The humanist and classical scholar Justus Lipsius (Joost Lips) (1547–1606), described by his admiring correspondent Michel de Montaigne as one of the most learned men of his day (Essays II.12), was the founding father of Neostoicism, a key component of European thought in the late sixteenth and seventeenth centuries.
His famous and widely read Stoic dialogue De constantia was an attempt to combine Stoicism and Christianity, producing a new philosophy that would help individuals to live through the difficult period of the religious wars and establishing constancy as the most important of the virtues.
Lipsius's lifelong project was to transform contemporary moral philosophy through a new reading of the Roman Stoic philosopher Seneca, while also revitalizing contemporary political practice by drawing on the insights provided by the Roman historian Tacitus. Before publishing his major edition of Seneca’s philosophical writings in the year before his death, he wrote two theoretical treatises on Stoicism, which provided the philosophical foundation for a new interpretation of Seneca and a new understanding of Stoic doctrines.
Lipsius's changes of religious allegiance, which distressed contemporary scholars and made him the target of relentless criticism, have been a crucial factor in determining his reputation up to the present day. To understand his motives and his philosophical achievements, we must examine the biographical facts.
Born a Catholic on 18 October 1547 in Overijse, a small town between Brussels and Louvain, Lipsius first studied in Brussels (primary school, Kapelleschool; 1553–1557) and Ath (Latin School, 1557–1559). He then pursued his studies with the Jesuits in Cologne (at the Bursa Nova Tricoronata, 1559–1564), returning to Louvain where he matriculated at the university on 14 August 1564. There he studied law, while also attending courses by Cornelius Valerius, professor of Latin, at the Collegium Trilingue, a humanist institution of Erasmian inspiration; among his fellow students were Ludovicus Carrio, Janus Dousa, Martin-Antonio Del Río, Andreas Schott. Lipsius was already engaged in the emendation and critical examination of Latin texts, especially of Cicero, Propertius and Varro; and, as early as 1566, he put together three books of Variae lectiones (“Variant Readings”), which were published in 1569 at Antwerp. He embarked on an extended academic journey to Italy, ending in Rome, where he became private secretary to Cardinal Granvelle, to whom he had dedicated his Variae lectiones, and where he made the acquaintance of leading humanists such as Marc-Antoine Muret, Fulvio Orsini, Paolo Manuzio and Guglielmo Sirleto.
After his journey to Rome, where he was able to examine ancient monuments and consult unique manuscripts in the Vatican Library and other well-stocked private libraries (1568-1570), he returned to Louvain to continue his legal studies. Fleeing the political and religious conflict in the Low Countries, Lipsius went to visit his friend Carolus Langius (Charles de Langhe) in Liège (1571) — Langius would become Lipsius's master of Roman Stoic philosophy in the dialogue De constantia.
In the spring of 1572, Lipsius moved to Vienna where he was introduced to the humanist circle at Maximilian’s court, which included Ogerius Busbequius, Joannes Sambucus and Stephanus Pighius. In October Lipsius obtained the chair of history at the Lutheran University of Jena. He also completed his edition of Tacitus, which he dedicated to Emperor Maximilian II and in which the Annals were distinguished from the Histories for the first time. He left Jena briefly in 1573 to marry Anna van den Calstere in Cologne and then for good in 1574, when he returned to the Low Countries.
After a sojourn in Overijse and Louvain, he was invited to the Calvinist University of Leiden by Janus Dousa in September 1577. He referred to his Leiden period (from 1578 to 1591) the most productive of his scholarly life. Among the numerous writings he published during these years the most important were De constantia and the Politica.
Due to the bitter controversies arising from the publication of the Politica, Lipsius decided to return to the Catholic Southern Low Countries, settling first in Spa and then Liège (1591–1592). Having re-embraced the Catholic faith of his youth, he moved in August 1592 to Louvain, where he accepted the chair of history at the university and the chair of Latin at the Collegium Trilingue. In this final period of his life he prepared his edition of Seneca and his treatises on Stoic doctrines and physics. He also continued to write on classical scholarship and political philosophy, publishing antiquarian treatises on the cross (De cruce, 1593), the Roman army (De militia Romana libri quinque, 1595), Roman fortifications and armaments (Poliorceticon sive de machinis, tormentis, telis libri quinque, 1596), the grandeur of Rome (Admiranda sive de magnitudine Romana libri quatuor, 1598), ancient libraries (De bibliothecis syntagma, 1602), the Roman goddess Vesta and the Vestal virgins (De Vesta et Vestalibus syntagma, 1605), as well as Monita et exempla politica (“Political Advice and Examples,” 1605), an extended historical-philosophical “mirror of princes,” intended as a sequel to his Politica. In addition, Lipsius, appointed Royal Historiographer in 1595, was asked to write devotional tracts in honor of the Holy Virgin of Halle and Scherpenheuvel, thus supporting the religious and political agenda of the Archdukes Albert and Isabella: the Diva Virgo Hallensis: Beneficia eius et miracula fide atque ordine descripta (1604) and Diva Sichemiensis sive Aspricollis, nova eius beneficia & admiranda (1605).
