations of justice. As such, they borrow their justificatory force from the arguments for those general considerations. They also bring with them from those general theories specific considerations that may affect the content of the claim to universal access. Thus, a family of egalitarian theories that talk about equality of opportunity in different ways might thus all support universal access to health care because of its impact on opportunity, but they justify different kinds of access because they view the obligation to promote opportunity in somewhat different ways.

A second lesson is that some rationales depend on highly idealized assumptions and might provide less clarity about the design of benefit packages than might be hoped. For example, the arguments from prudential insurance—despite their different ethical presuppositions—give less guidance to institutional design and design of a benefit package than might have been hoped since they presuppose extrapolating from consumer behavior in a truly competitive and ideally informed insurance market. Similarly, both lines of argument make it impossible to be specific about what prudent insurance would include because we do not know what level of purchasing is possible at either the “equal resources” or “decent economic minimum” that the two views posit. In contrast, the deliberative fair process that supplements the fair equality of opportunity account does not require such a hypothetical context to yield results.

A third lesson is that avoiding a unifying theoretical account of universal access to care may cost more than it gains. Specifically, eschewing appeal to a background theory that justifies health care because it contributes to something else of importance to social justice (fair equality of opportunity, treating people as equals), and appealing instead to a pluralism of considerations, risks losing clarity about what care is part of the “decent minimum” it purports to provide legal entitlements to.

In the next two sections, we shall focus in more detail on what the fair equality of opportunity account says we owe each other and its implications for a right to health care. We adopt this focus because in contrast to the other views surveyed, it is more explicit about the content of the health care we owe to each other. We shall note the implications of other views where feasible.

4. What Kinds of Health Care Do We Owe Each Other?

On the fair equality of opportunity view, meeting the health needs of all persons, viewed as free and equal citizens, is of comparable and special moral importance. (If “citizens” is taken broadly to include all members of a community, then arguably long-term unauthorized immigrants should be included (Daniels and Ladin forthcoming). Specifically, since meeting health needs protects the range of opportunities people can exercise, then any social obligations we have to protect opportunity imply obligations to protect and promote health (normal functioning) for all people. Various recent theories of justice, despite their differences, affirm that we have such social obligations to protect opportunity, and so they converge on the importance of protecting health.

On the opportunity-based view, justice requires that we protect people's shares of the normal opportunity range by treating illness when it occurs, by reducing the risk of disease and disability before they occur, and by distributing those risks equitably. Within the medical system, this means we must give all people access to a reasonable array of services that promote and restore normal functioning and we must not neglect preventive measures in favor of curative ones. It means we must look beyond the medical system to traditional public health measures that profoundly affect risk levels and their distribution. We must also look beyond the health sector to the broader social determinants of health and their distribution. Since we cannot meet all the health needs that arise inside or outside the health sector, we must be accountable for the reasonableness of the resource allocation decisions we make.

The alternative views noted in the previous section arguably have narrower scope, though some may be more expandable than others. Dworkin's prudential insurance approach might have the same scope as the opportunity-based view if the insurance policy that (most?) prudent buyers purchase includes protections against health risks that go beyond treatments for illness. Dworkin is not explicit about how that broader policy might be designed. What can be purchased in any case is constrained by the level of resources available in the equality of resources approach, and Dworkin is sensitive to the fact that some purchasers may disagree about what prudence requires. Gibbard's prudent insurance buyers presumably work with a smaller premium unless a decent economic minimum is equal to what we get on the equal resources view. Gibbard is more explicitly talking only about insurance for medical services, and it might be harder to expand his account to one that meets health needs more broadly. Buchanan's decent minimum quite deliberately meets fewer health needs than the opportunity-based view.

Consider more specifically what the opportunity-based account of justice and health care requires by way of preventive services. It requires (1) reducing the risk of disease and (2) seeking an equitable distribution of those risks. The first requirement is obvious. It is often more effective to prevent disease and disability than it is to cure them when they occur (or to compensate individuals for loss of function, where cure is not possible). Cost-effectiveness arguments will have some bearing on claims about the appropriate distribution of acute vs. preventive measures (Russell 1986). Since it is better in general to avoid the burdens of disease than to reduce them once they occur, many types of preventive measures will be given prominence in a system governed by the opportunity-based account.

