Justice as a Virtue

First published Fri Mar 8, 2002; substantive revision Tue Jul 22, 2014

When we speak of justice as a virtue, we are usually referring to a trait of individuals, even if we conceive the justice of individuals as having some (grounding) reference to social justice. But Rawls and others regard justice as “the first virtue of social institutions” (1971, p. 3), so “justice as a virtue” is actually ambiguous as between individual and social applications. This essay will reflect and explore that ambiguity, though the principal focus will understandably be on the justice of individuals.

However, even the idea of individual justice seems ambiguous in regard to scope. Plato in the Republic treats justice as an overarching virtue of individuals (and of societies), meaning that almost every issue he (or we) would regard as ethical comes in under the notion of justice (dikaosoune). But in modern usages justice covers only part of individual morality, and we don't readily think of someone as unjust if they lie or neglect their children--other epithets more readily spring to mind. What individual justice most naturally refers to are moral issues having to do with goods or property. It is, we say, unjust for someone to steal from people or not to give them what he owes them, and it is also unjust if someone called upon to distribute something good (or bad or both) among members of a group uses an arbitrary or unjustified basis for making the distribution (this last aspect of individual justice obviously has reference to social or at least group justice). Discussion of justice as an individual virtue standardly (at least) centers on questions, therefore, about property and other distributable goods.

1. History

Although the idea of social justice based in a social contract is mentioned in Plato's Republic and was known even earlier, the Republic's conception of individual justice is distinctively virtue ethical. To be sure, Plato understands individual justice on analogy with justice “writ large” in the state, but he views the state, or republic, as a kind of organism or beehive, and the justice of individuals is not thought of as primarily involving conformity to just institutions and laws. Rather, the just individual is someone whose soul is guided by a vision of the Good, someone in whom reason governs passion and ambition through such a vision. When, but only when, this is the case, is the soul harmonious, strong, beautiful, and healthy, and individual justice precisely consists in such a state of the soul. Actions are then just if they sustain or are consonant with such harmony.

Such a conception of individual justice is virtue ethical because it ties justice (acting justly) to an internal state of the person rather than to (adherence to) social norms or to good consequences; but Plato's view is also quite radical because it at least initially leaves it an open question whether the just individual refrains from such socially proscribed actions as lying, killing, and stealing. Plato eventually seeks to show that someone with a healthy, harmonious soul wouldn't lie, kill, or steal, but most commentators consider his argument to that effect to be highly deficient.

Aristotle is generally regarded as a virtue ethicist par excellence, but his account of justice as a virtue is less purely virtue ethical than Plato's because it anchors individual justice in situational factors that are largely external to the just individual. Situations and communities are just, according to Aristotle, when individuals receive benefits according to their merits, or virtue: those most virtuous should receive more of whatever goods society is in a position to distribute (exemptions from various burdens or evils counting as goods). This is what we would today call a desert-based conception of social justice; and Aristotle treats the virtue of individual justice as a matter of being disposed to properly respect and promote just social arrangements. An individual who seeks more than her fair share of various goods has the vice of greediness (pleonexia), and a just individual is one who has rational insight into her own merits in various situations and who habitually (and without having to make heroic efforts to control contrary impulses) takes no more than what she merits, no more than her fair share of good things. Since Aristotle treats all individual virtues as (learned dispositions) lying in a mean between extremes (courage, e. g., is between cowardice and foolhardiness), he also doesn't think it is virtuous to take less than one's fair share of things (though the issue is somewhat complicated for him).

However (and as William Frankena once noted), this account of justice seems circular or ungrounded, because if one's fair share depends on how virtuous one is, the issue of what one's fair share is cannot be decided independently of whether one is being virtuous in actually taking some particular share and the latter issue, in turn, depends for Aristotle on one's being able to know independently what one's fair share is. We have reason to doubt, therefore, whether Aristotle has really given us a determinate conception of justice either as an individual or as a situational virtue.