Lipsius saw to the publication of his own letters, bringing out three collections or Centuriae (since each contained 100 epistles), in his lifetime, the first of which appeared in Leiden in 1586. He prepared another Centuria for posthumous publication by his executor Joannes Woverius, who, together with his fellow-executors, added a fifth Centuria postuma. From this vast correspondence, it is apparent that Lipsius was a central figure in the Republic of Letters of his day, renowned for his philological skills, his historical knowledge and his search for a new type of humanitas (civilized and humane conduct) suited to the troubled times in which he lived. The inventory of Lipsius's letters includes more than 4,300 items and 700 correspondents, among them not only Montaigne, but also such distinguished scholars as Isaac Casaubon, Henri Estienne, Joseph Scaliger, Sir Philip Sidney, Paolo Manuzio, Fulvio Orsini, Joannes Sambucus, Joachim Camerarius, Benito Arias Montano, Francisco de Quevedo, Abraham Ortelius, Hugo Grotius, and Philip Rubens, brother of the artist Peter Paul, who immortalized Lipsius in his painting The Four Philosophers (now in the Palazzo Pitti in Florence). Most of the letters reflect Lipsius's friendships, thoughts, feelings, teachings and attempts at self-presentation. Yet his letter collections were also meant as an extension of his humanist scholarship and his Neostoic intellectual program.
According to his Catholic biographers, Lipsius died in Louvain “a devout Catholic” during the night of 23 to 24 March 1606. They recount that he asked his wife to present his fur-trimmed robe to the statue of the Sedes Sapientiae in the church of St Peter at Louvain and that, surrounded by three Jesuits, he displayed “the constancy of Christian strength” (Christiani roboris constantia): when encouraged to think of the consolations of Stoicism, he replied: “those things were vain … this [pointing to a crucifix] is true endurance” (illa sunt vana … haec est vera patientia). Lipsius's return to the Counter-Reformation Catholic Church in 1591 had prepared the way for this symbolic and propagandistic use of his scholarly genius and image.
The young Lipsius began his philological study of Seneca, like that of Tacitus, during his stay in Rome in 1569. It was Marc-Antoine Muret who first stimulated his interest in Seneca and Roman Stoicism, giving rise to a life-long obsession which would alternate between philology and philosophy. Lipsius's philosophical interest in Roman Stoicism led to the publication of his highly successful Senecan dialogue, set in the midst of the violent religious and political struggles of the Netherlands, De constantia in publicis malis (“On Constancy in Times of Public Calamity”, 1583/4). This was his earliest attempt to combine Stoicism and Christianity in order to create a new philosophy which would help individuals to live through the difficult period of civil and religious wars which were tearing Northern Europe apart.
A closer look at Lipsius's first Neostoic work reveals that De constantia was the manifesto of a humanist who was convinced that he had found in Seneca’s philosophy both a consolation and a solution to the public calamities which he and his contemporaries were enduring. From Seneca’s De vita beata (15.8), Lipsius takes the leitmotif: “we are born into a kingdom where obedience to God is true liberty” (De constantia I.14). After defining God, providence and fate, he comes to necessity (necessitas), the logical conclusion of their co-operation: everything which is governed by fate happens by necessity (De constantia I.19). The most obvious example of this natural necessity is the decay and destruction of all temporal things (De constantia I.15–16).
While consoling his readers, Lipsius does not deny the hubris of power, the atrocities of history or the cruelty of tyrants and emperors. Yet he tries to encourage his readers to adopt an attitude of constancy by listing a long series of divinae clades (divinely sanctioned disasters): horrifying examples from history meant to illustrate the utility of divine punishment and to demonstrate that evils such as earthquakes, pestilence, war and tyranny are part and parcel of the human condition — indeed, of God’s plan for the preservation and improvement of the whole world. Moreover, he argues, the evils of the present time are neither particularly grave nor worse than those which existed in the past: “Just as work becomes easier if shared by more people, so too does sorrow” (De constantia II.26).
The truly wise man is therefore expected to accept the law of necessity (lex necessitatis) with steadfastness and mental fortitude While realizing “that man is but a dream of a shadow,” he should show disdain for the course of human events by cultivating constantia: “the upright and immovable mental strength, which is neither lifted up nor depressed by external or accidental circumstances” (De constantia I.4). The mother of this constancy is patience, which is governed by reason. Reason (ratio) — as opposed to false opinions — is nothing other than a true judgment concerning things both human and divine. It is this internal transformation — based on the essential Stoic attributes of reason, freedom from the emotions, patience in adversity and subjection to God’s will — which makes it possible to live contentedly amid the inevitable decay and turmoil of the world.