The second requirement should also seem obvious, especially in light of what we know about the importance of the social determinants of health. Consider the point from the perspective of occupational health. Suppose a health-care system is heavily weighted toward acute care and that it provides equal access to its services. Thus anyone with severe respiratory ailments— black lung, brown lung, asbestosis, emphysema, and so on—is given adequate comprehensive medical services as needed, but little is done to reduce exposures to risk in the workplace. Does the system meet the demands of justice?

Such a system is incomplete and unjust, according to the fair equality of opportunity view. If some groups in the population are differentially at risk of getting ill, it is not sufficient merely to attend to their illnesses. Where risk of illness differs systematically in ways that are avoidable, guaranteeing equal opportunity requires that we try to eliminate the differential risks and to prevent the excess illness experienced by those at avoidable, greater risk (of course subject to resource limits and fair process in setting limits). Otherwise the burdens and risks of illness will fall differently on different groups, and the risk of impaired opportunity for those groups will remain, despite the efforts to provide acute care. Care is not equivalent to prevention. Some disease will not be detected in time for it to be cured. Some is not curable, even if it is preventable, and treatments will vary in efficacy. We protect equal opportunity best by reducing and equalizing the risk of these conditions arising. The fact that we get an equal chance of being cured once ill because of equitable access to care does not compensate us for our unequal chances of becoming ill.

For these reasons, the fair equality of opportunity account places special importance on measures aimed at the equitable distribution of the risks of disease. Some public-health measures, such as water and waste treatment, have the general effect of reducing risk. But historically, they have also had the effect of equalizing risk between socioeconomic classes and between groups living in different geographical areas. Many other environmental measures, such as recent clean air laws and pesticide regulations, have both general effects on risk reduction and specific effects on the distribution of risks. For example, pollutants emitted from smokestacks have a different effect on people who live downwind from those who live upwind. Gasoline lead emissions have greater effect on urban than rural populations. But other health-protection measures primarily have an effect on the distribution of risks: the regulation of workplace health hazards is perhaps the clearest example. Only some groups of workers are at risk from workplace hazards, though many workers face some risk or other, especially in manufacturing settings. Just health requires that stringent regulation in all of these ways must be part of the health-care system.

What other sorts of social policies should governments pursue in order to reduce inequalities in health risks, especially in light of what we now know about the social determinants of health? The menu of options should include policies aimed at equalizing individual life opportunities, such as investment in basic education and other early childhood interventions, affordable housing, income security, and other forms of antipoverty policy. We know, for example, that early interventions aimed at child development, like the Perry High/Scope Project (Schweinhardt et al. 1993), have lasting effects on educational achievement, employment, marriage, and the reduction of mental illness. The War on Poverty Program Head Start produced lasting effects on educational achievement; educational achievement, in turn, has a direct influence on health behavior in adulthood, including diet, smoking, and physical activity (Acheson et al. 1998). Other policies that might reduce differential risk could explore changes in the degree of control and authority workers have in the workplace (Marmot et al. 1997). Even broader interventions, including addressing inequalities in the distribution of wealth, power, and resources, are recommended by the WHO Commission on the Social Determinants of Health (2010). Though the connection between these broad, intersectoral social policies and health may seem somewhat remote, and they are rarely linked to issues of health in our public policy discussions, growing evidence suggests that they should be so linked.

One central implication of this view about health for all is that there should be universal access, based on health needs, to whatever array of public health and personal medical services provides support for fair equality of opportunity under reasonable resource constraints. This implication must be unpacked since health needs are met in various ways, through public health as well as personal medical services.

Public health services promote the conditions that reduce certain risks of disease or disability. They reduce risks by assuring a clean and safe living and working environment and by providing protection against infectious diseases. These services should attend to the risks faced by the entire population and aim to reduce risks in an equitable fashion.