Both Plato and Aristotle were rationalists as regards both human knowledge and moral reasons, and what they say about the virtue of justice clearly reflects the commitment to rationalism. Much subsequent thinking about justice (especially in the Middle Ages) was influenced by Plato and Aristotle and likewise emphasized the role of reason both in perceiving what is just and in allowing us to act justly rather than give in to contrary impulses or desires. But to the extent Christian writers allied themselves with Plato and Aristotle, they were downplaying another central element in Christian thought and morality, the emphasis on agapic love. Such love seems to be a matter of motivationally active feeling rather than of being rational, and some writers on morality (eventually) allowed this side of Christianity to have a major influence on what they had to say about virtue.

In particular, the “moral sentimentalists” Hutcheson and Hume treated morality as grounded in something other than reason, and the influence of Christian ideas and ideals of agapic love on Hutcheson (at least) is well documented. For Hutcheson, universal (i.e., impartial) benevolence is the highest and best of human motives, but we know this, not through reason, but through a moral sense (or sensitivity). Also, according to Hutcheson, the individual virtue of justice (ultimately) consists in being motivated by universal benevolence, and he explicitly denies that benevolence can ever conflict with true justice.

Hume saw (or believed he saw), however, that individual justice at least sometimes conflicts with what benevolence would motivate us to do. He is as much a sentimentalist as Hutcheson, believing that judgments about virtue and rightness depend on our capacity for sympathy rather than on some form of reason (or on a distinct moral sense) and holding that being virtuous depends on feelings and feelingful motives like benevolence and sympathy rather than on reason. But he thinks that the sentimentalist owes us an account of how a sense of justice that is sometimes opposed to benevolence and sympathy can nonetheless develop out of such motives. Motives like benevolence, curiosity, and prudence Hume calls natural in the twofold sense that they exist apart from social convention(s) and that they do not require explicitly ethical thinking (or conscience) or in order to issue in action. But the virtue of justice is not natural, but rather should be considered “artificial,” according to Hume, because it depends for its existence on human conventions and artifices and because the primary motive to justice is a sense of justice (or of duty).

Now Hume thinks of the individual virtue of justice quite narrowly as comprising a certain kind of respect for (other people's) property. The just person doesn't steal from others and returns what he has borrowed (and Hume points out the similarity of this usage to the Aristotelian notion that justice consists in everyone getting his due, what he merits). But there are other artificial virtues, according to Hume, among them, fidelity to promises (keeping one's promises), law-abidingness, and (female) modesty/chastity. Hume thinks that it is difficult to account for any one, or all, of these artificial virtues in (his own) empiricist anti-rationalist terms, and there are at least two reasons for this.

One has to do with the inadequacy of natural motives like benevolence or prudence for grounding the requirements of justice. In primitive or simple societies, there may always be reasons of prudence to act justly with respect to the property of others: violations of justice are always likely to be detected by others and to lead to consequences one would prefer to avoid. In such circumstances honesty (a term Hume tends to use narrowly as synonymous with “justice”) really is the best policy. Furthermore, within the narrow confines of a small group, personal affection and benevolent concern for those one knows and lives with may lead one to refrain from violations of their property. But in a larger (and more advanced) society, things will be different.

In large-scale modern societies (of the sort Hume lived in) we may not know our neighbors, much less all those people our actions might affect, and the people whose property justice calls on us to respect include a vast majority who don't know us either. Under conditions of such relative anonymity and complexity, the identity of a thief may be much more difficult to ascertain, and if one (knows one) can get away with stealing on some occasions, then prudence is presumably incapable of motivating a just refusal or unwillingness to steal. More importantly, perhaps, the conditions of a modern society leave us without strong ties of affection to many of the people we interact with or may affect by our actions, and Hume thinks that normal humanity or humane benevolence isn't a strong enough motive to get us to refrain from a theft that would greatly benefit ourselves or our families (those we do have strong affections toward). So if we refrain from such theft, we cannot explain or justify such refraining by reference to any actual natural motives.

But of course we do (many of us) justly refrain from taking or violating other people's property on occasions when natural motives as such may seem incapable of explaining why we do, and Hume believes (not uncommonsensically) that it is artificial motives or motivation that explain why we do so. Someone who can get away with stealing and who has stronger reasons/motives of affection to steal than not to steal may nonetheless refrain from stealing because she thinks it unjust or wrong to steal. A sense of duty or conscience is thus for Hume absolutely essential to understanding the virtue and obligation of justice/honesty.