So, “enveloped by the mist and clouds of opinion” (De constantia I.2), we must never stop attempting to conquer our passions and emotions (adfectus) — desire, joy, fear and pain (cupiditas, gaudium, metus and dolor) — and our false opinions by means of reason. Not only do emotions disturb the equilibrium of the soul and impede constancy, they are false and dangerous, since they can upset the detachment needed by the wise man(sapiens). Consequently, it is necessary “to steel our mind and so temper it that we may achieve peace in the midst of turmoil and tranquility in the midst of conflict” (De constantia I.1). If reason, the lawful ruler of our mind, can conquer our passions and false opinions, we will be able to face public and private evil with true constancy. Due to three emotions, however —simulatio or deception, pietas or patriotism, and miseratio or pity for misfortunes of others — we all carry war around within ourselves. Even worse, what appears to us to be a virtue is actually a vice, for thinking that we suffer on account of the sufferings of our country causes us to grieve for our self and our property, while pity for the sufferings of others is unworthy of a wise man. We must therefore obey the Stoic injunction to extirpate all these harmful emotions.
The dialogue between Lipsius and his old friend Langius — cast in the role of the Stoic sapiens who had achieved mastery over his emotions by reason — was clearly intended to provide readers with something simpler than contemporary philosophy, which Lipsius criticized for its excessive subtlety, and to establish constancy as the chief virtue. Lipsius's De constantia thus has a different focus from the Senecan treatise De constantia sapientis (“On the Constancy of the Wise Man”), on which it was ostensibly modeled; for in chapters 1–12 of Book I Lipsius puts forward the virtue of constancy as a remedy for the turmoil of the times and urges readers to detach themselves completely from all feelings which might lead to any sort of emotional involvement in the political and religious wars which were raging around them.
Nevertheless, he did not counsel withdrawal from public affairs and retreat into private life. Stoics and Christians were cosmopolitans, whose “true native land was the heavens.” They “should be good citizens in order to be good men” (De constantia 1.12) and, as such, yield to God’s plan for mankind and to the immutable power of providence.
The result of Lipsius's repackaging of Stoic apatheia (emotionlessness) as an appropriate antidote to the religious and political passions of his day and of his transformation of Stoic fate into Christian divine providence (by subordinating fate to God instead of vice versa) was that his brand of Neostoicism became as suitable for Christians as the Aristotelianism of Thomas Aquinas and the Platonism of Marsilio Ficino.
Although De constantia was not Lipsius's most systematic or theoretical treatment of Stoic ethics, but rather a book of practical psychology, a manual for wise living, it acquired a leading position in European thought. Going through more than eighty editions between the sixteenth and the eighteenth centuries, over forty in the original Latin and the rest in translations into a wide range of modern European languages, the treatise, which embodied elements of militant Calvinism together with arguments on free will used by the Jesuits, became common cultural property during the Baroque period, influencing scholarship, poetry and art up to the Enlightenment.
Lipsius's Politicorum sive Civilis doctrinae libri sex (“Six Books on Politics or Civil Doctrine”, 1589), dedicated to Count Maurice of Nassau, can be considered a sequel to De constantia: “just as in On Constancy we instructed citizens how to endure and obey, so here [we instruct] those who rule how to govern,” Lipsius stated in “The Letter to the Reader.” In the same way that the citizen had to follow reason (ratio), the ruler had to apply reason and political virtue to government, but first of all to his own life, since if “he desires to subject all things to himself, he should subject himself to reason first.”
Drawing on a wide range of classical sources, above all Tacitus, Lipsius's subject in the treatise was specifically how to rule principalities. While political thinkers such as Plato, Aristotle and many others had already written on this topic, they had dealt with it more generally, not in relation to principalities. The one important exception was Machiavelli, who “led his prince along the right way to the temple of virtue and honor,” but “while pursuing the path of utility, he wandered from the royal road.” The humanist Lipsius intended to be practical but to avoid any concrete and contemporary applications of the general principles he set out.
Lipsius constructed his book from quotations of ancient writers — in itself a humanist tour de force, enabling him to show off his vast knowledge of classical literature. Montaigne described it as “a learned and carefully woven fabric.” Yet, although the treatise has been characterized as not much more than a compendium of quotations, Lipsius himself emphasized that the Politica was not a mere compilation. Since he had imposed order on the quotations, he expressed his own thought, following the strict rules of Ramist logic, through the authority of the ancients. Moreover, in addition to classical writers, Lipsius drew on medieval and Renaissance political philosophers, including Thomas Aquinas, the Spanish scholastics, Jean Bodin and Niccolò Machiavelli.
