Supplement to Kant's Theory of Judgment

Kinds of Use

In the discussion thus far, judgments are essentially identified with their propositional contents. But according to Kant it is also possible for a rational cognizer to use the very same propositional content in different ways. These differences in use should not be confused with the three types of taking-for-true or Fürwahrhalten, i.e., the propositional attitudes of opining, epistemic belief, and certainty, which are merely the three basic “stages” (Stufen) of increasing rational commitment to the truth (A820–823/B848–851). By contrast, the use or Gebrauch of judgments can also be pragmatic, moral, aesthetic, or teleological, and not epistemic. The fundamental difference in uses of judgments is between (a) theoretical (e.g., scientific) judgments and (b) non-theoretical (e.g., pragmatic, moral, aesthetic, or teleological) judgments. But there are also some crucial differences between types of theoretical use of judgments.

A. Theoretical judgments and non-theoretical judgments

According to Kant, theoretical judgments are judgments used such that their overall rational purpose or function is to be true propositions about the world, whether that world is taken to be phenomenal or noumenal (20: 195). By contrast, non-theoretical judgments are judgments such that this is not the case, precisely because they are used non-truth-theoretically. For example, the overall rational purpose of a non-theoretical judgment might be to make instrumental or non-instrumental free choices or decisions (pragmatic or moral judgments, i.e., “practical propositions”) (20: 196). Or it might be to evaluate the beauty or sublimity of phenomenal objects (aesthetic judgments of taste) (5: 203–356). Or it might be to treat natural things as if they had goal-directed or purposive structure, as a heuristic guide for the construction of better mechanistic explanations of physical phenomena (teleological judgments) (5: 359–484). In any case, it would be a serious mistake to think that the propositional content of a judgment is irrelevant to its non-theoretical uses. On the contrary, pragmatic/moral judgments, judgments of taste, and teleological judgments are all individuated by their propositional contents, because these contents determine what the judgment is about. But the rational purpose or function of a non-theoretical judgment can be realized even if its propositional content is false. What matters for a non-theoretical judgment is how things seem to the judger, not how they actually are. In this way, a particular choice or decision can be good or right even if it is based on false beliefs. A visual experience of that thing over there, which you take to be a beautiful rose, can be a genuine experience of the beautiful, even if in fact it is not a rose or does not even exist (5: 205). And a teleological judgment about something's apparent natural purpose (e.g., heliotropic plants turning towards the sun because they “want” sunlight) can be heuristically useful in the construction of a fully mechanistic theory of biological phenomena (5: 397–415). Indeed Kant, not Daniel Dennett, is the true originator of the notion of the intentional stance (Dennett 1987).

B. Theoretical use 1: constitutive judgments and regulative judgments

Just as there are different varieties of non-theoretical use of judgments, so too there are different varieties of theoretical use. Two of the most important of these varieties emerge in Kant's distinction between “constitutive” and “regulative” judgments. Kant has several different ways of formulating this difference, but the nub of the distinction is this: a theoretical judgment is used constitutively if and only if its meaning, truth, or legitimacy as a “principle”(Grundsatz, Prinzip) is not based on any further assumptions, hypothetical conditions, or suppositions; whereas a theoretical judgment is used regulatively if and only if its meaning, truth, or legitimacy as a principle is based on some further assumptions, hypothetical conditions, or suppositions. Thus the synthetic a priori “mathematical” principles of pure understanding are said by Kant to be constitutive, while the synthetic a priori “dynamical” principles of pure understanding are said to be regulative (A178–181/B220–224). This is because the meaning and truth of instances of the former (e.g., “2+2=4”) is not based on any existential assumptions about the actual application of that judgment (i.e., “2+2=4” would still be true even if every two pairs of apples whenever counted up always magically fused into one apple, The Big Apple), while by contrast the meaning and truth of instances of the latter (e.g., “Material objects fall towards the earth at the rate of 10 meters per second/per second” or “A caused B”) is based on existential assumptions about the existence of matter and the existence of antecedent events in causal relations.