Moreover, and this is perhaps the most important point for Hume, even if human beings were capable of the strong universal/impartial benevolence that Hutcheson regarded as the cornerstone of moral virtue, such benevolence would not in all instances suffice for us to fulfill our intuitive obligations of justice. Justice and moral obligation sometimes seem opposed to the dictates of (what would be motivated by) universal benevolence, and Hume cites one's obligation (of justice) to return what one owes to a “seditious bigot” as one glaring instance of this point. Concern for the good of society or of humanity would presumably dictate that one not return to the bigot money or property he would use to subvert and corrupt society or the state, but, according to Hume, we nonetheless think it obligatory to return what we owe, and what gets us to do so, therefore, is a(n artificial) sense of duty (or justice) rather than any (even hypothetically imaginable) natural motive.

It is possible to question this, and Bentham, for example, claimed that his disagreement with Hume's view of our actual obligations in such cases was what initially led him to utilitarianism. However, the idea that we should return the money or property despite what free-wheeling prudence or benevolence would lead us to do is intuitively forceful, and Hume shows himself aware of the potential clash here between benevolence and justice/morality in a way that Hutcheson was not. Moreover, I am dwelling at some length on Hume in part because the question of whether justice can be understood entirely in terms of natural motives is (as Hume rightly saw) absolutely crucial to understanding the nature of justice as an individual (or, for that matter, social) virtue.

Now if we agree that the right and just thing to do in cases like that of the seditious bigot is to return what one owes, then the importance of artificial motives looms large. But this leaves Hume with a problem (or a set of problems). Hume is an empiricist and an anti-rationalist who emphasizes feeling/sentiment as the basis of morality. But if natural motives can't explain the virtue of justice, then the sentimentalist owes us an account of how a sense of duty, obligation or justice develops. (For the moment, I leave aside the other artificial virtues, which raise similar issues.) Rationalists tend to think of the sense of duty as a response of reason to certain moral facts or relations, so if Hume is to maintain his sentimentalism, he needs (among other things) to explain to us (in terms compatible with his empiricist premises) how a sense of duty develops out of (or can exist as a) feeling or feelingful motivation. And, as is well known, Hume finds this extremely difficult to do.

Hume seeks to explain moral judgment and a sense of duty or conscientiousness based in such judgment in terms of the same mechanisms of sympathy that operate within and through the natural virtues. However, we tend to be more sympathetic with those near and dear to us, and moral judgment seeks or presupposes some sort of impartiality regarding those affected by or engaging in actions (it is no more wrong for someone to kill a member of my family than for someone to kill someone I don't know). So Hume argues that we in various ways (try to) correct for personal (or temporal) bias when making moral judgments and take, in particular, the view of a sympathetic but impartial spectator in doing so. But this still can't explain why we should in all conscience and justice return what we owe to the seditious bigot--here the most extensive and impartial sympathy would seem to dictate acting for the greatest happiness rather than justly in Hume's terms. (The utilitarian typically regards acting for the greatest happiness as the essence of true justice, but the point remains that we intuitively regard justice as conflicting with the dictates of utilitarianism in the kind of case just mentioned.)

Hume goes through a number of (what seem to me and many others to be) contortions in an effort to explain the possibility of (anti-benevolent) conscientiousness and justice (or promise keeping, etc.). At times, he seems to think parents or educators can influence (or even psychologically force) children to disapprove of injustice (even when it promotes the general happiness). But this presupposes, I believe, that the parents and educators already themselves have acquired such a strict sense of conscientiousness, whereas it is not clear in the first place that or how Hume's theory allows this to happen. And it is also not clear how such disapproval, either in the children or in the parents/educators, can be inculcated via the mechanisms of sympathy (or immediate agreeability) that Hume says are required for moral approval and judgment.