However much we can reduce risks to population health and do so in an equitable fashion, some people will still become ill or disabled and require personal medical services or other forms of social support that compensate for the effects of loss of function. Even if the proper arrangement of the social determinants of health and adequate attention to public health greatly reduce the burden of disease and disability in a society, most people will still need medical care at various points in their lives, especially as they age. To protect the range of opportunities for those whose loss of normal functioning we cannot prevent, we will have to devote some significant resources to such medical and social support services. Obviously, careful deliberation in a fair process will be needed to determine the proper allocation of resources to prevention vs. cure and social support.

Personal medical services that are deemed essential to promoting fair opportunity for all must be accessible to all. Specifically, this will generally mean “universal coverage” through some form of public or private insurance for services deemed to be a “decent” or “adequate” array, as required by the appeal to the underlying concept of protecting fair equality of opportunity. There should be no obstacles—financial, racial, geographical, and so on—to access to the basic tier of the system. Determining what is in that basic tier must be clarified in light of arguments about how to protect fair equality of opportunity under reasonable resource constraints, and these arguments require a fair process (accountability for reasonableness) in which appropriate democratic deliberation can take place. The theory rules out arbitrary exclusions of whole categories of kinds of services that meet needs of the sort that should be met in the basic tier. Historically, for example, preventive services, mental health care, rehabilitative, and long-term care services have been excluded from both public and private insurance schemes, for various cultural and economic reasons. Most of these “categorical” exclusions are unjustifiable from the perspective of protecting normal functioning, but specific limit-setting choices can only be made through a fair, deliberative process.

Just what forms of organization—public or private administration and financing—are implied is not a question to which the opportunity-based account of justice and health provides a unique answer. There is probably an array of “just-enough” institutional structures that can provide the needed protection of opportunity. Similarly, just what kinds of “tiering” or inequalities in services above the basic tier are compatible with protecting opportunity for all may not get specific answers from the general theory, though it will clearly supply constraints. Reasonable disagreements about these questions should be addressed in a fair deliberative process.

5. Is There a Right to Health or Health Care?

If health care were the only or most important determinant of population health, then an opportunity-based account of justice and health would be right to focus solely on a right to health care and to ignore the more contentious and possibly misleading right claim to health. A right to health care would then be a special case of a right to fair equality of opportunity. Such a right to health care is properly understood as system-relative. The entitlements it involves are contingent claims to an array of health care services that protect fair shares of the opportunity range under reasonable resource constraints.

This simple picture of a right to health care must be modified in two ways to accommodate points already made in our discussion. First, since the category of socially controllable factors determining population health and its distribution is clearly broader than health care alone (even if we include traditional public health measures within the domain of health care), the point of claiming a right to health cannot simply be to claim that others owe us certain kinds of health care. Does this give us more reason to talk about a right to health? Second, whatever sense we can make out of a right to health (or health care), the specific entitlements it involves cannot be determined except through a fair deliberative process. Consider these modifications in turn.

If health needs are broader than needs for health care, should we try to make sense of a right to health? We face an immediate and serious objection. The expression “right to health” appears to embody confusion about the kind of thing that can be the object of a right claim. Health is an inappropriate object, whereas health care is. If our poor health is not the result of anyone's doing, or failing to do, something for us or to us that might have prevented, or might cure, our condition, then it is hard to see how any right of ours is violated.

People who claim a right to health may mean something less troubling. They should be understood to be claiming that certain individuals or groups or society as a whole are obliged to perform various actions, such as designing certain institutions and distributing important goods in certain ways, that promote or maintain or restore their health and are obliged to refrain from actions that interfere with it. The reference to health should be construed as a handy way to characterize functionally the relevant, socially-controllable actions, namely those that affect population health and its distribution. This gloss on the meaning of a right to health broadens the range of actions from the provision of health care to the meeting of the broader set of health needs that arises when we grasp the broader determinants of health. This gloss allows us to see why some advocates, for example of a human right to health, have insisted on a “right to health” and not just on a “right to (certain) health care services.” They want, and reasonably so, the right to imply that there are obligations to perform a broad range of actions that affect health, even if these actions are not normally construed as health care services and even if they involve factors outside the health sector, however broadly construed. The gloss makes it clear, however, that a right to health, so understood, is not violated when there has been a just distribution of the socially controllable factors affecting health, yet health fails anyway. We do not have to denounce as confused those who claim a right to have the full range of their health needs met.