The Politica, divided into six books, was concerned with the construction of civil life and the state in an ethical context. The first book was devoted to an analysis of two necessary conditions: virtue (virtus), which requires piety and goodness; and prudence (prudentia) which is dependent on use and historical memory. The second book deals with the virtues of the prince as well as the purpose of government and its various forms. Civil concord, a central issue for Lipsius, requires everyone to submit to the will of the prince, who himself must have both virtue and prudence in order to achieve this concord. In the third book Lipsius, in line with medieval and humanist mirrors of princes, focused on the distinctive virtue of the prince: political prudence (prudentia civilis), for which he depends both on himself and the advice of others (officials, councilors, military commanders). A prudent prince must be surrounded by prudent advisors. In the fourth and by far the longest book, the prince’s own prudence (both civil and military), which must be carefully developed in the light of experience, is discussed. Two types of civil prudence — the first concerned with divine matters and the second with human affairs — are set out in the rest of Book IV. Lipsius's controversial chapters on the difficult relationship of the state to the church and on religious toleration — in his view, peace and unity could only be achieved if just one religion was allowed in any particular political community — provoked sharp attacks both from Protestants, especially Dirk Volckertsz. Coornhert, and from the Roman Inquisition, which in 1590 placed the Politica on the Index of Prohibited Books. According to Lipsius, the prince should not intervene in the internal affairs of the church, much less meddle with doctrinal issues: he had no “rights in sacred matters” (ius in sacra; Politica, IV.2). It was, however, his right and, indeed, duty to secure the unity of the church, since religious discord inevitably led to civil disruption and war. Those religious dissidents who were responsible for the strife that was tearing Europe apart deserved no mercy: “Burn, cut — for the whole body [of the state] is of greater value than some of its limbs” (Lipsius took this provocative medical metaphor from Cicero). On the other hand, dissidents who practiced their faith quietly and peacefully were to be treated with toleration. In Books V and VI of the Politica, which dealt with military prudence, Lipsius explored issues concerning defense, the just war (bellum iustum), discipline and civil conflicts.
Lipsius's Politica, written in the heated atmosphere of civil wars and radical attempts at religious reform, can be seen as an attempt to produce a synthesis between the traditional mirror of princes, a popular genre among humanists, and Machiavelli’s Prince. Lipsius was a self-proclaimed supporter of monarchy and a moderate form of absolutism, at least when based on Stoic virtues. The way to prevent a monarch from abusing his power was not to threaten him with revolt or tyrannicide, but rather to educate him thoroughly in Stoic ethics. Lipsius's ideal monarchy was not based on amoral despotism or Machiavellian power. Its foundation was instead Neostoic moral philosophy, whose precepts and doctrines would ensure that unruly emotions were governed by reason.
Lipsius's own traumatic experiences in the bloody civil wars of his day surely explain, at least in part, his obsessive concern for unity in both state and religion, the secular authority (auctoritas) of the prince and the disciplined obedience of the citizenry. Decades before Thomas Hobbes, Lipsius placed order and peace, which alone could guarantee political stability, far above civil liberties and personal freedom. That is why Lipsius, writing in Calvinist Leiden, argued in favor of a more powerful central authority in order to control revolutionary forces in an efficient way. The prince’s authority must be as strong as possible, reinforcing his subjects’ opinion of him. He has at his disposal three instruments of power (praecipua vis imperii) to achieve this: his commands, his actual power (depending on wealth, army, advisors, alliances and God’s will) and, finally, his moral standards. Voluntary obedience and common consent, together with the peace and unity which they produce, are secured by the efficient operation of these three instruments (Politica IV.9).
Although the claim that Lipsius's Politica “launched the anti-Machiavellian tradition of the Counter-Reformation” (Birely, 99) is no doubt exaggerated, it is certainly true that the treatise found a wide audience and met with immense success. More than Jean Bodin in his Six Books of the Republic (1576) or Johannes Althusius in his Politics Methodically Set Forth (1603), Lipsius dealt with the issues which genuinely agitated his contemporaries. Even before the Politica came off the presses in Leiden, Lipsius was preparing himself for the criticism which he expected to encounter. In a second edition, which appeared in 1590, he included some Breves notae (“Brief Notes”) on the first three books; and a year later he published Liber de una religione (“Book on One Religion”), written in response to Coornhert’s objections to his views on toleration. After returning to the Catholic Southern Low Countries, Lipsius rewrote the Politica. This “Catholic” version, published in Antwerp in 1596 and supplied with additional notes, was an attempt to meet the criticisms of the Roman Church. Although both versions circulated throughout Europe, crossing confessional boundaries, the Politica was most enthusiastically received in France, Germany and Spain. During the reign of Henri IV alone, the Politica was published ten times in French translation. The treatise exerted a notable influence on Pierre Charron, author of De la sagesse (On Wisdom, 1601), Cardinal Richelieu, Duke Maximilian of Bavaria and the Count-Duke Olivares, among many others.
Lipsius's De constantia whetted the appetite of his contemporaries for further works on ancient moral philosophy. As Montaigne, one of its admiring readers, wrote:
How I wish that, during my lifetime, someone like Justus Lipsius (the most learned man left, a polished and judicious mind …), had the health, the will and sufficient leisure to compile an honest and careful account which listed by class and by category everything we can find out about the opinions of ancient philosophy on the subject of our being and our morals; it would include their controversies and their reputations, it would tell us who belonged to which school, and how far the founders and their followers actually applied their precepts on memorable occasions which could serve as examples. What a beautiful and useful book that would be! (Essays II.12).