Matters get even more problematic for Hume's theory of justice and the other artificial virtues because Hume makes it clear that he is (what we would call) a virtue ethicist. He says that the moral status of an action depends entirely on the goodness or badness of the motive that lies behind it, so that, e. g., it is only because certain helpful actions were intended to be helpful (were motivated by the natural virtue of benevolence) that we morally approve of them or judge them to be right and good. However, it is difficult to apply this virtue-ethical assumption to the artificial virtues, because the good motive operative in their instance is the conscientious desire to do one's duty or what is right or obligatory. According to Hume, if I return what I owe to the seditious bigot, my only just motive is the desire to do what is right and obligatory, but, in that case, the morally good motive that is supposed (according to Hume's virtue ethics) to explain the rightness or goodness of returning what I owe to the seditious bigot already makes essential reference to the rightness or goodness or obligatoriness of doing so. As Hume himself tells us, this seems to be arguing (explaining) in a circle, and Hume makes the same point (perhaps even more forcefully) about fidelity to promises. Although some subsequent commentators think Hume has a way out of this circle, many have not thought this to be possible (I tend to agree with them), and if that is so, then Hume's attempt to justify or explain justice as an individual virtue via empiricist sentimentalist (associationist) mechanisms cannot succeed.

2. Rationalism and Justice

Such a conclusion has led many subsequent ethical thinkers to think that justice cannot be based in sentiment but requires a more intellectually constructive rational(ist) basis, and in recent times this view of the matter seems to have been held, most influentially, by John Rawls in A Theory of Justice. Rawls makes clear his belief in the inadequacy of benevolence or sympathetic human sentiment in formulating an adequate conception of social justice. (He says in particular that sentiment leaves unanswered or indeterminate various important issues of justice that a good theory of justice ought to be able to resolve).

Rawls's positive view of justice is concerned primarily with the justice of institutions or (what he calls) the “basic structure” of society: justice as an individual virtue is derivative from justice as a social virtue defined via certain principles of justice. The principles, famously, are derived from an “original position” in which (very roughly) rational contractors under a “veil of ignorance” decide how they wish to commit themselves to being governed in their actual lives. Rawls deliberately invokes Kantian rationalism (or anti-sentimentalism) in explaining the intellectual or theoretical motivation behind his construction, and the two principles of justice that he argues would be agreed upon under the contractual conditions he specifies represent a kind of egalitarian political liberalism. Roughly, those principles stress (equality of) basic liberties and opportunities for self-advancement over considerations of social welfare, and the distribution of goods in society (according to the the so-called difference principle) is then supposed to work to the advantage of all (especially the worst-off members of society). Rawls argues that a utilitarian principle of justice dictating simply the maximization of overall social well-being would not be accepted in his original position and is accordingly less plausible than the conception of justice embodied in his own two principles and the construction that leads to them. He also says that the idea of what people distributively deserve or merit is derivative from social justice rather (as with Aristotle and/or much common-sense thinking) providing the basis for thinking about social justice.

However, it is not merely social justice that Rawls understands in (predominantly) rationalist fashion. When he explains how individuals (within a just society) develop a sense and/or the virtue of justice, he invokes the work of Piaget, who saw moral development as akin to the other sorts of development he so famously studied. Those other sorts were of course various forms of cognitive or intellectual development, and Piaget treats moral development, therefore, as principally involving increasing cognitive sophistication. More particularly, Piaget sees that sophistication as a matter of taking more and more general or universal views of moral issues, and the Kantian and rationalist idea that morality rests on and can be justified in terms of considerations of universality (if it is right for me, it is right for everyone similarly situated) or universalizability (could I will this to be a rule governing everyone's actions?) seems to underlie or to be presupposed in much that Piaget says about moral development.

Now Rawls lays more stress than Piaget does on the role our affective nature (sympathy and the desire for self-mastery) plays in the acquisition of moral virtue. But, like Piaget, he stresses the need for a sufficiently general appreciation and rational understanding of social relations as the grounding basis of a sense of duty or of justice and he explicitly classifies his account of moral development as falling within the “rationalist tradition.” Rawls also gives distinct arguments for believing that it is rational to retain and act upon a sense of justice.

According to Rawls, individual justice is theoretically derivative from social justice because the just individual is to be understood as someone with an effective or “regulative” desire to comply with the principles of justice. This is very close to the Kantian view of justice as an individual virtue, and it also makes that virtue an artificial one in Hume's sense. But, in part because he (like Kant) doesn't assume virtue ethics, Rawls doesn't get caught up in the Humean circle we described above. Other questions about Rawls's (or any) rationalist account of the virtue of justice, however, can lead us back in the direction of a non-circular and non-Humean form of sentimentalism about that virtue.

