Supplement to Kant's Theory of Judgment

The Togetherness Principle, Kant's Conceptualism, and Kant's Non-conceptualism

One of the best-known and most widely-quoted texts of the Critique of Pure Reason is this pithy slogan: “thoughts without content are empty, intuitions without concepts are blind” (A51/B76). That slogan encapsulates what can be called the togetherness principle. The “togetherness” here is the necessary cognitive complementarity and semantic interdependence of intuitions and concepts, when placed against the backdrop of Kant's cognitive dualism of the faculties of sensibility and understanding:

Intuition and concepts … constitute the elements of all our cognition, so that neither concepts without intuition corresponding to them in some way nor intuition without concepts can yield a cognition. Thoughts without [intensional] content (Inhalt) are empty (leer), intuitions without concepts are blind (blind). It is, therefore, just as necessary to make the mind's concepts sensible—that is, to add an object to them in intuition—as to make our intuitions understandable—that is, to bring them under concepts. These two powers, or capacities, cannot exchange their functions. The understanding can intuit nothing, the senses can think nothing. Only from their unification can cognition arise. (A50–51/B74–76)

What does the togetherness principle mean? The famous texts just quoted have led many readers and interpreters of Kant—e.g., Sellars 1963, Sellars 1968, McDowell 1994, and Abela 2002—to deny the cognitive and semantic independence of intuitions: intuitions without concepts either simply do not exist or else are wholly meaningless (i.e., neither objectively valid nor rationally intelligible) even if they do exist. And this denial appears to be supported by at least one other text:

The understanding cognizes everything only through concepts; consequently, however far it goes in its divisions [of lower concepts] it never cognizes through mere intuition but always yet again through lower concepts. (A656/B684).

But even so, this cannot be a correct interpretation of the famous texts at A50–51/B74–76, because of what Kant says in these texts:

Objects can indeed appear to us without necessarily having to be related to functions of the understanding. (A89/B122, emphasis added)
Appearances can certainly be given in intuition without functions of the understanding. (A90/B122, emphasis added)
Appearances might very well be so constituted that the understanding would not find them in accordance with the conditions of its unity…. [and] in the series of appearances nothing would present itself that would yield a rule of synthesis and so correspond to the concept of cause and effect, so that this concept would be entirely empty, null, and meaningless. Appearances would none the less present objects to our intuition, since intuition by no means requires the functions of thought. (A90–91/B122–123, emphasis added)
The manifold for intuition must already be given prior to the synthesis of the understanding and independently from it. (B145, emphasis added)

In other words, according to these last four texts, intuitions are essentially non-conceptual cognitions, that is, rational human cognitions that exist and are objectively valid both over and above concepts and also without requiring concepts. Let us call the thesis that intuitions are sufficient for the production of objectively valid cognitions, over and above any conceptual contents (whether empirical or non-empirical) that might be associated with those intuitions, the independence of intuitions from concepts. Since Kant is also committed to the really possible and actual existence of non-rational human or non-human animal cognizers—“babes and beasts”—that do not possess a faculty of understanding, hence lack conceptual capacities, yet are also capable of generating objectively valid empirical and pure intuitions (McLear 2011), then intuitional/essentially non-conceptual cognitions can also exist and be objectively valid autonomously, that is, in the total absence of concepts and conceptual capacities alike. So Kant is committed to the togetherness principle and also to the independence and autonomy of intuitions. But now we are in a dilemma. How then can these two apparently contradictory sets of texts be reconciled?

The answer is that what Kant is actually saying in the famous texts at A50–51/B74–76 is that intuitions and concepts are cognitively complementary and semantically interdependent for the specific purpose of constituting objectively valid judgments. This in turn corresponds directly to a special, narrower sense of ‘cognition’ that Kant highlights in the B edition of the first Critique, which means the same as objectively valid judgment (B xxvi, Bxxvi n.), as opposed to the wider definition of ‘cognition’ that he had used in the A edition, which means the same as conscious objective representation (A320/B376–377). But from this it does not follow that there cannot be “empty” concepts or “blind” intuitions outside the special context of objectively valid judgments. ‘Empty concept’ for Kant does not mean either “bogus concept” or “wholly meaningless concept”: rather it means “concept that is not objectively valid,” and as we have seen in Section 1.3, for Kant there can be very different sorts of concepts that are not objectively valid, including rationally intelligible concepts of noumenal objects or noumenal subjects. So too, when Kant says that “the understanding can make no use (Gebrauch) of ... concepts than to judge by means of them” (A68/B93), he is not saying, in anticipation of Frege's context principle (i.e., that words have meaning only in the context of whole propositions) that concepts are meaningful only in the context of objectively valid judgments, or meaningful only in the context of any kind of judgment, since noumenal concepts, quite apart from any kind of judgment, are obvious counterexamples. Similarly, ‘blind intuition’ for Kant does not mean either “bogus intuition” or “wholly meaningless intuition”: rather it means “autonomously and independently objectively valid intuition/essentially non-conceptual cognition.” Therefore, despite its being true for Kant, according to the togetherness principle, that intuitions and concepts must be combined with one another in order to generate objectively valid judgments, nevertheless intuitions/essentially non-conceptual cognitions can also occur both autonomously from and independently of concepts and still remain objectively valid. And in particular, to the extent that intuitions are cognitively and semantically autonomous from and independent of concepts, and also objectively valid, they contain essentially non-conceptual conscious objective representational contents.