Just what entitlements follow from a right to have a broad set of health needs met is system relative and depends on resource allocation decisions that are made in a fair deliberative process. To see the point, consider an objection sometimes made to the narrower claim to a right to health care, namely Fried's (1978) objection that an individual right to health care invites falling into a “bottomless pit.” Fried is worried that if we posit a fundamental individual right to have needs satisfied, no other social goals will be able to override the right claims to all health-care needs.

No such fundamental right to have specific needs met is directly posited on the view sketched here. Rather, the particular rights and entitlements of individuals to have certain needs met are specified only as a result of a fair deliberative process aimed at meeting population health needs fairly. Typically, not all health needs can be met under reasonable resource constraints. Deciding which needs should actually be met and what resources are to be devoted to doing so—both within and outside the health sector—requires careful moral judgment and a wealth of empirical knowledge about the effects of alternative allocations. The right to health can yield entitlements only to those needs that it is reasonable to try to meet.

This restriction on how we specify the content of the right to health means, for example, that we cannot directly infer from (a) the moral fact that Jack has a right to health care and (b) the empirical fact that an experimental pancreas transplant offers him his only chance at survival that (c) Jack is entitled to that intervention. Jack's medical entitlements—given his right—depend both on his condition and on the array of interventions it is reasonable to provide the population of which he is a member. That reasonable array in turn depends on what we know is effective, what resources we have, and what priority should be given to meeting his need compared to that of others. If pancreas transplants are of unproven efficacy, or if their cost or cost-effectiveness makes including them in a benefit package unreasonable, given what else it would be better to include, then coverage for such transplants may be denied for Jack and others. Although a moral right to health is grounded in the general idea that we have obligations to protect opportunity by promoting normal functioning, its specific content is in this fundamental way system-relative.

We noted earlier some dimensions of the limit setting that must go on. The various institutions that affect opportunity must be weighed against each other. Similarly, the resources required to provide for fair equality of opportunity must be weighed against what is needed to provide for other important social institutions. This is true even though guaranteeing fair equality of opportunity has (lexical or strict) priority over principles of justice promoting wellbeing in other ways, at least within Rawls's theory of justice as fairness. The point is that institutions, including health care institutions, capable of protecting opportunity can be maintained only in societies whose productive capacities they do not undermine. The bugaboo of the bottomless pit is less threatening in the context of such a theory. The price paid is that we are less clear, in general and abstracting from the application of the theory to a particular society, just what the individual claim comes to.

The right to health must be system relative for another reason that is implied by a deeper feature of the opportunity-based account. What is special about meeting health needs, for purposes of justice, is that it contributes to protecting individuals' fair shares of the normal opportunity range for their society. That range, to emphasize the point, is society relative. This relativity, however, then also infects claims about what we are entitled to when a health system is designed for a specific society. The relativization of the normal range to a society captures an important requirement for a theory of just health care. It is not a feature we should lightly abandon. The importance of meeting specific health needs will vary depending on facts about a society, and a distributive principle must leave room for such variation. Curing dyslexia might well be more important in some societies than others, though it is an instance of pathology in all of them. (Suppose a disease is widespread, even universal, in a society. Say it is a form of anemia that affects all and is debilitating across the board. One might think that impact on the normal opportunity range will not tell us how important it is to treat this disease, since it hurts all individuals equally. But the opportunity account still helps us here, for it is not only a principle governing competitive advantage. The anemia in this case is a disease which keeps each individual from adequately carrying out any life plan that otherwise would be reasonable in his society. Remember, the reference point is normal species-functioning, not simply functioning in a certain society.)

Consider the claim that it is a matter for the courts to decide what should be included in a right to health or health care. In some countries, such a right is embodied in the constitution of the country. In Colombia, for example, the public has been encouraged to file law suits, called tutelas, some of which are aimed at compelling insurance schemes to cover services that should be covered (by law) in the benefit package and some of which aim to expand coverage for the plaintiff to include a service not part of the defined benefit package. Further, all signatories to international treaties that recognize a human right to health are legally bound to recognize that right, and arguably, their courts should play a role in doing so. We might distinguish two roles of the courts. One uncontroversial role would be to insist that the delegated authorities (the ministry of health) specify the criteria and the process used to define the benefit package, and then exercise judicial review of whether specific decisions are made through that process that use those criteria. A more controversial role would be for the courts to try to determine more directly what should be included in a right to health. To perform the latter task, the courts would need to know many things about the capability of the health system to sustainably deliver a particular service in light of competing claims on services, that is on resources. If the courts are not in a position to play that role, then they should restrict their task to making sure that the ministry of health performs that task according to an acceptable process.