Lipsius did, in fact, go on to supply such an account, at least in relation to Stoic thought. Fearing that his poor health would prevent him from completing his edition and commentary on Seneca, Lipsius, at the end of 1602, decided to publish beforehand his Manuductio ad Stoicam philosophiam (“Guide to Stoic Philosophy”) and Physiologia Stoicorum (“Physical Theory of the Stoics”). A third work in this series, to be entitled Ethica, was planned but never completed. In the two published treatises, which came out in 1604, Lipsius attempted to reconstruct a coherent philosophical system of Stoicism, focusing, as he had done in De constantia, on its compatibility with Christian doctrine.
Although Lipsius made a thorough study of all the ancient Stoic sources available to readers of his time, the Manuductio was not a mere anthology of quotations. Using his well-honed skills as a classical scholar, he meticulously analyzed the philological, historical and philosophical aspects of Greek and Roman Stoic writings, relying primarily on Seneca and Epictetus, but also taking into account Cicero, Plutarch, Diogenes Laertius and a host of other ancient writers, including Plato, Philo Judaeus, Apuleius, (pseudo-)Hermes Trismegistus and Sextus Empiricus. We also find quotations from Scriptures and from a variety of Greek and Latin Church Fathers — Clement of Alexandria, Tertullian, Minucius Felix, Lactantius, Eusebius and St Augustine —together with later Christian writers such as Orosius and Isidore of Seville. Lipsius drew on these thinkers not only because of the historical or philosophical information which they provided on Stoic philosophers and their doctrines but also to demonstrate the uninterrupted interest in Stoic philosophy of later centuries.
The Manuductio starts with a history of the most important philosophical schools which existed in antiquity, followed by a discussion of the origin and succession of the various Stoic schools, their different views on the definition and parts of philosophy. He then comes to the Stoic conception of the truly wise man. Taking his cue from Aristotle (Metaphysics 982a), Lipsius asserts that the main characteristic of the wise man is that “he knows in a sense all the instances that fall under the universal” (Manuductio II.8). The wise man (sapiens) — whom, following the Greek Stoic Panaetius, Lipsius regarded as in a state of progress (proficiens) — will therefore study the physical phenomena and their causes, learning the laws of nature and their relationship to the rules of conduct in order to discover the nature of good and evil. If ethical precepts are to lead to wisdom, they must be reinforced by general doctrines and moral training. Contrary to the Stoic belief that both God and nature need to be comprehended by the use of reason, Lipsius — embracing here a Platonic epistemology more in line with Christianity — saw the understanding of God and his works as a divine gift (Manuductio II.10). The road to wisdom, however, can only be discovered by following the rules of conduct laid down by nature. This truth must be deduced by reasoning, which explains Lipsius's elaborate account of the Stoic theory of knowledge. Both philosophical doctrines and moral precepts are necessary and complementary to one another for an appreciation of the virtues and as guides to the good life. Without a Stoic understanding of the world and of the supreme good (summum bonum), life cannot be lived happily. According to Lipsius (who quotes Seneca’s De vita beata), living happily is the same as living according to nature (Manuductio II.15).
Lipsius devotes considerable attention to this important Stoic dictum. Because there were only a few extant ancient testimonies, confusion arose as to the precise meaning of man’s supreme good. Even Stobaeus had acknowledged that “to live according to nature” could be the same as “living according to the Good” and “living well.” Lipsius correctly understood that ‘living in accordance with nature’ was equivalent to “living according to virtue,” so that the goal was harmony with nature, with the universal law of the world and with the particular rational nature of man. In his Christianized reading of Stoic ethics, however, Lipsius adopted the more religious phrasing of Seneca and Epictetus, so that “living according to nature or virtue” became “living according to right reason,” which the Stoics identified with Zeus or God, “the lord and ruler of everything” (Manuductio II.16, referring to Diogenes Laertius VII.88). Consequently, the wise man was the one who obeyed God.
Having quoted the same passage in De constantia (I.14), in a similarly religious vein, Lipsius once again asserted, with his “Christian” Seneca, that “we are born into a kingdom where obedience to God is true liberty” (Manuductio III.12). Here, however, he explained why the ancient Greek Stoic Cleanthes could rightly say that our common, universal nature is God himself. If man is to obey his own nature, Lipsius argued, he must not oppose the universal laws of human nature; and these laws are dictated by the reason or logos which the Stoics equated with God.
Reason, for Lipsius, is a constituent part of the nature which will lead man to a life of virtue (Manuductio II.17). Not surprisingly, however, he replaces the Stoic logos with the Christian logos or “Word of God” from the Gospel of St John. Our own individual natures, as parts of nature or God, function in the same way as do souls in the human body: they are God dwelling in the human frame (Manuductio II.19). By identifying the Stoic logos with the Christian God, Lipsius is able to conclude, along with Cicero and Clement of Alexandria, that the Stoic supreme good is equivalent to faith in God. Virtue and wisdom come from the source of all knowledge: God. The Platonic contemplation of the Good and the Stoic exploration of the relationship of individual to universal nature are both tantamount to the study of God and his logos, Christ. Therefore, the virtue which the Stoics regard as the summum bonum is the right attitude towards God; and this virtue is the only way to achieve the good life (Manuductio II.19).