But the very idea that according to Kant, in rational human cognition and in non-rational human or non-human cognition alike there exist conscious objectively representational intuitions that are essentially autonomous from and independent of concepts, has generated a vigorous debate in recent and contemporary Kant-interpretation, with far-reaching implications for interpreting Kant's theory of judgment, his transcendental idealism, and the Transcendental Deduction of the Pure Concepts or Categories. This is the debate about Kant's conceptualism vs. Kant's non-conceptualism.

Unfortunately, even quite apart from their Kantian incarnations, conceptualism and non-conceptualism are defined in non-trivially different ways by different contemporary philosophers of mind (see, e.g., Bermúdez & Cahen 2011, Van Cleve 2012). But for the present purposes of discussion, conceptualism is the two-part thesis (C1) that all rational human conscious objective representational content is strictly determined by conceptual capacities alone, and (C2) that non-rational human or non-human animals are not capable of conscious objective representation. By contrast, non-conceptualism is the three-part thesis (NC1) that not all rational human conscious objective representational content is determined by conceptual capacities alone, (NC2) that at least some rational human conscious objective representational contents are both autonomous from and independent of conceptual content and also strictly determined by non-conceptual capacities alone, and (NC3) that at least some and perhaps most non-rational human or non-human animals are capable of conscious objective representation.

Kant's conceptualism, in turn, is taken to follow directly from the togetherness principle; and, in addition to asserting both (C1) and (C2), it adds either (KC1) that the rational human understanding and its innate conceptual capacities not only strictly determine all conscious objective representational content, especially including all objectively valid judgments, but also strictly determine the faculty of sensibility itself and all the intuitions yielded by it (strong Kantian conceptualism) (see, e.g., Sellars 1963, Sellars 1968, McDowell 1994, Abela 2002), or else (KC2) that the rational human understanding and its innate conceptual capacities strictly determine all conscious objective representational content, especially including all objectively valid judgments, as well as all intuitions, although the faculty of sensibility independently provides a necessary condition for conscious objective representation, and some empirical concepts or conceptual activities occur outside the context of fully explicit judgments or self-consciously articulated propositions (weak Kantian conceptualism) (see, e.g., Wenzel 2005, Ginsborg 2006, Ginsborg 2008, McDowell 2009, Bowman 2011, Grüne 2009, Land 2011, Bauer 2012, Griffith 2012, Williams 2012, McDowell 2013, Pippin 2013, Golob forthcoming). The most important difference between strong Kantian conceptualism and weak Kantian conceptualism is that whereas the weak variety at least minimally preserves Kant's cognitive dualism of faculties, and also some sort of semi-independent cognitive role for intuitions (even though it still rejects the thesis that intuitions have an essentially different kind of representational content from concepts), the strong variety does not countenance any of these concessions to non-conceptualism, and thereby, in effect, strong Kantian conceptualism explanatorily reduces the faculty of sensibility to the faculty of understanding.

In any case, by contrast to either weak or strong Kantian conceptualism, Kant's non-conceptualism is taken to follow from the four texts cited above; and in addition to asserting (NC1), (NC2), and (NC3), it also adds either (KNC1) that the rational human capacity for sensibility generates empirical intuitions and pure intuitions that autonomously and independently provide conscious objective representational contents (weak Kantian non-conceptualism) (Rohs 2001, Hanna 2005, Allais 2009, McLear forthcoming), or else (KNC2) that the rational human capacity for sensibility not only generates empirical intuitions and pure intuitions that autonomously and independently provide conscious objective representational contents, but also, by means of these autonomous and independent non-conceptual cognitions, the faculty of sensibility contributes directly to the justification of epistemic and practical beliefs, by virtue of inherently normative and proto-rational factors that it builds into the essentially non-conceptual content of intuitions (strong Kantian non-conceptualism) (Hanna 2006b, ch. 2, Hanna 2008, Hanna & Chadha 2011, Hanna 2011a, Laiho 2012, Tolley 2013). The most important difference between weak Kantian non-conceptualism and strong Kantian non-conceptualism is that whereas the weak variety does not directly address the classical Sellarsian worry, known as The Myth of the Given, that nothing can count as conscious objective representational content unless it occurs within the essentially conceptual domain of “the space of reasons” (see, e.g., Sellars 1963, McDowell 1994, McDowell 2009), and only thereby can contribute directly to the justification of epistemic and practical beliefs, the strong version of Kantian non-conceptualism explicitly asserts that autonomously and independently objectively valid intuitions can contribute directly to the justification of epistemic and practical beliefs without having to enter the essentially conceptual domain of “the space of reasons.” Or in other words, strong Kantian non-conceptualism explicitly deflects and trumps The Myth of the Given.