3. Stages of Moral Development

Rawls is far from the only thinker to conceive of moral development in terms substantially derived from Jean Piaget's work, and at the time Rawls was writing A Theory of Justice, educational psychologist Lawrence Kohlberg was working out a Piaget-inspired conception of moral development that postulated six stages of human moral development. Kohlberg claimed that the highest stage of such development involves a concern for justice and human rights based on universal principles, and he relegated sheer concern for relationships and for individual human well-being to lower stages of the process. Moreover, he saw the ordering of the different stages in Piagetian fashion as basically reflecting differences in rational understanding: those whose moral thinking involved the invoking of universal principles of justice and rights were said to show a more advanced cognitive development than those whose moral thought appeals primarily to the importance of relationships and of human well-being or suffering.

This treats utiltarianism as less cognitively advanced (more primitive) than rationalist views like Rawls's and Kant's, and utilitarians (like Hare) have naturally called into question the objectivity and intellectual fairness of Kohlberg's account. (In fact, Rawls also questions whether any purely psychological theory of moral development could ever undercut utilitarianism in the way Kohlberg sought to do.) More significantly, perhaps, the evidence for Kohlberg's stage sequence was drawn from studies of boys, and when one applies the sequence to the study of young girls, it turns out that girls on average end up at a less advanced stage of moral development than boys do.

What came next is well known. In her 1982 book In a Different Voice: Psychological Theory and Women's Development, Carol Gilligan responded to Kohlberg's views by questioning whether a theory of moral development based solely on a sample of males could reasonably be used to draw conclusions about the inferior moral development of women. Gilligan argued that her own studies of women's development indicated that the moral development of girls and women proceeds and ends in a different fashion from that of boys and men, but that that proves nothing about inferiority or superiority: it is merely a fact of difference. In particular, Gilligan claimed that women tend to think morally in terms of connection to others (relationships) and in terms of caring about (responsibility for) those with whom they are connected; men, by contrast and in line with Kohlberg's studies, tend to think more in terms of general principles of justice and of individual rights against (or individual autonomy from) other people.

4. Caring and Justice

Subsequently, many have questioned the empirical validity or accuracy of the studies Gilligan relied upon, but others have pointed out that the idea of a “different voice” need not be tied to specific assumptions about differences between the sexes. The voice of justice and principle represents a different style of moral thinking (and of an overall moral life) from that of caring for and connection with others, and later writers (notably Nel Noddings, but also Gilligan herself in later work) have tried to elaborate what a morality (moral life) based in caring would be like and also to show that such a morality may be superior to that embodied in traditional thinking about justice and rights and universal(izable) moral principles.

The primary fulcrum for articulation of any ethic of care or caring seems to lie in an ideal that stresses connection over separateness. The Kantian emphasis on the autonomy of the moral person and the Rawlsian/contractarian assumption of separate individuals coming together to forge a social contract see us a basically separate from others, whereas an ideal of caring concern for others sees our (initial) actual historical and personal connections with others as the basis for a positive and caring response to such connection. (However, an ethic of caring doesn't favor social conservatism in the way much communitarian thought does: any social structure that shows insufficient concern for one group or another can arguably be criticized via the ideal of mutual caring.)

In addition, an ethic of justice and rights tells us to regulate our actions or lives in accordance with certain general moral principles (or explicitly moral insights), whereas the ethic of care stresses the good of a concern for the welfare of others that is unmediated by principles, rules, or judgments that tell us that we ought to be concerned about their welfare. In an ethic of care, therefore, caring is treated as a natural virtue in Hume's sense, but this further highlights the way in which such an ethic involves us in connection with, rather than separateness from, other people. If we are concerned about others on the basis of a conscientious desire to do our duty or adhere to certain moral principles, then our concern for them is mediated by moral thinking, and someone, therefore, who cares about the welfare of others without having to rely on or be guided by explicit moral principles (or thinking) is more connected with those others than someone who acts only on the basis of such mediating principles (or thought). So the ethic of care or caring stresses connection with others both in what it says about the normative basis of morality and in what it says about the ways in which moral goodness shows itself within a morally good life; and by the same token, traditional Kantian or contractarian views of rights and justice give a double importance to separateness or autonomy from others through the grounds they adduce for moral/political obligation and the stress they place on being guided by moral principles or judgments within the moral life.