Starting from the Stoic dictum that the summum bonum consists of virtue alone and that only virtue is good, Lipsius maintains, following Seneca (Letter LXXI.4), that the supreme good must also be honestum or morally honorable, and that it is limited to the soul, the rational part of man (Manuductio II.20). If everything is judged in relation to the standard of its own good, this standard in man is reason. A man whose soul possesses reason has complete control over good and evil. In contrast to the views of the Platonists and Peripatetics, Seneca considers virtue to be sufficient on its own for the honorable life, and for the virtuous life, man needs to be concerned solely with his own conduct. Like Seneca’s sapiens, Lipsius's wise man,having control over himself, chooses external things only when they are in accordance with nature and, as such, morally honorable. External things are good because the wise man, in his prudence and virtue, has selected them. Choosing rationally among things which are natural but indifferent with respect to happiness is the foundation of true virtuous action. Because only that which is perfect by nature can be called the good — just as the summum bonum is located in God, who is perfect — the good does not exist in man until both he and his reason are perfected (Manuductio II.22, referring to Seneca, Letter CXXIV).
For all his devotion to the Stoics, Lipsius presented a rather eclectic account of their moral philosophy, cutting and trimming as religious orthodoxy required, since by no means all Stoic teachings were compatible with Christianity. It was for this reason that he rejected the Stoic doctrine of ethically indifferent actions (Manuductio II.23). It also explains why he embraced some of the Stoic paradoxes, such as the notion that a kingdom should please the wise man no more than slavery (Manuductio III.12), which reinforced Christian humility, while rejecting others, such as the Stoic dictum that the wise man was, by his own decision, at liberty to take his own life (Manuductio III.22–23), which was blatantly opposed to Christian belief.
Central to Lipsius's insight into Stoic philosophy was his perception that its ethics and physics were inseparable: it was not possible to live one’s life in accordance with nature, as Stoic ethics demanded, without a full knowledge of the physical workings of nature. He develops this theme most fully in the companion piece to the Manuductio, the Physiologia Stoicorum.
In this treatise Lipsius attempts not only to reconstruct Stoic natural philosophy in detail, following the traditional didactic order of the doxographical tradition, but also to reassert its importance for Stoic ethics and theology. Here again the main burden of Lipsius's work is to explain away conflicts between Stoic physics and Christianity or, failing that, to remove unresolved contradictions from his Christianized, Neostoic natural philosophy. To achieve this goal, he employs three different techniques for dealing with problematic Stoic doctrines: interpreting them allegorically, finding similarities with Christian beliefs and imposing Neoplatonic “corrections” on them.
Lipsius made his intentions clear right from the start. Endorsing the Stoic position that the study of nature and its workings was an indispensable part of philosophy, he cited the well-known statements of Plato (Theaetetus 155D) and Aristotle (Metaphysics 982b) that amazement was the motive force of philosophy (Physiologia I.2). In addition, he maintained that the study of higher matters, such as the true nature of God and the universal laws of nature, could serve as an antidote to involvement in petty quarrels — the same role which, in De constantia, he had assigned to constancy and the Stoic mastery of the emotions by reason.
Lipsius connected the Stoic definition of nature found in Diogenes Laertius (VII.156), “a craftsmanlike fire proceeding to create,” to the one provided by Stobaeus (Eclogues I.29) and Plutarch (in fact he quotes Aetius; cf. SVF II.1027): “God is a craftmanlike fire proceeding methodically to create the world, and containing within itself all the seminal reasons; then, in accordance with these, everything is constructed by fate” (Physiologia I.6).
According to Lipsius, this showed that the Stoics believed the world to be the principal creation of God, in whom were contained the seeds of fate which controlled the birth of individual things. This fire or God, containing the seminal reasons (rationes seminales), ideas or forms of all existing things, is a Lipsian innovation, deriving from the Neoplatonic and Christian traditions (he quotes John of Damascus, De orthodoxa fide 13). Lipsius compares this notion to the biblical account of Moses seeing the light glowing in the bush (Exod. 3:2) and the pillar of fire which leads the Israelites through the wilderness (Exod. 14:19), and also to the burning tongues of the Apostles (Acts 2:3; Physiologia I.6).
Lipsius is indebted as well to the Corpus Hermeticum, which he frequently cites when dealing with the notion of Platonic ideas and their relation to God. Arguing that God is not only the divine fire of the Stoics but also the spiritus igneus (“fiery breath”), he quotes Posidonius and Hermes Trismegistus, with the aim of demonstrating that a similar view can be found in Christianity: no one sees God, and yet everyone sees God daily in all things (Physiologia Stoicorum I.7, citing Stobaeus, Eclogues I.2.19 and Corpus Hermeticum XI.16). He rejects, however, as incompatible with Christianity, the Stoics’ pantheistic equation of God with the world and their belief that the divine principle is corporeal (Physiologia I.8).