As several recent Kant-commentators have correctly noted, not only do Kantian conceptualism and Kantian non-conceptualism stake out strikingly different positions on how correctly to interpret Kant's theory of cognition in general and his theory of judgment in particular, they also define strikingly different ways of reading the Critique of Pure Reason as a whole. In short, and to put it bluntly, what is at issue here is nothing less than the entire Kantian ball of wax. So which approach is correct?

Currently, and perhaps not too surprisingly, the correct answer to that question remains deeply controversial. As we have already seen, the textual evidence pulls in both directions, and is not decisive. What does seem very clear is that if there is to be a resolution to the debate, or at any rate some further fruitful philosophical progress in it, then this will almost certainly come from a fuller appreciation and critical evaluation of how Kantian conceptualism and Kantian non-conceptualism, whether in their strong or weak versions, precisely and differentially affect interpretations of Kant's theory of judgment, and by means of that, interpretations of Kant's transcendental idealism and the Transcendental Deduction of the Pure Concepts of the Understanding or Categories. This is spelled out in some detail in Sections 3 and 4. But in the meantime and in anticipation of those details, it is worth noting that two fundamental problems, both centered on judgment, are put in play by the Kantian conceptualism vs. non-conceptualism debate.

The first fundamental problem is what can be called the schmimagination vicious regress problem (see. e.g., Schulting 2012), and it says this. If the faculty of imagination is supposed by Kant to mediate between and also unify the dual faculties of understanding and sensibility for the purpose of forming objectively valid judgments, yet the imagination—and along with it, synthesis, spontaneity, and the objective unity of representational content—all correspondingly split into two essentially different kinds, one kind inherently associated with understanding and the other kind inherently associated with sensibility, then yet another fourth kind of faculty, as it were, schmimagination, is now needed to mediate between and unify the two kinds of imagination, synthesis, spontaneity, and objective unity of representational content, etc., ad infinitum. But this leads to a vicious explanatory regress. If, in order to avoid this explanatory regress, one adopts strong Kantian conceptualism, which reduces the sensibility to the understanding, then that undermines Kant's cognitive dualism of faculties, and with it, the basis of Kant's claim to be offering a genuine philosophical advance over Rationalism and Empiricism, not to mention (looking beyond Kant into the 19th century) a genuine philosophical competitor to Hegel's absolute idealism (Hanna 2012, Gardner 2013, Hanna 2013). So either one is stuck with a vicious explanatory regress or else one gives up Kant's claim to philosophical originality.

The second fundamental problem is what can be called the TD modus ponens/modus tollens dilemma (see, e.g. Hanna 2011b, Grüne 2011), and it says this. The Kantian non-conceptualist argues that (1) if Kantian non-conceptualism is true, then autonomously and independently objective valid intuitions exist, (2) if autonomously and independently objective valid intuitions exist, then there is a serious gap in the Transcendental Deduction of the Pure Concepts of the Understanding or Categories (The TD), in the sense that the cognitive scope of the sensibility thereby actually exceeds, or at the very least threatens to exceed, the cognitive scope of the understanding and its pure concepts, and (3) if there is a serious gap in The TD, then The TD is unsound, and finally (4) therefore, The TD is unsound. But the Kantian conceptualist argues that (1) The TD must be sound, (2) if The TD is sound, then there is no gap in The TD, (3) if there is no gap in The TD, then no autonomously and independently objectively valid intuitions exist, (4) if no autonomously and independently objectively valid intuitions exist, then Kantian non-conceptualism must be false, and finally (5) therefore, Kantian non-conceptualism is false. In other words, the Kantian non-conceptualist's modus ponens is the Kantian conceptualist's modus tollens, and there appears to be no principled way to resolve the dilemma.

Copyright © 2013 by
Robert Hanna <Robert.Hanna@colorado.edu>

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