We shall conclude by considering how equal must our rights to health or health care be? Specifically, must everyone receive exactly the same kinds of health-care services and coverage, or is fairness in health care compatible with a ‘tiered’ system? Around the world, even countries that offer universal health insurance differ in their answers to this question. In Canada, for example, no supplementary insurance is permitted. Everyone is served solely by the national health-insurance schemes, though people who seek additional services or more rapid service may go elsewhere, as some Canadians do by crossing the border. In Britain, supplementary private insurance allows about 10 per cent of the population to gain quicker access to services for which there is extensive queuing in the public system. Basing a right to health care on an obligation to protect equality of opportunity is compatible with the sort of tiering the British have, but it does not require it, and it imposes some constraints on the kind of tiering allowed.

The primary social obligation is to assure everyone access to a tier of services that effectively promotes normal functioning and thus protects equality of opportunity. Since health care is not the only important good, resources to be invested in the basic tier are appropriately and reasonably limited, for example, by democratic decisions about how much to invest in education or job training as opposed to health care. Because of their very high “opportunity costs,” there will be some beneficial medical services that it will be reasonable not to provide in the basic tier, or to provide only on a limited basis, for example, with queuing. To say that these services have “high opportunity costs” means that providing them consumes resources that would produce greater health benefits and protect opportunity more if used in other ways.

In a society that permits significant income and wealth inequalities, some people will want to buy coverage for these additional services. Why not let them? After all, we allow people to use their after-tax income and wealth as they see fit to pursue the quality of life and opportunities they prefer. The rich can buy special security systems for their homes. They can buy safer cars. They can buy private schooling for their children. Why not allow them to buy supplementary health care for their families?

One objection to allowing a supplementary tier is that its existence might undermine the basic tier either economically or politically. It might attract better-quality providers away from the basic tier, or raise costs in the basic tier, reducing the ability of society to meet its social obligations. The supplementary tier might undermine political support for the basic tier, for example, by undercutting the social solidarity needed if people are to remain committed to protecting opportunity for all. These objections are serious, and where a supplementary tier undermines the basic tier in either way, economically or politically, priority must be given to protecting the basic tier. In principle, however, it seems possible to design a system in which the supplementary tier does not undermine the basic one. If that can be done, then a system that permits tiering avoids restricting liberty in ways that some find seriously objectionable.

A second objection is not to tiering itself but to the structure of inequality that results. Compare two scenarios. In one, most people are adequately served by the basic tier and only the best-off groups in society have the means and see the need to purchase supplementary insurance. That is the case in Great Britain. In the other, the basic tier serves only the poorest groups in society and most other people buy supplementary insurance. The Oregon plan to expand Medicaid eligibility partly through rationing the services it covers has aspects of this structure of inequality, since most people are covered by plans that avoid these restrictions (Daniels, 1991). The first scenario seems preferable to the second on grounds of fairness. In the second, the poorest groups can complain that they are left behind by others in society even in the protection of their health. In the first, the majority has fewer grounds for reasonable resentment or regret.

If the basic tier is not undermined by higher tiers, and if the structure of the inequality that results is not objectionable, then it is difficult to see why some tiering should not be allowed. There is a basic conflict here between concerns about equality and concerns about liberty, between wanting to make sure everyone is treated properly with regard to health care and wanting to give people the liberty to use their resources (after tax) to improve their lives as they see fit. In practice, the crucial constraint on the liberty we allow people seems to depend on the magnitude of the benefit available in the supplementary tier and unavailable in the basic tier. Highly visible forms of saving lives and improving function would be difficult to exclude from the basic tier while we make them available in a supplementary tier. In principle, however, some forms of tiering will not be unfair even when they involve medical benefits not available to everyone.

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