Lipsius was nonetheless prepared to accept the view of God as the world soul, which permeates every living thing (Physiologia I.8–9). He identified fate with God’s providential reason (Physiologia I.12) and adopted St Augustine’s view (De civitate Dei V.8) that fate does not impinge in any way on the free will of God (Physiologia I.12). Although fate causes everything, not every action is a direct result of it. Human beings thus preserve their moral liberty and responsibility in the sphere of causae secundae (“secondary causes”). Lipsius was a Christian thinker, as well as a Stoic one, and in this capacity he drew on Aristotle’s De generatione animalium (769a-773a) to explain the existence of evil in a world created by a supremely benevolent God: deformed creatures and monstrosities which seem to be contrary to nature are actually in accordance with the overall plan of nature and divine providence (Physiologia I.13).
If Lipsius did violence to the Stoic conceptions of matter, body and God in order to keep faith with Christianity, he also violated certain Christian teachings when defending the Stoic view of the soul as a vital pneuma (“spirit” or “breath”; Physiologia III.9, citing Diogenes Laertius VII.157). A more detailed analysis of Stoic beliefs about the soul might have brought to the surface embarrassing incompatibilities with Christian doctrine. This would not have suited his selective approach to Stoicism, whose purpose was to produce a perfect marriage of pagan and Christian elements, which would serve to enhance the truths of Christianity. However inelegant some of Lipsius's “adaptations” might seem, they belonged to the carefully considered program of a humanist who, by promoting free will, virtue and social commitment, based on a synthesis of Christian and Stoic ethics, wanted to achieve an acceptable, unifying and practicable Christian humanitas.
It should be emphasized that Lipsius did not seek to develop a new philosophy but rather wanted to produce a better “understanding of Seneca.” Nevertheless, it has been claimed that his elucidation of Stoicism gave new meaning to concepts such as freedom, determination, nature and reason, providence and God, and provided European intellectuals with a new awareness of the world, rationality, free will and individuality. It is well known that Lipsian Neostoicism had a direct influence on many seventeenth-century writers — Guillaume du Vair, Montesquieu, Bishop Bossuet and Pierry Bayle in France; Francis Bacon and Joseph Hall in England; and Francisco de Quevedo and Juan de Vera y Figueroa in Spain, to name but a few. One could go further and say that no mention of Stoicism in the seventeenth and eighteenth centuries was complete without a reference to Lipsius's Manuductio, which became the classic work on Stoicism for a century and a half. The most important histories of philosophy — e.g., those by Georgius Hornius (1620–1670), Thomas Stanley (1625–1678), Gerardus Johannes Vossius (1577–1649), Joannes Jonsius (1624–1659), Henning Witte (1634–1696), Johannes Franciscus Buddeus (1667–1729), Burckhard Gotthelf Struve (1671–1738),Christoph August Heumann (1681–1764) or Johann Jakob Brucker (1696–1770) — all cite Lipsius's historical and philosophical introductions to Stoic physics and morals. His two systematic treatises on Stoic philosophy, “pleading its cause before the court of Christianity” (Spanneut, 239), found a prominent place in the library of Spinoza and of other major philosophers of the early modern era, including Descartes and Leibniz; and it was from Lipsius that Locke first learned about Roman Stoicism.
- Opera omnia, published in two folio volumes at Lyons by
Horace Cardon in 1613. Unofficial edition published in Antwerp in 1614
in seven quarto volumes. Official edition published by Balthasar
Moretus in Antwerp in 1637 in four folio volumes, the last of which
contains a detailed index compiled by Franciscus Raphelengius. A fourth
edition, published in Wesel by André van Hoogenhuysen in 1675.
This edition, in 8 octavo volumes, was reprinted by Olms Verlag in
Hildesheim in 2003.
(For a full bibliographical description of all editions of Lipsius's works, see Ferdinand Vander Haeghen and Marie-Thérèse Lenger, Bibliotheca Belgica: bibliographie générale des Pays-Bas, 5 vols (Brussels: Culture et Civilisation, 1964), III: 883–1125).
- (1584) De constantia libri duo, qui alloquium praecipue continent in publicis malis (Leiden: C. Plantin).
- (1584) Twee Boecken vande Stantvasticheyt. Eerst int Latijn gheschreven door I. Lipsius; Ende nu overgheset inde Nederlantsche taele door I. Moerentorf (Leiden: C. Plantin).
- (1584) Deux Livres De La Constance De Iuste Lipsius, Mis en François par de Nuysement (Leiden: C. Plantin).
- (1600) O Stalości Księgi dwoie. Barzo roskoszne y użyteczne. Teraz świeżo z łacińskiego ná rzecz polską przełożone y annotácyámi krotkiemi obiáśnione przez Janusza Piotrowicza (Vilnius: J. Karcan). [Polish translation by Janus Piotrowicz].
- (1616) Libro De La Constancia De Iusto Lipsio. Traducido De Latin En Castellano por Juan Baptista de Mesa (Seville: M. Clavijo, 1616).
- (1939) Two Bookes of Constancie Written in Latine by Iustus Lipsius, English ed. by Sir John Stradling , edited with an introduction by Rudolf Kirk (New Brunswick: Rutgers University Press).