Another important application of the distinction between the constitutive and regulative uses of judgments concerns the precise semantic status of “empty” propositions (i.e., propositions lacking objective validity) that also have the same overall form as objectively valid synthetic a priori judgments. According to Kant, all such empty propositions contain “ideas of pure reason,” which are either concepts of noumenal objects or else meta-concepts that posit “totalizing” extensions of the pure concepts of the understanding (A320/B377, A326–329/B382–386). Examples of such propositions would be (W) “Everything belonging to the natural kind water does so by virtue of its Lockean essence or real internal constitution,” and (G) “A benevolent God exists.” Under their constitutive uses, judgments (G) and (W) have no truth-values. Nor indeed do (G) and (W), strictly speaking, have truth-values under their regulative uses. But there is according to Kant a perfectly legitimate regulative use of judgment (W) in natural science as a principle according to which nature is judged merely as if (W) were true, in order to group all otherwise macroscopically disparate kinds of water (e.g., ice, steam, water in its liquid state, etc.) and study them with the goal of finding some unified set of causal laws that systematically explains the overall phenomenal behavior of the natural kind water (A645–647/B673–675). And there is also according to Kant a perfectly legitimate regulative use of (G) in morality as a “postulate of practical reason”, which in turn is a basic propositional target of moral belief or Glauben, according to which our moral lives are to be conducted as if we could epistemically believe or scientifically know that God benevolently guarantees that all and only the happy people are morally virtuous, in order to strengthen our otherwise naturally flawed and shifting moral resolve, and make our moral lives fully meaningful (A633–634/B661–662, A812–819/B840–847). More generally, these last two cases show that otherwise empty or non-objectively-valid judgments are used regulatively when their legitimacy as principles depends on their being adopted solely for the purpose of making scientific inquiry or moral life into a coherent, meaningful whole. This same coherence/meaning-making status also holds for several important maxims or mottoes of scientific inquiry that are often mistaken for extremely general theoretical judgments, e.g., that nature never multiplies entities without necessity (Ockham's razor) or that nature makes no leaps (the law of continuity) (A652–663/B680–691). As Kant recognized and as every hands-on scientist knows, the natural world up close seems to be distressingly messy and full of holes. Thus the general rational idea of what Kant calls “the systematic unity of nature” (A650–668/B678–696) bridges the gap between the messy experimental front lines of natural scientific research, which could all-too-easily lead to destructive skepticism and undermine the rational enterprise of natural science itself, and the compact, elegant beauty of its abstract mathematical or structural models, which in turn evoke the working scientist's sense that some sort of rational deep design permeates nature. This aesthetic and teleological bridging-tactic thereby emotionally super-charges the personal and social practice of natural scientific research by conferring upon it the collectively-felt solidarity of a coherent, meaningful, and intersubjectively valid rational enterprise. In this sense, Kant is the original discoverer of the aesthetics of science (see, e.g., Breitenbach forthcoming).

C. Theoretical use 2: determining judgments and reflective judgments

The second important pair of theoretical uses can be found in Kant's distinction between “determining” judgments and “reflective” judgments. A confusing feature of this distinction is that it crosses over the constitutive vs. regulative distinction. Indeed, the determining judgment vs. reflective judgment distinction is not even explicitly mentioned in the Critical period until the first Introduction to the Critique of the Power of Judgment (20: 211), nevertheless it is clearly very closely related to some remarks about the regulative use of the ideas of reason in the first Critique's Appendix to the Transcendental Dialectic, and in particular to a distinction Kant makes there between “apodictic” and “hypothetical” uses of judgment (CPR A647/B675). Here Kant asserts that at least some regulative uses of judgment, and in particular, regulative judgments about the systematic unity of nature, have a transcendental presuppositional bearing on the truth of both synthetic a priori and synthetic a posteriori judgments in natural science, and do not play a merely secondary or heuristic role in scientific investigation (CPR A648/B676, A651/B679). In the third Critique, this somewhat inchoate and surprising assertion is developed into the explicit doctrine that judgments of taste are governed by a “subjectively necessary” transcendental principle to the effect that the existence of legitimate judgments of taste about the beautiful in nature presupposes that we must believe that the formal structures of empirical nature are well-adjusted to (even if not precisely designed for) the innate structures of our cognitive faculties (5: 179–186) (20: 215–216, 211). Kant seems also to hold in one or two places in the third Critique that teleological judgments are not merely heuristically useful for the mechanistic study of biological phenomena, but in fact are heuristically necessary (5: 376–383, 400) for this purpose. In contemporary terms, this is equivalent to the important claim that our fully mechanistic organismic, molecular, and cellular branches of biology all constitutively require the intentional stance. Finally, there are some even more tantalizing hints in the third Critique to the effect that the heuristic necessity of teleological judgments about self-organizing, self-initiated non-human animal movements implies that we must also (morally?) believe that our own human animal bodies can be freely moved by the choices of our wills in intentional agency (5: 397–399).

In any case, both judgments of taste and teleological judgments are held by Kant to be reflective judgments, not determining judgments. The difference between the determining use of a judgment and the reflective use of a judgment has to do with the way in which the predicative structure of a simple categorical judgment is interpreted (5: 179) (20: 211). Normally, predication is interpreted as involving either the “subsumption” of a particular individual (say, Socrates) under a universal concept (say, the concept of being a philosopher), or the subsumption of a narrower concept (say, being human) under a wider concept (say, being mortal). This is the “determining” interpretation of predication in a judgment, because it logically brings a “determinate” individual or narrower concept under a universal or more general “determinable” concept. But Kant thinks that it is also possible to interpret predication in the reverse direction: that is, from “determinate” to “determinable.” This is the “reflective” interpretation of predication in a judgment, not only because it advances logically from a particular individual or narrower concept to a universal or more general concept, as, e.g., in induction or abduction (i.e., inference to the best explanation), but also because it directly invokes the cognitive subject's ability to form higher-order representations of herself via the act of reflection or Überlegung and thus to be rationally self-conscious or apperceptive (B2, A260–263/B316–319) (20: 211). In any case, we can now clearly see that, given the special roles of judgments of taste and teleological judgments in the Critique of the Power of Judgment, Kant believes that the reflective use of judgment has an extremely important function not only in the natural sciences but also in transcendental philosophy.

Copyright © 2013 by
Robert Hanna <>

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