As I indicated above, defenders of an ethic of care or caring have increasingly come to view caring as grounding (offering a normative basis for) morality as a whole. That means that ideas about justice and rights either have no validity or can actually be reinterpreted and given an arguably firmer justification in terms of (what we originally regarded as the opposed notion of) caring. But it is difficult to believe that morality can properly or plausibly be confined to intimate relations of caring. For better or worse, we have to learn to live together in larger social units, and we cannot be intimate or even acquainted with every human being whose actions and fate are morally significant for us. So an ethic of caring that seeks to account for individual and social morality generally needs to say something in its own voice about social and international justice and about how given individuals can realize the virtue of justice.

In answer to this more or less explicit challenge, some care ethicists have highlighted potential analogies between the way a mother cares for her children and the kinds of care a government, state, or society can offer to its citizens or inhabitants (who presumably cannot provide everything they need and want on their own). Others have noted that the notion of caring doesn't have to be restricted to close personal relationships and that one can intuitively speak of caring, in humanitarian fashion, about people one doesn't know (except by description). This then allows there to be obligations of caring both toward near and dear and toward humanity more generally, though the issue of how to balance these concerns becomes very important at that point.

But all these ways of developing and extending an ethic of care seem united in stressing (what Hume calls) natural motives over artificial ones. If someone who doesn't care about his family or about human beings in general, always fails to act helpfully toward others, he exhibits a lack of caring, and an ethic of care regards acts which display such morally deficient motivation as morally criticizable and wrong. This is virtue ethical because, as with Hume, the criterion of the rightness of an action has to do with the inner state or motive that lies behind it. But by the same token individuals who demonstrate the virtue of caring act in ways that show how much they care or are concerned about others, in ways that demonstrate their emotional connectedness with others, and this means in particular that such people don't have to remind themselves of moral ideals and obligations in order to get themselves to help those they care about. They help because they care, not because conscience or some sort of (abstract) love of the Good tells them (how virtuous or dutiful it would be) to do so.

But is this sort of natural virtue really adequate to those moral/political concerns that transcend intimate personal relationships? Hume didn't think so, and it is certainly not obvious on the face of it how an ethic of caring could handle such issues. Still, Hume makes things difficult for natural virtue by conceiving individual and social justice in highly conservative terms. According to Hume we have a strict obligation of justice to allow people to keep (most of) what they have earned through their own diligence and ingenuity rather than (say) tax it away (or, presumably, force unionization on factory owners). And since (given facts about diminishing marginal utility that Hume himself assumes to be familar to us) progressive taxation and the closed union shop arguably are on the whole good for society and known to be so, the natural motive of benevolent concern for the welfare of one's society might actually lead in the direction of genuine social justice. But such justice would then have to be conceived in less austerely rigid and more humane terms than those assumed and relied on by Hume.

However, when it comes to the individual virtue of justice, Hume himself supplies some of the means toward a (virtue-ethical) account relying solely on natural virtue (and thus not subject to “Hume's circle”). He points out that it is easier to bear not having (or being given) something than to bear having something taken away from one (thus anticipating what later psychologists have said about “adaptation levels”). And this in and of itself gives someone who is benevolent or caring about the well-being of others some reason (or motive) not to steal or allow stealing from others. However, there is also the fact that stealing (as opposed to merely allowing a theft to occur) is a positive commission, and a natural virtues approach to individual justice (vis-a-vis property) would certainly be helped along, if the distinction, say, between commission and omission, or between doing and allowing, could somehow be captured in non-artificial or natural sentimentalist terms.

This seems a tall order, and in fact the suspicion or belief that only rationalism can account for such distinctions (as, e. g., in Kant's “formula of humanity”) may represent one of the largest challenges a sentimentalist ethic of caring needs to face. (Hume doesn't focus on the commission/omission distinction, although, in any event, his artificial virtues approach to the remaining aspects of deontology may at this point seem a dead end.) My own belief is that sentimentalism is up to this challenge because of the way caring about and for others is grounded in naturally developing human empathy.

Normal human caring isn't impartial (in the manner of “universal benevolence”), because it is easier to empathize with those near and dear to us, i. e., those with whom we share thoughts, lives, roots, or familial (or ethnic or national) traditions. But recent psychological studies of empathy and its relation to altruism indicate that we also tend to empathize more with those whose problems are immediate for us. We respond more to a child drowning right before our eyes than to the plight of a child we don't see and whom we know (only by description) to be in danger of dying of starvation in some distant country; and, similarly, we respond more to the “clear and present” danger faced by miners we hear are trapped underground than to dangers we know will arise in some indefinite future.

But if such perceptual and temporal immediacy make such differences (respectively) to empathic concern for others, it is arguable that causal immediacy does as well. The harm I could cause is more immediate for me than harm that I might merely allow to occur. We naturally flinch from (inflicting) the former more than from (allowing) the latter, and I say “naturally” because, as with cases involving perceptual or temporal immediacy, this is not a matter of being guided by moral principles or strictures, but of responsiveness to non-moral situational differences. If we are in this way more sensitive and responsive to differences in the strength of our potential causal relation to some harm or evil, then a moral sentimentalism that restricts itself to natural virtues may possess the resources to distinguish between commission and omission, and it may be able to use that distinction (among other things) to explain why stealing, promise-breaking, and killing are worse than allowing others to do these things. This might well then allow such an approach to account for the virtue of individual justice more successfully than Hume's theory of artificial virtues can.

5. Conclusion

In any event, there are many different conceptions of the virtue of justice, and only some of them are distinctively virtue ethical. Many non-virtual ethical approaches put forward theories of virtue, and what distinguishes them from virtue ethics is that the given theory of virtue comes later in the order of explanation, rather than itself serving as the basis for understanding (all of) morality. Rawls's conception of justice as an individual virtue is a good example of a non-virtue-ethical account of a virtue, since, as we saw, it treats individual justice as a matter of accepting and complying with independently defended moral/political principles or rules. But precisely because of the way Rawls's account of individual justice rests on the validity of his principles of justice, his whole theory may be vulnerable if it can be shown that his liberal principles of justice lead to morally implausible or offensive normative results. And there is some reason to think they do: not the familiar reasons stemming from communitarianism, libertarianism, and utilitarianism, but reasons deriving from care ethics. Rawls treats issues of liberty as strictly prior to issues of social welfare, and this means his form of liberalism seems to side with traditional legal views about when a magistrate should issue a restraining order against a spouse or boyfriend who has threatened his partner. Traditionally, magistrates have been reluctant to issue restraining orders on the sheer say-so of a spouse who claims to have been threatened or beaten – it has been traditional to require some kind of legal procedure to determine the validity of such claims, and that is the problem. Often, the spouse who has been threatened is actually attacked or further harmed before the legal procedure has had time to take place. Care ethics says that this is an injustice. Probable or potential harm to women is more morally important than a spouse or boyfriend's total liberty of movement, but Rawlsian liberalism has no obvious way to come to this "enlightened" conclusion because it gives individual liberty priority over considerations of welfare. There are other cases too where Rawls's principles and liberalism more generally seem to yield implausible normative conclusions about what is just. And that gives us some reason to question such views and look to care ethics for a possibly more adequate conception of what justice, both in society and in individuals, actually requires. I have tried above to offer a representative sampling of the variety of possible views about justice as a virtue, but if we have learned anything from the history of philosophy, we ought to recognize that there are probably other ways of conceiving the virtue of justice we haven't yet thought of.

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  • Noddings, Nel, 1984, Caring: a Feminine Approach to Ethics and Moral Education, Berkeley: University of California Press.
  • O'Neill, Onora, 1996, Towards Justice and Virtue: A Constructive Account of Practical Reasoning, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Plato, Republic, translated and with intro by R.E. Allen, New Haven: Yale University Press, 2006.
  • Rawls, John, 1971, A Theory of Justice, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Robert, Roberts C., 2010, “Justice as an Emotion Disposition”, Emotion Review, 2(1): 36–43.
  • Schmidtz, D., and J. Thrasher, 2014, “The Virtues of Justice”, in K. Timpe, C. Boyd (eds.), Virtues and Their Vices, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Wiggins, David, 2004, “Neo-Aristotelian Reflections on Justice,” Mind, 113(451): 477–512.

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Michael Slote

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