- (1873) Traité De La Constance. Traduction nouvelle, précédée d’une notice sur Juste Lipse par Lucien du Bois (Brussels and Leipzig: H. Merzbach).
- (1965) Justus Lipsius, Von der Bestendigkeit [De Constantia]. Faksimiledruck der deutschen Übersetzung des Andreas Viritius nach der zweiten Auflage von c. 1601 mit den wichtigsten Lesarten der ersten Auflage von 1599, ed. L. Forster (Stuttgart).
- (1983) Over standvastigheid bij algemene rampspoed. Vertaald, ingeleid en van aantekeningen voorzien door Piet H. Schrijvers (Baarn: Ambo).
- (1998)De constantia. Von der Standhaftigkeit, ed. Florian Neumann, Excerpta Classica, 16 (Mainz: Dieterich’sche Verlagsbuchhandlung).
- (2006)Justus Lipsius On Constancy/De Constantia, ed. J. Sellars and transl. by Sir John Stradling(Exeter: University of Exeter Press).
- (1589) Politicorum sive Civilis doctrinae libri sex (Leiden: C. Plantin).
- (1590) Politica Van Iustus Lipsius Dat is: Vande Regeeringhe van Landen ende Steden in ses Boecken begrepen… Overgheset wten Latijn in Nederlantsche sprake Deur Marten Everart B[rugensis] (Franeker: G. vanden Rade).
- (1590) Les Six Livres Des Politiques, Ou Doctrine Civile De Iustus Lipsius. Par Charles le Ber (La Rochelle: M. Villepoux).
- (1594) Sixe Bookes of Politickes or Civil Doctrine, Done into English by William Jones (London: R. Field); facsimile reprint Amsterdam: Theatrum Orbis Terrarum, 1970.
- (1595) Politica Panskie, To iest Navka, Iako Pan Y Kazdy Przelozony Rządnie zyć y spráwowáć sie ma… ná Polski świéżo y pilnie przełożoná przez Pawla Sczerbica (Cracow: Lazarus). [Polish translation by Paul Sczerbic].
- (1599) Von Unterweisung zum Weltlichen Regiment, Oder von Burgerlicher Lehr Sechs Bucher Iusti Lipsii… in unsere Hochteutsche Sprach transferirt und ubergesetzet. Durch Melchiorem Haganaeum (Amberg: M. Forster).
- (1604) Los Seys Libros De Las Politicas O Doctrina Ciuil de Iusto Lipsio… Traduzidos de lengua Latina en Castellana por don Bernardino de Mendoça (Madrid: E. Bogia).
- (1604) Delle Politica Overo Dottrina Civile Di Giusto Lipsio Lib. VI. … Tradotto Dal Signor Antonio Nvmai (Roma: G. Martinelli – G. Facciotto).
- (1704) Politicorum sive Civilis Doctrina libri sex, qui ad Principatum maxime spectant, ex instituto Matthiae Berneggeri, cum indice accurato, praemissa dissertatione Joh. Henr. Boecleri De Politicis Lipsianis. Mit einem Vorwort herausgegeben von W. Weber (Hildesheim: G. Olms, 1998) [Frankfurt-Leipzig].
- (2004) Politica — Six Books of Politics or Political Instruction, ed. J. Waszink, Bibliotheca Latinitatis Novae, 5 (Assen: Van Gorcum).
- (1604a) Manuductionis ad Stoicam philosophiam libri tres, L.
Annaeo Senecae, aliisque scriptoribus illustrandis (Antwerp: J.
Moretus. (1610b) revised edition Antwerp, J. Moretus.
[A few chapters have been translated into English by Robert V. Young in J. Kraye (ed.), Cambridge Translations of Renaissance Philosophical Texts (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1997), I: Moral Philosophy: 200–209; and into French in J. Lagrée (see below).]
- (1604a) Physiologiae Stoicorum Libri Tres, L. Annaeo Senecae,
aliisque scriptoribus illustrandis (Antwerp: J. Moretus). (1610b)
revised edition Antwerp, J. Moretus.
[Some extracts have been translated into French in J. Lagrée (see below)].
- (1644) Iusti Lipsii Philosophia & Physiologia Stoica (Leiden: J. Maire).
- (1605a) L. Annaei Senecae Philosophi Opera, quae exstant omnia, a Iusto Lipsio emendata, et scholijs illustrata (Antwerp: J. Moretus); (1615b) revised, second edition.
Monita et exempla politica
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vitia principum spectant (Antwerp: J. Moretus. (1606 and 1613)
reprint editions Antwerp, J. Moretus.
[A modern edition with English translation has been prepared by M. Janssens, Collecting Historical Examples for the Prince. Justus Lipsius' Monita et exempla politica (1605)/ Edition, Translation, Commentary and Introductory Study of an Early Modern Mirror-for-Princes (Unpublished PhD: Leuven University, 2009).]
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- Justus Lipsius, by John Sellars, in The Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
- Neostoicism, by John Sellars, in The Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy.