Leibniz's Philosophy of Physics
Although better known today for his bold metaphysics and optimistic theodicy, Leibniz's intellectual contributions extended well beyond what is now generally thought of as philosophy or theology. Remarkably in an era that knew the likes of Galileo, Descartes, Huygens, Hooke and Newton, Leibniz stood out as one of the most important figures in the development of the Scientific Revolution. This entry will attempt to provide a broad overview of the central themes of Leibniz's philosophy of physics, as well as an introduction to some of the principal arguments and argumentative strategies he used to defend his positions. The merits of Leibniz's criticisms, contributions, and their relations to his larger philosophical system remain fascinating areas for historical and philosophical investigation.
- 1. The Historical Development of Leibniz's Physics
- 2. Leibniz on matter
- 3. Leibniz's Dynamics
- 4. Leibniz on the Laws of Motion
- 5. Leibniz on Space and Time
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In his earliest days, Leibniz read a wide range of traditional works drawn from his father's considerable library. Later he was formally educated at the University of Leipzig (1661–1666), briefly at the University of Jena (1663), and finally at the University of Altdorf (1666–1667). From these sources, Leibniz gained an early acquaintance with the Aristotelian-Scholastic tradition, as well as a taste of neo-platonic themes common in Renaissance humanism. By his own account, he quickly “penetrated far into the territory of the Scholastics,” and derived “some satisfaction” from “Plato too, and Plotinus” (G III 606/L 655). Although he consciously broke with the Scholastic tradition while still quite young, its doctrines clearly made a lasting impression on him, and served him both as a font of ideas and a readily available target of criticism. Indeed, one can justifiably see many of Leibniz's mature doctrines as reactions — either positive or negative — to the Scholastic views that he first became acquainted with while still a student in Germany.
According to his own recollection, it appears that Leibniz threw himself into the mechanical philosophy sometime around the year 1661. In a well-known letter to Nicolas Remond, Leibniz — then in the twilight of his years — recounted his early conversion:
After having finished the trivial schools, I fell upon the moderns, and I recall walking in a grove on the outskirts of Leipzig called the Rosental, at the age of fifteen, and deliberating whether to preserve substantial forms or not. Mechanism finally prevailed and led me to apply myself to mathematics. (G III 606/L 655)
Although we have no records of Leibniz's work from the years immediately following his youthful adoption of mechanism, there is abundant evidence that by the late 1660's, he had studied the writings of a wide range of mechanistic philosophers, committed himself to the “hypothesis of the moderns, which conceives no incorporeal entities within bodies but assumes nothing beyond magnitude, figure, and motion,” and had begun to search for ways to improve the mechanistic philosophy of his predecessors.
The early influence of natural philosophers such as Gassendi and Hobbes —whom Leibniz would later characterize as working in the Epicurean tradition — is particularly apparent in his first pair of systematic works on motion. In the Theoria motus abstracti (TMA), dedicated to the French Academy in 1671, Leibniz introduces a set of abstract laws of motion (A VI.ii.261–276/L 139–142). At the heart of those laws is the Hobbesian notion of conatus, which Leibniz describes as “the beginning and end of motion,” and which he seems to conceive of as a tendency to motion in a particular direction. Leibniz argues that the motion of a body in isolation is determined entirely by its own conatus, and that the motions of colliding bodies are determined solely by the combination of their respective conatuses. In this way, Leibniz's abstract theory of motion assigns no role whatsoever, with respect to the fundamental laws of motion, to the sizes or masses of material bodies. According to the TMA, a tiny pebble with a certain velocity striking a large boulder at rest would, under idealized conditions, continue to move with the boulder with the same velocity that it had initially.
Leibniz, of course, recognized that the laws of motion sketched in the TMA are radically at odds with the testimony of everyday experience. After all, it would seem to be the case that if the world were governed by the laws of the TMA, it should be no more difficult to move a planet than a pebble. Leibniz sought to close this gap between the fundamental laws and experience with the publication of his Hypothesis physica nova (HPN) also known as the Theoria motus concreti, which he also dedicated in 1671, this time to the Royal Society of London (A.VI.ii.221–257). In the HPN, Leibniz argues that the laws of the TMA yield the Huygens-Wren laws of impact when taken together with the contingent structure of the actual world. Central to Leibniz's strategy is the idea that all bodies in the actual world are elastic due to a pervasive aether, and are composed of discrete particles. Although mass continues to play no foundational role in his applied system of physics, Leibniz is cleverly able to argue that larger bodies will generally be more resistant to motion due to the larger number of particles from which they are constituted. A pebble striking a planet will thus fail to have any significant effect because the pebble's velocity is propagated to the planet not at a single blow but particle by particle; its motion is consequently diluted — and even reversed — as it is repeatedly summed with the velocity of each subsequent particle.
In 1672, Leibniz was sent to Paris as part of a diplomatic mission where he stayed — short trips aside — for the next four years. His time spent in the intellectually vibrant French capital proved crucial to the development of his mature views in physics. While in Paris, Leibniz gained an expert's knowledge of the mathematics of his time, embarked on an intensive study of Cartesian physics, and made contact with many of the leading natural philosophers of his day.
In such fertile circumstances — which included tutoring by Huygens himself and direct access to Descartes's unpublished notebooks — Leibniz quickly fashioned his own penetrating critique of Cartesian physics. As early as 1676, he had found what he considered to be a fatal flaw in Descartes's cornerstone conservation law, namely, that it violates the principle of the equality of cause and effect. When Leibniz published essentially the same objection in his Brief Demonstration of a Notable Error of Descartes's and Others Concerning a Natural Law in 1686, it sparked a now famous dispute among natural philosophers that has become known as the vis viva controversy (GM VI 117–119/L 296–298). For Leibniz the argument of the Brief Demonstration marked not only an important event in his understanding of the Cartesian system, but also a turning point in the development of his own distinctive physics.
On the one hand, the argument of the Brief Demonstration forced Leibniz to rethink the foundations of his early theory of motion. For the charge of violating the principle of the equality of cause and effect that he leveled against Cartesians spoke at least equally well against the laws of the TMA and the HPN. The paradoxical result of the ideal laws of the TMA — that a tiny body moving with a given speed might impart the same speed to a relatively enormous body — appeared, at least intuitively, as an example of a potentially even greater increase in local force than anything allowed by Descartes's rules of impact. Conversely, according to the phenomenal laws of the HPN, since the combination by impact of two conatuses can fall short, but never exceed, the strict sum of the conatuses of the two individual bodies, the total conatus present in the world must naturally decline over time — another violation of the equality principle. In short, in the argument of the Brief Demonstration, Leibniz found a devastating criticism not only of Cartesian physics, but also of Early Leibnizian physics.
On the other hand, Leibniz's embrace of the principle of the equality of cause and effect helped inspire his development of a series of ambitious positions that would collectively serve as the moorings of his mature physics. The failure of Descartes's conservation law encouraged Leibniz to attach new significance to an alternative conservation principle that he had learned from Huygens by 1669 at the latest. Leibniz came to see that if force is taken to be equivalent to the quantity of vis viva — rather than the quantity of motion as Descartes had implied — then, in cases such as those highlighted by the Brief Demonstration, no violation of the principle of equality of cause and effect need be tolerated. In subsequent works, including his Dynamica de Potentia et Legibus Naturae corporea (1689), Essay of Dynamics on the Laws of Motion … (1690), and Specimen Dynamicum (1695), Leibniz attempts to build on this discovery by suggesting further implications not only for the conservation of force, but also for the laws of motion and even the fundamental nature of physical bodies. Thus one can reasonably see in his devastating critique of the Cartesian conservation law the seeds of much of what is distinctive in his own mature physics.
Although Leibniz continued to refine, develop, and extend his views on the laws of motion and impact, his work in the philosophy of physics was most prominently capped by his famous correspondence with Samuel Clarke — Newton's parish priest, intellectual disciple, and possible mouthpiece. The controversy began when the Princess of Wales passed along to Clarke in 1715 a letter written by Leibniz decrying the decline of religion in England inspired by the rise of Newton's natural philosophy. Taking place against the backdrop of a bitter dispute over the priority of the calculus, Clarke responded in Newton's defense and a series of five letters and replies were exchanged. Among the many topics covered in the correspondence, the letters are best known for the opposing views of space and time which they offer: Leibniz defending roughly the view that space is an ideal system of relations holding between bodies, and Clarke defending the view that space is something more like a container in which bodies are located and move. The increasingly detailed and pointed exchange ended only with Leibniz's death in 1716, with Clarke, in the historical sense at least, having the last word.
Leibniz's views on the nature of matter are subtle and layered. From the time of his youthful conversion in the Rosental, he remained broadly sympathetic to the explanatory project of the new mechanical philosophy and its ambition to explain natural phenomena in terms of matter and motion rather than in terms of a wide range of irreducible formal natures. In spite of this general sympathy, however, he was also one of the most penetrating critics of the dominant conceptions of matter in the mechanistic tradition. This section looks first at Leibniz's critiques of the two most important of those conceptions before turning to his own positive account of the passive powers of bodies.
Although there was much disagreement over details, early modern atomists generally affirmed that complex bodies are to be understood as being composed of naturally indivisible material atoms moving about in an independently existing space. Such atoms were commonly held to lack all but a few basic properties such as size, shape, and possibly weight. While Leibniz himself was attracted to such a conception of body in his early years, he eventually came to see atomism as deeply antithetical to his general understanding of the natural world. Not surprisingly then, many of Leibniz's arguments against atomism attempt to show how common atomist commitments conflict with central principles of his mature natural philosophy.
One such argument highlights a tension between Leibniz's principle of continuity — according to which “no change happens through a leap” — and the common assumption that material atoms must be perfectly hard and inflexible. Taking for granted this supposed perfect hardness and inflexibility, Leibniz argues that the collision of any two atoms would lead to a discontinuous change in nature:
[I]f we were to imagine that there are atoms, that is, bodies of maximal hardness and therefore inflexible, it would follow that there would be a change through a leap, that is, an instantaneous change. For at the very moment of collision the direction to the motion reverses itself, unless we assume that the bodies come to rest immediately after the collision, that is, lose their force; beyond the fact that it would be absurd in other ways, this contains, again, a change through a leap, and instantaneous change from motion to rest, without passing through the intermediate steps. (SD II.3/AG 132)
Leibniz's suggestion here is that collisions between perfectly hard, inflexible atoms would violate the principle of continuity since — being unable to flex or give — their directions and speeds would have to change instantaneously upon contact. Tacitly rejecting the possibility that continuity could be preserved by action at a distance, Leibniz insists that continuity presupposes elasticity, and that elasticity in turn presupposes having parts that can move relative to one another. Given that the original argument can be invoked no matter how small the colliding bodies, Leibniz draws the inevitable conclusion that all bodies must be elastic, and therefore must have parts, contrary to the central thesis of atomism. He thus concludes that “no body is so small that it is without elasticity, and furthermore … there are no elements of bodies … nor are there little solid globes … both determinate and hard. Rather, the analysis proceeds to infinity” (SD.II.45/AG 132–133).
Another line of argument offered by Leibniz against material atomism highlights a tension with what might be called his “principle of plentitude.” That principle, grounded in Leibniz's broader theological and metaphysical views, maintains that existence itself is good, and as a consequence God creates as much being as is consistent with the laws of logic and his own moral goodness. Naturally, Leibniz sees the principle of plentitude as being inconsistent with the existence of a barren void or interspersed vacua:
[T]o admit the void in nature is ascribing to God a very imperfect work … I lay it down as a principle that every perfection which God could impart to things, without derogating from their other perfections, has actually been imparted to them. Now let us fancy a space wholly empty. God could have placed some matter in it without derogating, in any respect, from all other things; therefore, he has actually placed some matter in that space; therefore, there is no space wholly empty; therefore, all is full. (G VII.378/AG 332)
Interestingly, Leibniz uses the principle of plentitude not only to argue against the atomists’ postulation of empty space, but also against the possibility of simple indivisible atoms themselves. For, Leibniz argues, no matter how small one imagines atoms to be, as long as they are reckoned internally simple and homogenous, the world could still contain more variety, richness, and being if they were more finely divided. He thus draws the characteristic conclusion that “The least corpuscle is actually subdivided in infinitum and contains a world of other creatures which would be wanting in the universe if that corpuscle were an atom, that is, a body of one entire piece without subdivision” (G VII.377–378/AG 332).
A third, somewhat obscure, but especially intriguing line of argument takes off from a position defended by Descartes in his Principles of Philosophy and touches on Leibniz's work on the so-called “Labyrinth of the Continuum.” In the Principles, Descartes had argued that (i) the world is a plenum, (ii) all motion in a plenum must be circular, and (iii) such circular motion presupposes the “infinite, or indefinite, division of the various particles of matter” as they adjust and shift to accommodate a continuous flow around bends and through narrows (AT VIIIA.59/CSM 1:239). Concerning these propositions, Leibniz approvingly remarks, “What Descartes says here is most beautiful and worthy of his genius, namely, that every motion in filled space involves circulation and that matter must somewhere be actually divided into parts smaller than any given quantity” (L 393). But whereas Descartes had insisted only on the “indefinite” division of “merely some part of matter” (AT VIIIA.60/CSM 239) Leibniz pushes for a stronger conclusion. Dismissing Descartes's cautious “indefinite division” as “being not in the thing, but in the thinker,” he takes the argument to show that every part of matter is actually infinitely divided (A VI.ii.264). Similarly, rather than apparently restricting the infinite division of matter to some select moving parts, Leibniz maintains that every part of matter is everywhere moving, and so the sort of accommodation envisioned by Descartes must occur everywhere (A. 6.3.565f; 6.3.58f). Thus, for Leibniz, not only are some parts of matter actually infinitely divided, but every part of matter is divided to infinity (Levey 1998, fn6)!
The actual infinite division of all matter is, of course, sufficient to rule out any standard picture of material atomism since any body that might lay claim to being an indivisible atom would itself be actually subdivided into smaller sub-bodies. But Leibniz is not done. Even more radically, he argues that Descartes's initial considerations lead not “merely” to the conclusion that there are no smallest bodies, but furthermore show that strictly speaking no determinate shapes can be ascribed to bodies at all.
[W]ith respect to shape, I uphold another paradox, namely, that there is no shape exact and real, and that neither sphere, nor parabola, nor other perfect shape will ever be found in body… . One will always find there inequalities to infinity. That comes about because matter is actually subdivided to infinity. (translated, Sleigh 1990, 112)
Although how to best interpret Leibniz's arguments for the ideality of exact shape — and indeed how to best interpret his admittedly paradoxical conclusion — remains open for debate, the general idea here seems clear enough. While mechanistic physics appeals to exact shapes like cubes, spheres and hooks, the actual infinite division of matter reveals that these can be at best approximations of the shapes of real bodies. For the shapes of real bodies must — again at best — be infinitely complex since they are everywhere divided into bodies actually distinct in virtue of their differing accommodating motions. Although Leibniz's conclusion is especially bold and enigmatic, it is nonetheless not untypical for him in suggesting that mechanism carefully thought through points towards a radically different underlying metaphysical reality.
Leibniz allied himself with Descartes and most later Cartesians in opposing material atomism. Nonetheless he was equally concerned to rebut the Cartesian account of matter according to which the whole essence of matter is extension — that is, the thesis that matter is something like geometrical extension made concrete. Although Leibniz characteristically offers a wide range of arguments against the Cartesian identification of matter with extension, it will perhaps best serve our purposes to focus on three especially important arguments all rooted in the guiding idea that the notion of extension is simply too impoverished to provide an intelligible foundation for physics.
The first of these arguments presses on the relationship between the nature of matter and the laws of motion. Leibniz, in effect, argues that the thesis that the whole essence of matter is extension saddles Cartesians with a dilemma: they must either hold that the laws of motion are grounded in the nature of extension, or that God acts directly to bring about the lawful regularities that are observed in the world. Leibniz maintains that the first horn is inconsistent with the true laws of motion, while the second horn leads to the untenable postulation of perpetual miracles. In order to better appreciate Leibniz's line of reasoning here, it might be worth unpacking a little his thinking with respect to each horn of the dilemma.
Behind Leibniz's rejection of the first horn lies the assumption that if bodies were nothing but matter, and matter nothing but extension, then bodies would be wholly and essentially passive. But if bodies were wholly and essentially passive, Leibniz reasons, they would necessarily be entirely indifferent to motion, and consequently they would obey radically different laws of motion than the ones we actually observe:
If there were nothing in bodies but extended mass and nothing in motion but change of place and if everything should and could be deduced solely from these definitions by geometrical necessity, it would follow … that upon contact the smallest body would impart its own speed to the largest body without losing any of this speed; and we would have to accept a number of such rules which are completely contrary to the formation of a system. (DM 21/AG 53–54)
There is, of course, some irony in Leibniz's argument here. For, as we noted above, in his early theory of motion Leibniz himself held that bodies offer no resistance to being moved, and thus that it would take no more effort to budge a boulder than a bobby pin. In his later works, however, Leibniz rejects the ideal laws of motion that he had espoused in the TMA, while nonetheless continuing to hold that if matter were indifferent to motion, then the laws of his abstract theory of motion would hold. Leibniz thus concludes that since his early laws of motion do not govern actual bodies, bodies must not be indifferent to motion, and thus must not be — as Descartes had maintained — simply bits of geometrical extension made real.
All of this, of course, might seem to simply put greater pressure on the second horn of Leibniz's dilemma. For it might seem that it is open to Descartes's defenders to maintain that the laws of motion are the result of God's direct decree, and that consequently they do not — as Leibniz seems to assume — follow from the nature of body as such. (Indeed, Descartes himself implies that the laws of motion follow inexorably not from the nature of matter, but rather from the nature of God (AT VIIIA 61–62/CSM 1:240).) For Leibniz, however, such a view is equivalent to conceding that the laws of nature hold by dint of divine miracle since “properly speaking, God performs a miracle when he does something that surpasses the forces he has given to creatures and conserves in them” (Letter to Arnauld, 30 April 1687, G II 93/AG 83). Thus, for Leibniz, a miracle occurs when a creature performs an action that does not flow from its own natural powers, and so bodies could obey laws of motion not grounded in their own natural powers only through the advent of a perpetual miracle. If Leibniz's understanding of miracles is granted, his second horn is thus much harder to resist than one might have otherwise supposed.
Leibniz's second argument focuses on the ability of Cartesian physics to account for qualitative variety in the world. The thesis that the whole essence of matter is extension blocks Descartes from holding that matter is itself intrinsically diverse as well as from supposing that matter is differentially distributed in empty space. Clearly recognizing the constraints imposed by his reductive account of body, Descartes elegantly maintains that all qualitative variety is to be grounded in the motion of bodies, that is, that “All the variety in matter, all the diversity of its forms, depends on motion” (Principles 2:23/CSM 1:232). Qualitative variety amongst bodies for Descartes thus appears to be grounded not in the intrinsic natures of bodies or their parts, but rather in the way in which the parts of bodies move relative to one another. To take an example friendly to Descartes, it might be supposed that the qualitative differences between a block of ice, a puddle of water, and a cloud are to be explained not by appeal to intrinsic differences in the elements that constitute them, nor by appeal to the density of their elements in space, but rather in terms of the relative speeds holding between those elements. One might thus imagine — incorrectly of course — that the hardness of ice depends only on water molecules being at rest with respect to one another, the fluidity of water only on water molecules moving with respect to one another at a moderate speed, and the etherealness of a cloud only on water molecules moving with an extreme relative speed.
Leibniz's ingenious attack on this Cartesian model of qualitative variety proceeds in two steps. The first step charges that motion alone is unable to account for qualitative variety at an instant: since all qualitative variety in the Cartesian system depends on motion, and there is no motion in an instant, it follows that in a Cartesian world there could be no qualitative variety at an instant. The second step of Leibniz's argument charges that if the world is qualitatively homogenous at every instant, then it must be qualitatively homogenous over time as well. For if the world is qualitatively undifferentiated at each instant, then every instant will be qualitatively identical, and so the world as a whole will not undergo any qualitative change as it passes from one instant to the next. To use an anachronistic analogy, the two steps taken together imply that a Cartesian world would be like a filmstrip whose every frame was blank, and thus whose projection would not only be homogenous at each instant, but through time as well.
A third argument, especially important in connection with Leibniz's more general metaphysics, takes issue with the implication that Cartesian bodies — or at least Cartesian matter taken as a whole — might be on a metaphysical par with created minds. Again, it might be helpful to see Leibniz's thinking here as proceeding in two steps. First, drawing on principles integral to his metaphysics, Leibniz insists that independence and unity are marks of true substances. The independence criterion suggests that we can usefully distinguish between created substances that depend only upon God for their existence, and derivative creatures that depend not only upon God but also upon the existence of created substances as well. The unity criterion implies a distinction between creatures that are true, indivisible unities, and creatures that are mere accidental unities, or “aggregates.” Leibniz maintains that only the former have a rightful claim to being genuine created substances, since, as he famously puts it in a letter to Arnauld, “what is not truly one being is not truly one being either” (G II.97/AG 86).
With his two criteria in hand, Leibniz next argues that the bodies of Cartesian physics fail to meet the standards for created substances twice over. For on the one hand, every Cartesian body must be extended and divisible, and so must be composed of parts. But this, Leibniz maintains, is sufficient by itself to show that Cartesian bodies are not fundamental created entities: for if every Cartesian body is composed of parts, then by the independence criterion, the parts will be more fundamentally real than the wholes which they compose. No body whose essence is simply extension could therefore be a genuine created substance according to Leibniz. On the other hand, according to Descartes's physics the only principle available to unite bodies — at least as they are studied by physicists — is motion. But it is clear that Leibniz thinks that the sort of unity that might be provided by mere common motion is insufficient for genuine, substantial unity. Even if an army were to always march in perfect step, it would still not be a unity per se, and thus would not be “truly one being either” (G II 76/AG 79). Thus measured either by the standards of the independence criterion or the unity criterion, Cartesian bodies can be shown to be not fully real in the deepest sense available to created beings. In this thought, Leibniz sees not only an important contrast with human minds — which as partless simples are plausibly independent and unified — but also another indication that mechanistic physics must itself rest on a deeper metaphysical reality quite different from the “manifest image” with which we are familiar from everyday experience.
Much about Leibniz's own positive conception of matter as it is studied by physics can be gleaned from his criticisms of his predecessors. So, for example, his critique of atomism already suggests that Leibnizian bodies must always be flexible or “soft” to some degree, fill every region of the natural world, and be infinitely divisible, indeed, be infinitely divided. Likewise, his critique of the Cartesian conception of matter implies that the properties of bodies are not limited to their passive powers, that bodies must always admit of intrinsic variety, and that ordinary physical objects such as desks and chairs must be ontologically dependent upon a deeper level of metaphysical reality. Nonetheless, we should be able to get an even better grip on Leibniz's positive conception of matter by looking more explicitly at four passive powers, or forces, which he attributes to bodies as they are studied by the physicist.
(1) As we noted above, the physics of the TMA assigns to bodies no resistance to motion, and thus predicts that under idealized conditions it should be no harder to move something massive than something miniscule. In distancing himself from this early view, Leibniz comes to argue that, in fact, matter “resists being moved through a certain natural inertia it has … so that it is not indifferent to motion and rest, as is commonly believed, but requires more active force for motion in proportion to its size” (G IV.510/AG 161). In short, Leibniz came to maintain that bodies have an intrinsic power resistant to motion, which he calls, following Kepler, “natural inertia.” Significantly, Leibnizian natural inertia is a force which is opposed to motion itself, and not merely, as Newton held, to changes in velocity. Thus, while Newton maintains that no active force is required to keep a body moving with a constant velocity under idealized conditions, Leibniz maintains that a body in motion in the absence of any countervailing active force will naturally come to rest.
(2) In addition to offering resistance to motion, Leibniz thought it essential to bodies that they resist mutual collocation — they must be at least to some degree “solid” or impenetrable. In attributing solidity to bodies, Leibniz rejects the Cartesian suggestion that impenetrability simply follows from the property of a body's being extended. For, Leibniz argues, it could be the case that a body's solidity is due to a body's having a certain reluctance — but not an unconquerable one — to share a place with another body, and thus he implies that it is, for example, at least conceivable that two bodies might be forced to overlap in much the same way that we generally imagine bodies and regions of space to mundanely coincide (NE, Book II, Ch. iv). Having distinguished solidity from extension, Leibniz goes on to further distinguish solidity from hardness. He suggests that whereas solidity concerns the ability of a body to resist being collocated with another body, hardness concerns the ability of a body to resist changing its shape or structure. Thus a body, according to Leibniz, might be perfectly solid (i.e. impenetrable) and yet not hard, a point he illustrates by noting that “if two bodies were simultaneously inserted into the two open ends of a tube, into which each of them fitted tightly, the matter which was already in the tube, however, fluid [or ‘soft’] it might be, [the matter] would resist just because of its sheer impenetrability [i.e. ‘solidity’]” (NE, Book II, Ch. iv).
(3) In addition to the (relatively) basic powers of natural inertia and solidity, Leibniz recognizes two further derived passive powers of bodies. The first, which we might call “firmness” or “cohesiveness,” concerns the ability of a body to resist being scattered or torn into pieces. (An egg and a baseball differ not only with respect to their “natural inertia” and impenetrability, but also with respect to their ability to hold themselves together, as it were, under impact.) In the New Essays, Leibniz writes:
But now a new element enters the picture, namely firmness or the bonding of one body to another. This bonding often results in one's being unable to push one body without at the same time pushing another which is bonded to it, so that there is a kind of traction of the second body. Because of this bonding, there would be resistance even if there were no inertia or manifest impetus. For … if space were full of small cubes, a hard body would encounter resistance to its being moved among them. This is because the little cubes — just because they were hard, i.e. because their parts were bonded together — would be difficult to split up finely enough to permit circular movement in which the position being evacuated by the moving body would at once be refilled by something else. (NE Book II, Ch. iv)
Although Leibniz recognizes “firmness” as an important passive power attributable to bodies, like many other mechanists, he is reluctant to posit the existence of primitive attractive forces in nature (SD II.52/AG 136; see also Leibniz's Fifth Letter to Clarke, paragraph 35/Alexander 66). He thus insists that firmness is a derived passive power of bodies since “we should not explain firmness except through the surrounding bodies pushing a body together” (SD II.52/AG 136).
(4) A final passive property of bodies might go without mention if not for the special twist that Leibniz puts on it. Even while arguing against the Cartesian thesis that the whole essence of matter is extension, Leibniz could hardly deny that bodies as they are studied by physicists are extended, or if one prefers, that they have the property of physical extension. Nonetheless, Leibniz intriguingly suggests that physical extension — far from constituting the whole essence of matter — is not even a basic property of bodies. In an informative piece dated to 1702, Leibniz writes:
… I believe that the nature of body does not consist in extension alone … since extension is a continuous and simultaneous repetition … it follows that whenever the same nature is diffused through many things at the same time, as, for example, malleability or specific gravity or yellowness is in gold, whiteness is in milk, and resistance or impenetrability is generally in body, extension is said to have place … From this, it is obvious that extension is not an absolute predicate, but is relative to that which is extended or diffused, and therefore it cannot be separated from the nature of that which is diffused … (G IV.393f/AG 251; see also GP II 269/AG 179, and GP II 183/L 519).
Leibniz thus grants that while physical extension is to be ascribed to the bodies of physics, it is not to be treated as a basic or fundamental property of matter. Rather, physical extension itself is to be understood as a repetition, or distribution, of more basic forces. Leibniz's radical suggestion would, in effect, turn the Cartesian understanding of matter on its head: whereas, for example, Descartes attempted to explain solidity in terms of physical extension, Leibniz proposes to explain physical extension in terms of solidity — a body isn’t solid because it is extended, it is extended because it has the ability to exclude other bodies!
One of the cornerstones of Leibniz's mature physics is to be found in his thesis that the bodies studied by physicists must be viewed not only in terms of passive powers and motion, but also active forces. This section sketches Leibniz's chief physical argument for the postulation of active forces and then looks respectively at the roles that active forces play in his mature physics and how they are related to his deeper metaphysics.
In his Principles of Philosophy, Descartes had argued that the quantity of motion in the world remains constant, where the quantity of motion of a body is determined by its speed times its size. So, for example, at Principles 2:36, Descartes argues that “if one part of matter moves twice as fast as another which is twice as large, we must consider that there is the same quantity of motion in each part; and if one part slows down, we must suppose that some other part of equal size speeds up by the same amount” (AT VIIIA 61/CSM 240). This general conservation principle, which Descartes takes to be grounded in God's immutable nature, in turn serves as the foundation for his three laws of motion as well as his rules of impact.
In a short piece fully and tellingly entitled A Brief Demonstration of a Notable Error of Descartes and Others Concerning a Natural Law, According to which God is Said Always to Conserve the Same Quantity of Motion; a Law which They also Misuse in Mechanics, Leibniz publicly attacked Descartes's conservation principle and thereby the foundations of Cartesian physics (GM VI.117–119/L 296–302). The central argument of the Brief Demonstration is ingenious and elegant, but only deceptively straightforward, and Leibniz continued to develop and expand upon its central theme for many years after its initial public presentation in 1686.
At the heart of Leibniz's main line of argument lie four premises: (1) The amount of force a body acquires in virtue of falling from a certain altitude is equal to the amount of force that would be required to raise that same body to the same altitude. (2) The amount of force a one pound body acquires by falling from a height of four meters is equal to the amount of force a four pound body acquires by falling from a height of one meter. (3) Galileo's Law: the distance traveled by a falling body is directly proportional to the square of the time it falls (i.e. d = at2 where a is a constant); so, to illustrate, a falling body traveling a distance of one meter in one second will travel four meters in two seconds, nine meters in three seconds, and sixteen meters in four seconds, etc. (4) The total amount of force in the world is conserved both locally and globally with the result that there is always as much force in a cause as in its effect.
Using these four premises, Leibniz attempts to establish three principal conclusions. First, he argues that Descartes's quantity of motion is not an adequate measure of force. To see this, suppose that a four pound brick falls from a height of one meter in one second. Its quantity of motion = 1 m/s × 4lbs = 4 units. By Galileo's Law it follows that a one pound brick dropped under similar circumstances will travel four meters in two seconds (since the distance traversed is proportional to the square of time). The quantity of motion of a one pound brick falling through a distance of four meters therefore = 2 m/s × 1lbs = 2 units. Since by the second premise the force of the two bodies is equal, but their quantities of motion are unequal, Leibniz concludes that quantity of motion is an inadequate measure of force.
Second, Leibniz is similarly able to argue that the quantity of vis viva (mv2) is an adequate measure of force. For, the quantity of vis viva of the four pound brick falling from a height of one meter = (1m/s)2 × 4 lbs = 1 m/s × 4lbs = 4 units, and the quantity of vis viva of the one pound brick falling from a height of four meters = (2 m/s)2 × 1 lbs = 4 m/s × 1 lbs = 4 units. Thus if force is measured by the quantity of vis viva rather than the quantity of motion the equality of the force acquired by the one pound body during its four meter fall will be equal to the force acquired by the four pound body during its one meter fall.
Third, Leibniz is further able to argue that the quantity of vis viva rather than the quantity of motion is conserved. To see this, suppose that a one pound brick, having been raised to a height of four meters, falls on the end of a teeter-totter imparting a motion to a four pound brick on the other end. Now if the amount of active force is conserved — if there is as much force in the effect as in the cause — then (by the first premise) the brick should be raised to a height of one meter. That being the case, however, it is clear from the preceding demonstrations that the quantity of vis viva but not the quantity of motion will be conserved (since the quantity of motion has decreased from 4 units to 2 units).
It is important to note that the fourth premise plays a crucial role not only in Leibniz's proof, but also in the larger picture of what he takes his proof to show. Early in his career, Leibniz took the principle of the equality of cause and effect to be a necessary truth. Later, however, he came to hold that it is only hypothetically or morally necessary — a contingent feature that must nonetheless be found in the best of all possible worlds (see, for example, G IV 281/L272). From the status of the principle of equality of cause and effect, Leibniz in turn drew two important conclusions, one metaphysical, one methodological. With respect to metaphysics, he took the contingent status of the principle of equality of cause and effect to be evidence that the laws of motion and force are themselves contingent, and thus he argued that the elegance of the laws of nature provides evidence of God's benevolent design of the universe. With respect to methodology, he took the derivation of the conservation of vis viva as confirmation of the utility — indeed the practical necessity — of considerations of divine teleology in making scientific discoveries even in the domain of physics.
In his important summary of his dynamics — generally known by its Latin title “Specimen Dynamicum” — Leibniz distinguishes between two kinds of active force. The first, and most important, is of course vis viva itself. In the context of his physics, vis viva, or “living force,” represents for Leibniz a measure of a body's ability to bring about effects in virtue of its motion. It is an active force which allows a moving body to, say, raise itself up to a given height or impart a motion to a slower body. (Intuitively, we might think of it as the “force” that a bowling ball, for example, has in virtue of its falling with a given speed, or the power a baseball has once released from a pitcher's hand.) As noted above, Leibniz maintains that vis viva is conserved both locally in particular cases of impact, and globally in the created world taken as a whole. The living force a body expends in raising itself to a given height must therefore be equal to the living force it gains by falling from that height; the vis viva a body is able to transfer to another body through impact must be equal to the measurement of vis viva it loses during that impact.
The fact that collisions between actual bodies are never perfectly elastic represents a prima facie objection to the conservation of vis viva. Although the law looks tolerably accurate if we consider the collision of, say, two billiard balls, or two steel spheres, it seems woefully off if we consider, say, the collision of two lumps of clay, or two scoops of ice cream. Indeed, in non-elastic collisions it appears that much — even all — of the active force of the colliding bodies as measured by mv2 may be lost. In addressing this fairly obvious worry, Leibniz returns to the idea that any body — no matter how small — must be composed of infinitely many smaller bodies. He then argues that the apparent loss of vis viva in cases of inelastic collision is to be attributed to the fact that living force has been transferred to the smaller parts of the gross bodies in a way that does not contribute fully to the motion of the whole. It is thus lost in the sense that it does not contribute to the motion of the larger bodies, but it is nonetheless conserved in the deeper sense that it is still present in the motion of the smaller bodies from which the larger bodies are constituted. Leibniz therefore insists, “when the parts of the bodies absorb the force of the impact, as a whole, as when two pieces of rich earth or clay come into collision … when, I say, some force is absorbed by the parts, it is as good as lost … But this loss … does not detract from the inviolable truth of the law of the conservation of the same force in the world. For that which is absorbed by the minute parts is not absolutely lost for the universe, although it is lost for the total force of the concurrent bodies” (GM VI.230/Langley 670).
In his Specimen, Leibniz terms his second postulated active force “vis mortua” or “dead force,” although it also appears in connection with the titles, “solicitation,” “conatus,” and “impetus.” In spite of their correlative labels, the notion of dead force appears to be less carefully worked out by Leibniz than the notion of living force. In the Specimen he tells us:
One force is elementary which I also call dead force, since motion does not yet exist in it, but only a solicitation to motion, as with … a stone in a sling while it is still being held by a rope… . An example of dead force is centrifugal force itself, and also the force of heaviness or centripetal force, and the force by which a stretched elastic body begins to restore itself. But when we are dealing with impact, which arises from a heavy body which has already been falling for some time, or from a bow that has already been restoring its shape for some time, or from a similar cause, the force in question is living force, which arises from an infinity of continual impressions of dead force. (GM VI.238f/AG 121f)
From this passage and surrounding texts, we can glean three central ideas Leibniz associates with the notion of dead force. First, just as we might think of vis viva as a measure of the force a moving body has in virtue of its being in motion, so we might think of vis mortua as a measure of the force a body has to bring about motion even while at rest, or at an instant. Second, living force is related to dead force by an infinite summation; vis viva is, as it were, an infinite accumulation of individual instances of vis mortua. Third, dead force is thus more immediately related to the study of statics than to the study of dynamics, and Leibniz repeatedly suggests that Cartesians have indeed been misled into maintaining the conservation of quantity of motion by confusing the laws of statics with the laws of dynamics.
On some ways of reading of Leibniz's texts, the measure of dead force approaches very closely the measure of force more clearly at work in Newton's Principia. It is therefore worth noting that although he could hardly deny the technical achievement of Newton's masterpiece, Leibniz was nonetheless eager to distance his own thinking about force from that of his great rival's. In a polemical piece whose title has been translated as “Against Barbaric Physics,” Leibniz writes:
It is, unfortunately, our destiny that, because of a certain aversion toward light, people love to be returned to darkness… . That physics which explains everything in the nature of body through number, measure, weight, or size, shape and motion, and so teaches that, in physics, everything happens mechanically, that is, intelligibly, this physics seems excessively clear and easy… . It is permissible to recognize magnetic, elastic, and other sorts of forces, but only insofar as we understand that they are not primitive or incapable of being explained, but arise from motions and shapes. However, the new patrons of such things don’t want this. And it has been observed that in our own times there was a real suggestion of this view among certain of our predecessors who established that the planets gravitate and tend toward one another. It pleased them to make the immediate inference that all matter essentially has a God-given and inherent attractive power and, as it were, mutual love, as if matter had senses, or as if a certain intelligence were given to each part of matter by whose means each part could perceive and desire even the most remote thing. (G VII.337–339/AG 312=313; see also Leibniz's fourth paper to Clarke, paragraph 45/Alexander 43)
The grounds for Leibniz's negative reaction to Newton's conception of force, and specifically his apparent postulation of a universal force of gravitation, are various and complex. One especially important theme, however, indicated in the passage above, concerns what conception of force should be allowed to operate in the study of physics. On the negative side, Leibniz thought that by postulating what he understood to be an irreducible force holding between bodies and acting at a distance, Newton had abandoned the intelligible explanations of the mechanical philosophy, and returned to uninformative scholastic accounts that rested content with the postulation of primitive powers. On the positive side, Leibniz thought that by treating forces as inherent powers of bodies tied inextricably to their ability to move and be moved, his own conception of force could preserve the intelligibility that was the great hallmark of mechanism, while nonetheless improving upon the work of those such as Huygens, Descartes and Galileo. For, by Leibniz's lights, the active and passive forces he postulates not only render physics itself more accurate and consonant with reason but at the same time set the stage for its intelligible grounding in his own deeper metaphysics. In this way, Leibniz's understanding of dynamics becomes inextricably bound up with his more thoroughly metaphysical views to which we must now briefly turn.
If the most important distinction of the Specimen Dynamicum with respect to physics is between active and passive forces, its most important distinction with respect to metaphysics is between what Leibniz calls “primitive” and “derivative” forces. He holds that while derivative forces are of primary interest to the working physicist, they are metaphysically secondary to primitive forces, and he speaks of the former as being “modifications” or “limitations” of the latter (GM VI.236/AG 119). Although the topic of the relationship between derivative and primitive forces quickly takes us away from Leibniz's treatment of physics and into the heart of his metaphysics, it should be worthwhile to at least call attention to this interface where what we are inclined to think of as Leibniz's physics so clearly bumps up against — indeed overlaps with — what we are inclined to think of as his metaphysics.
It is widely accepted that Leibniz's primitive forces are supposed to serve as the intelligible metaphysical grounds for the forces that are of concern in physics, and more specifically that active derivative forces are to be grounded in active primitive forces while passive derivative forces are to be grounded in passive primitive forces. Furthermore, there is no denying that Leibniz sees his distinction between active and passive primitive forces as being in some way analogous to the distinction between Aristotelian form and matter. Thus in the Specimen, he tells us that “primitive [active] force (which is nothing but the first entelechy) corresponds to the soul or substantial form [of the scholastics]” while “the primitive force of being acted upon or of resisting constitutes that which is called primary matter in the schools” (GM VI.236–237/AG 119–120). What has remained less certain is the answer to the question, “Where, as it were, does Leibniz think active and passive primitive forces are located?”
Answering this question is complicated by Leibniz's embrace of the seemingly fantastic thesis that the gross bodies studied in physics are to be understood as being composed of infinitely many organisms:
I am very far removed from the belief that animate bodies are only a small part of the others. For I believe rather that everything is full of animate bodies … and that since matter is endlessly divisible, one cannot fix on a part so small that there are no animate bodies within, or at least bodies endowed with a basic entelechy or … with a vital principle, that is to say corporeal substances, about which it may be said in general of them all that they are living. (G II.118/Garber 1998, 294)
Thus, according to Leibniz, the block of wood that is pushed up an inclined plane, or the ball dropped from a leaning tower must be composed of infinitely many organisms, with each of those organisms being composed of further organisms, etc. These organisms therefore must in some way be counted as more ontologically basic than the gross bodies which they compose.
Drawing on his commitment to panorganicism, his talk of corporeal substances, and his explicit invocation of the Aristotelian notions of form and matter, it has been suggested that in his middle years Leibniz held to an essentially Aristotelian ontology according to which the fundamental level of reality is occupied by organisms composed of substantial forms and matter. As Daniel Garber — the reading's most influential defender — puts the view, it is “a world whose principal inhabitants are corporeal substances understood on an Aristotelian model as unities of form and matter, organisms of a rudimentary sort, big bugs which contain smaller bugs, which contain smaller bugs still, all the way down” (1985, 29). According to this picture, the derivative forces studied by physicists would be grounded in the active and passive natures of the organisms from which they are composed. Organisms strive and are acted upon at the most basic level of ontology, and those strivings and passions serve as the ground for the active and passive derivative forces examined, for example, in collisions between elastic spheres. Although Leibniz's panorganicism remains striking, this picture promises a rather elegant account of the foundations of Leibniz's physics, and squares tolerably well with many of his texts, especially from his middle years.
The “bugs all the way down” model is not, however, the only model of fundamental metaphysics that one can find in Leibniz's writings. In his most mature works, Leibniz suggests that at the deepest level of ontology, we find only truly simple, mind-like substances, or “monads.” Although strictly indivisible, Leibniz insists that monads can nonetheless be thought of as unities of form, insofar as they are active, and matter, insofar as they are passive. According to this metaphysics, the gross bodies studied by physicists are at least twice removed from monadic reality. Gross bodies are grounded in organisms, or “corporeal substances,” while corporeal substances are themselves grounded in simple substances, or “monads.” This same chain of ontological dependence, however, likewise holds for forces: the active forces attributed to gross bodies are “well-founded” in the active forces attributable to organisms, which are “well-founded” on the active forces of monads, just as the passive forces attributable to gross bodies are “well-founded” in the passive forces attributable to organisms, which in turn are “well-founded” on the passive forces of monads. A full understanding of these grounding relations would of course require a more detailed explication of the relations between monads, corporeal substances, and gross bodies, as well as a fuller account of what“grounding” amounts to in this context. Nonetheless, even this rough sketch should suffice to indicate the broad outlines of Leibniz's commitment to founding the active and passive forces he postulates as part of his physics in the most fundamental level of reality which he postulates as part of his most mature metaphysics.
The laws of motion held a privileged place in the mechanical philosophy of the early modern period. Together with bodies they served as the chief explanatory postulates of the new physics. It is thus not surprising that Leibniz held strong views concerning the justification of the laws of motion, the content of those laws, and their implications for the epistemology and metaphysics of motion. In thinking about Leibniz's positive views on the laws of motion, it might prove once again helpful to first look at his reasons for being dissatisfied with the account offered by Descartes.
In addition to maintaining that the quantity of motion in the world is conserved, Descartes held that material bodies are governed by three laws of motion and seven rules of impact (AT VIIIA 62–71/CSM 1:240–245). The first two laws in the Principles concern the movements of bodies in isolation, and taken together constitute Descartes's formulation of the principle of inertia. The third law in the Principles regulates the behavior of bodies colliding under idealized conditions:
When a moving body comes upon another, if it has less force for proceeding in a straight line than the other has to resist it, then it is deflected in another direction, and retaining its motion, changes only its determination. But if it has more, then it moves the other body with it, and gives the other as much of its motion as it itself loses. (AT VIIA.65/CSM 1:242)
Significantly, the third law thus distinguishes between two kinds of cases that Descartes believes to be importantly different. The first kind of case occurs when a moving body with a given power for proceeding collides with another body that has a greater power for resisting. Descartes maintains that in such situations the moving body's direction or determination is altered, but that nonetheless the quantity of motion for each of the colliding bodies remains the same. The second kind of case occurs when a moving body with a given power for proceeding collides with another body that has a lesser power for resisting. Descartes maintains that in such situations, the moving body's determination remains the same, and that the moving body carries the resisting body along with it in such a way that their shared total quantity of motion remains the same. The seven rules further spell out the implications Descartes takes his laws of motion to have for more specific cases of impact.
Although Descartes's laws of motion go beyond his conservation law in placing further constraints on the directions of bodies, they nonetheless presuppose that the total quantity of motion of bodies remains the same. Leibniz is therefore able to argue that Descartes's laws of motion are untenable because they would lead to violations of the conservation of force as measured by mv2. Thus, in a letter to Bayle of 1687, Leibniz introduces, as an example, a case where a ball B moving with 100 degrees of speed collides head on with a ball C moving with 1 degree of speed. Before the collision the two balls collectively have 101 units of quantity of motion as measure by ms, and 10,001 units of vis viva as measured by mv2. According to Descartes's Third Rule, after the collision the two balls should move together in the direction of B with a speed of 50 ½ units. Their quantity of motion will be 101 units as dictated by Descartes's conservation law, but their quantity of vis viva will be 2(50 ½)2 or 5100 ½ units. Leibniz thus objects that Descartes's laws of motion would violate the conservation of vis viva and with it the principle that the whole cause must be equal to the entire effect (G III.46).
In addition to attacking Descartes's laws of motion on the basis of the principle of the equality of cause and effect, Leibniz also maintains that they would violate another “metaphysical” principle, namely, the principle of continuity according to which continuous changes in inputs should lead to continuous changes in outputs. Thus, for example, in a letter to Malebranche of July 1687, Leibniz writes:
I shall not repeat here what I have said before about the other source of [Descartes's] errors, in taking the quantity of motion for the force. But his first and second rules, for example, do not agree with each other. The second says that if two bodies B and C collide in a straight line and with equal velocities, but B is but the least amount greater than C, C will be reflected with its former velocity, but B will continue its motion. But according to his first rule, if B and C are equal and collide in a straight line, both will be reflected and return at a velocity equal to that of their approach. This difference in the outcome in these two cases is unreasonable, however, for the inequality of the two bodies can be made as small as you wish, and the difference between the assumptions in the two cases, that is, the difference between such inequality and a perfect equality, becomes less than any difference; therefore according to our principle, the difference between the effects or consequences ought also to become less than any given difference. (G III.53/L 352)
Leibniz's argument here is that as the sizes of the bodies B and C change continuously from inequality to equality the effects of that change should be continuous as well. Descartes's rules of impact, however, would have an infinitesimal change in input — a change from B's being infinitesimally bigger than C, to C's being equal in size to B — result in a leap of output — from C rebounding while B remains stationary, to both B and C rebounding. Leibniz maintains that Descartes's rules of impact must therefore be false since they violate the principle of continuity.
It is worth noting that, for Leibniz, the significance of the principle of continuity runs deeper than providing yet another reason for thinking that the Cartesian laws of motion are flawed. For him the principle of continuity is a contingent principle of order grounded not in brute necessity, but in divine benevolence — a discontinuous world would not be impossible, but merely sub-optimal. As such, Leibniz takes it to yield further support for the metaphysical and methodological points noted above in connection with his “proof” of the conservation of vis viva. Metaphysically, Leibniz takes the principle of continuity to support the claim that the true laws of motion are contingent since they follow not from God's immutable nature or eternal truths, but rather from God's wisdom and benevolence. Methodologically, he takes it to support once again his view that the most promising route to the discovery of nature's secrets is neither blind empiricism, nor deductive rationalism, but a combination of observation, pure reason, and reflection on the constraints imposed by considerations of the best.
From the perspective of kinematics, there is little new in Leibniz's positive account of the laws of motion. As we have seen, Leibniz's earliest systematic physics sought to accommodate the laws of impact as developed by Huygens and Wren by showing how those results might be derived from more fundamental laws of motion and the structure of the actual world. In his later work, that strategy is replaced by the attempt to show how essentially those same (“concrete”) laws of motion may be derived from a set of three conservation laws. Although Leibniz's contribution to the kinematics of motion and impact was thus not revolutionary, he nonetheless had the good sense to champion the best accounts going, and made them his own through his elegant derivations and by relating them to the broader themes of his dynamics and metaphysics.
One of the conservation laws that Leibniz takes to govern the behavior of material bodies is what he calls the conservation of relative velocity (GM VI.227/Langley 667). According to this principle, two perfectly elastic bodies will maintain the same relative velocity with respect to their common center of gravity before and after collision. That is, letting A and B represent two elastic balls involved in a head on collision:
Velocity A before — Velocity B before = Velocity B after — Velocity A after
or more simply:
VA before — VB before = VB after — VA after
Leibniz suggests that the conservation of relative velocity is rooted in the conservation of the ability of the two colliding bodies to perform work on one another. The guiding idea here seems to be that the ability of, say, the balls A and B to act on one another in virtue of their relative motion, should not be lost at all (at least in idealized cases), so that after a collision they should continue to have the same ability to act on one another as they had before they collided, and thus that they should have the same relative velocity after the collision as they had before.
A second conservation law Leibniz calls the conservation of quantity of progress. According to it, two bodies will maintain the same relative progress — where progress is measured by the quantity of mass (molem) times velocity — before and after collision (GM VI.227/Langley 667). Thus, letting A and B once again represent two balls involved in a head on collision:
(Mass A × VA before) + (Mass B × VB before) = (Mass B × VB after) + (Mass A × VA after)
or more simply:
MAVA before + MB × VB before = MB × VB after + MA × VA after
Leibniz's conservation of progress is closely related to the Cartesian law of conservation of quantity of motion (and the more familiar law of the conservation of momentum). As Leibniz is at pains to emphasize, however, his law differs from the Cartesian law at least in that it traffics in “signed” velocities rather than scalar speeds. Leibniz is thus able to maintain that although “it will be found that the total progress is conserved, or that there is as much progress in the same direction before or after the impact” nonetheless the quantity of motion, as measured simply by speed times mass is not conserved (GM VI.217/Langley 658).
Leibniz's third law applies the conservation of vis viva to cases of impact. It therefore maintains that the “motive” or “living” force, as measured by mass times velocity squared for a pair of bodies is the same before and after collision (GM VI.227/Langley 667–668):
MA (VA)2before + MB × (VB)2 before = MB × (VB)2 after + MA × (VA)2 after
Unlike the quantity of progress, but like relative velocity, the quantity of vis viva appears to be conserved only in elastic collisions. At the macro-level, when a lump of soft clay strikes another lump of soft clay, their momentum is conserved but kinetic energy is lost. As noted above, rather than abandon the universality of his third law, Leibniz suggests instead that energy is conserved but redistributed to the minute parts of which the clay is composed. In this way, he tells us “that which is absorbed by the minute parts is not absolutely lost for the universe, although it is lost for the total force of the concurrent bodies” (GM VI.231/Langley 670).
In his Essay on Dynamics, Leibniz shows how from any two of his conservation laws the third law may be derived. This might suggest that Leibniz sees all three as being on a par with one another. In fact, however, he insists that the conservation of vis viva is more fundamental than the conservation of relative velocity or common progress. His reasons for privileging mv2 in this way are far from clear, but he must have recognized them to be necessarily metaphysical. Although the measurement of mv2 is relative to a choice of reference frame, Leibniz probably thought that it had a better claim to tracking an intrinsic property of bodies in light of the considerations he raises in his Brief Demonstration. For Leibniz, vis viva is a force attributable to particular bodies in virtue of which they are able to perform work on other bodies — or as in the case of a pendulum — on themselves; he thus held the conservation of vis viva to be the most fundamental, overarching conservation law for the physical world.
As far as kinematics is concerned, Leibniz, like most of his contemporaries, accepted the observational under-determination of constant linear motion. That is to say, he granted that — if we bracket considerations of force — there's no saying which of two bodies moving relative to each other with a constant velocity is really moving. So, for example, Leibniz would have conceded that we can’t tell just by looking whether Train A or Train B is really moving, even if they are moving with a constant velocity relative to one another. This observational under-determination or “invariance” — often called Galilean invariance — is still accepted today, although the natural assumption that it makes sense to speak of any body as “really” moving with a constant velocity independently of an arbitrarily chosen frame of reference is not.
Continuing to restrict ourselves to kinematics, Leibniz appears to embrace something even stronger than Galilean invariance. He suggests that not only is constant linear motion observationally underdetermined, but furthermore that “If we consider change in position alone, or that which is merely mathematical in motion,” then all motion is observationally underdetermined (A VI.iv.2017/Lodge 2003, 278). That is to say, he seems to accept that not even accelerations — changes in direction or speed — can be detected by empirical observation. Thus, for example, he writes:
The law of nature concerning the equivalence of hypotheses that we established earlier, namely, that a hypothesis which once corresponds to the present phenomena will always correspond to the subsequent phenomena in that way, is not only true for rectilinear motion but more generally, however the bodies act on one another, just as long as the system of bodies is isolated from others, or no external agent comes along. (GM VI.507/Lodge 2003, 280)
Even if we grant that we cannot tell whether it is our train that is gliding along with a constant velocity or the train that we see through the window, we might nonetheless maintain that we can tell — by, say, the sudden jerk we feel — if our train has just accelerated by increasing its speed, or — because we feel ourselves pushed against the wall — that it is rounding a sharp corner. Leibniz, however, seems to deny this, insisting instead that “no eye, wherever in matter it might be placed, has a sure criterion for telling from the phenomena where there is motion, how much motion there is and of what sort it is, or even whether God moves everything around it, or whether he moves that very eye itself” (AG 91).
From the observational under-determination of all motion considered kinematically, Leibniz infers that if there were nothing more to motion than change of position relative to other bodies, then there would be no real or genuine motion in the world at all. He is thus committed to maintaining that if there were nothing more to motion than relative change of position, then, since motion could be ascribed with equal right to, say, Train A or Train B, then there would be no fact of the matter as to whether Train A or Train B is moving, and thus it would make no sense to say that either Train A or Train B is moving. The suggestion that motion be treated as irreducibly relational — so that motion could be ascribed to Train A relative to one reference frame, and to Train B relative to another reference frame — would have had no attraction for Leibniz, who consistently denied that there are any genuine external relations (i.e. relations that do not wholly supervene on intrinsic properties).
Accepting the observational under-determination of motion understood as mere change of relative position, and finding absurd the consequence that there is no genuine motion in the world, Leibniz denies the premise that there is nothing more to motion than relative change of position. He thus maintains that rather than grant that there is no real motion, “in order to say that something is moving, we will require not only that it change its position with respect to other things but also that there be within itself a cause of change, a force, an action” (G IV.396/L 393). Intuitively, Leibniz's suggestion is that genuine motion requires, in addition to relative change of place, a cause of that relative change. To return to our earlier example, if Train A moves relative to Train B, we should say, according to Leibniz, that Train A really moves if and only if, it is the active cause of their relative motion. Since, for Leibniz, being an active cause, or locus of force, is a non-relativistic property attributable to individual bodies, it is in principle capable of breaking the “equivalence of hypotheses” and thus grounding true or genuine motion.
While force, however, thus provides the necessary metaphysical grounds for the existence of genuine motions, it does not, at least as far as the physicist is concerned, solve the empirical issue of which bodies can be ascribed genuine motion (Garber 1995, 307; but see also Lodge 2003). For, as we have seen, the ascription of force — of vis viva or mv2 — is itself empirically relative to a frame of reference. The postulation of force makes genuine motion possible; it does not tell us which bodies are genuinely in motion and which are moved merely relatively. In practice Leibniz thus counsels that — as in astronomy — “one can hold the simplest hypothesis (everything considered) as the true one” (GM II 184/AG 308). Although the metaphysician can rest assured that true motion must be absolute, the physicist must therefore be content to work with relative motions and simplifying assumptions.
In his Principia, Newton had suggested that the absolute motion of bodies is to be defined relative to absolute space and time, and to be discovered by its properties, causes and effects. Leibniz, as we have just seen, opposed such a view, holding instead that true motions are to be defined with respect to the active forces that he took to be inherent in truly moving bodies. This disagreement between Newton and Leibniz over the nature of true motion surfaced more explicitly in their disagreement over the nature of space and time in the Leibniz-Clarke correspondence. In the five letters he managed to write before his death, Leibniz succeeded in articulating not only his reasons for opposing what he took to be Newton's conception of absolute space and time, but also sketching an alternative picture according to which they are to be understood as abstract systems of relations.
In his correspondence with Leibniz, Clarke defends what has become known as an absolute theory of space and time. The version championed by Clarke on Newton's behalf might briefly be characterized for our purposes as having four central theses. First, space and time are logically and metaphysically prior to physical bodies and events. That is to say, although space and time could exist even if there were no physical bodies or events, the existence of things like planets and flashes could not exist without space and time. Second, physical bodies and events exist within space and time — the beach ball is collocated with a region of space equal to its volume; the explosion endures through a determinate measure of absolute time. Third, although we may distinguish regions, or “parts,” of space and time, neither space nor time strictly speaking are divisible since no region of space or time could be separated, or “pulled apart,” from any other region. Fourth, ontologically speaking, space and time may be identified with attributes of God: infinite space just is the attribute of God's Immensity, while infinite time just is the attribute of God's Eternity.
Leibniz introduces three main lines of attack against the Clarke-Newton conception of absolute space and time. The first line focuses on the suggestion that space and time might be identified with the divine attributes, and on Newton's claim — made in his Optics — that space is, as it were, the sensorium of God. Leibniz, at root, argues that such claims are deeply misleading at best, heretical at worst. Thus, for example, against the suggestion that space might be identified with God's Immensity, he writes to Clarke, “if space is a property of God … space belongs to the essence of God. But space has parts: therefore there would be parts in the essence of God” (Fifth Paper, paragraph 43; G VII.399/Alexander 68). Likewise, he argues that if time were identified with God's Immensity, then we would have to say that since things are in time, they are in God's Immensity, and thus in God's essence, “Strange expressions; which plainly show, that the author [i.e. Clarke] makes a wrong use of terms” (Fifth Paper, paragraph 44; G VII.399/Alexander 68). Finally, from his first letter on, Leibniz seizes on what he takes to be the impious implication of Newton's suggestion that space might in some sense be considered the seat of divine perception or cognition, writing, “Sir Isaac Newton says, that space is an organ, which God makes use of to perceive things by. But if God stands in need of any organ to perceive things by, it will follow, that they do not depend altogether upon him, nor were produced by him” (First Paper, paragraph 3; G VII.352/Alexander 11).
A second, more philosophical, line of attack pivots on Leibniz's commitment to the Principle of Sufficient Reason (PSR). In the present context we can understand PSR as demanding that there be some reason for God's creating the world in one way rather than another since “A mere will without any motive, is a fiction, not only contrary to God's perfection, but also chimerical and contradictory” (Fourth Paper, paragraph 2; G VII.371–2/Alexander 36). Leibniz argues that if the PSR is granted, the apparent possibility of absolute space and time can be undermined. For, on the supposition that God creates the world in an infinite, homogenous, absolute space, there could be no reason for his creating the world oriented in one way with respect to that space rather than another way — that is, there could be no reason to prefer the world situated in one way rather than, say, rotated in space by ninety degrees. Since the supposition of absolute space thus leads to a violation of the PSR, the supposition itself must be rejected as chimerical or confused according to Leibniz. Similarly, on the supposition that God creates the world in an infinite, homogenous, absolute time, there could be no reason for God's creating the world at one time rather than at another time. Again, since the supposition leads to a violation of the PSR, Leibniz maintains that the supposition itself must be rejected as chimerical or confused.
A third line of attack offered by Leibniz against the Newtonian conception of space and time draws on another principle familiar from Leibniz's metaphysics, namely, the Principle of the Identity of Indiscernibles (PII). In the present context we may understand the PII as ruling out the possibility of two things being distinct, but not distinct in virtue of some discernible property. It thus suggests that where we cannot identify a recognizable difference between two things or possibilities, those two are in fact only one — that is, as Leibniz puts it, that “To suppose two things indiscernible, is to suppose the same thing under two names” (Fourth Paper, paragraph 6; G VII.372/Alexander 37). Armed with the PII, Leibniz argues once again that the apparent possibility of absolute space and time can be undermined. For on the supposition of absolute space, the world oriented in one way with respect to space would have to be a distinct possibility from the world oriented in another way with respect to absolute space. But, according to Leibniz, two such purported possibilities would be indiscernible since no being — not even God or an angel — could recognize any difference between them. Leibniz thus concludes that since the supposition of absolute space leads to a violation of the PII, the supposition itself must be rejected. By essentially the same reasoning, Leibniz argues similarly that the apparent possibility of absolute time is also inconsistent with the PII and so too must be rejected as chimerical or confused.
Leibniz's positive account of space and time might be thought of as resting on two primary pillars and being filled out by a number of ancillary theses. The first pillar consists in an alternative model, or conception, of space and time offered in conscious opposition to the Newtonian conception absolute space and time. According to Leibniz, space and time are not so much things in which bodies are located and move as systems of relations holding between things. He thus famously tells Clarke in his Third Paper:
As for my own opinion, I have said more than once, that I hold space to be something merely relative, as time is, that I hold it to be an order of coexistences, as time is an order of successions. (Third Paper, paragraph 4; G VII.363/Alexander 25–26)
The main idea is perhaps illustrated more intuitively by a helpful example that Leibniz introduces in his Fifth Paper. There he suggests that space and time are analogous to a family tree. Unlike the relationship between, say, a mighty oak and its leaves, a genealogical tree is not something which exists as a thing independently of, and prior to, its members, but is itself rather something like an abstract system of relations holding between brothers, sisters, parents, children, aunts, uncles, etc. Analogously for Leibniz, space and time are not to be thought of as containers in which bodies are literally located and through which they move, but rather as an abstract structure of relations in which actual (and even possible) bodies might be embedded.
The second pillar of Leibniz's positive account of space and time is rooted in his view that — even understood as systems of relations — space and time as “beings of reason” are in a sense at least two steps removed from the monads of his mature metaphysics. (i) Although bodies may be held to stand in spatial and temporal relations to one another, Leibniz claims, space and time themselves must be considered abstractions or idealizations with respect to those relations. For while relations between bodies and events are necessarily variable and changing, the relations constituting space and time must be viewed as determinate, fixed, and ideal. (ii) As we have briefly noted, however, according to Leibniz's most mature metaphysics, physical bodies and events are themselves to be understood as merely well-founded phenomena. Relations of relative distance and duration holding between bodies must therefore themselves be a step removed from monadic reality, and thus space and time must be, as it were, a second step removed from the most basic non-relational entities of Leibniz's most mature metaphysics. In spite of this double relation holding between ideal space and time on the one hand and monadic reality on the other, Leibniz nonetheless insists that ideal space must be intelligibly related to the various perceptions by which monads represent the world, each from its own “point of view,” just as ideal time must be intelligibly related to the various appetites in accordance with which monads sequentially unfold in synchronized harmony. Although the details of this intelligible grounding story remain less than perspicuous, there can be no doubt that Leibniz saw his relationalism about space and time as dovetailing with the foundations of his monadic metaphysics.
Beyond arguing that space and time are ideal systems of relations, Leibniz also defends a number of less central theses that help to flesh out his positive conceptions of space and time. For our purposes it might be worth quickly calling attention to three of the most significant. First, although he takes space and time to be ideal systems of relations, Leibniz nonetheless insists that they are conceived of as infinite. In doing so he takes a characteristically intermediate position, partially siding with most early moderns in rejecting the notion of an imaginary space surrounding a finite cosmos, but also partially siding with earlier medieval thinkers in affirming that “Since space is itself an ideal thing … space out of the world must needs be imaginary [but] … The case is the same with empty space within the world; which I also take to be imaginary” (Fifth Paper, paragraph 33; G VII.396/Alexander 64). Second, Leibniz maintains that although the existence of empty space is possible — logically speaking, two bodies could exist at a spatial distance with nothing between them — nonetheless it is morally certain that the actual world is a plenum. For, as we have already noted in connection with his critique of atomism, Leibniz maintains the existence of empty space would be inconsistent with God's decision to create the best of all possible worlds. Third, in spite of his critique of Newton, Leibniz affirms that space and time are continuous, homogenous, and infinitely divisible (although not actually divided to infinity). He holds that the ascription of such properties to space and time is only possible once they are recognized to be ideal, or “imaginary,” and in this way Leibnizian space and time are further distinguished not only from Newtonian absolute space and time, but also from extended Leibnizian bodies.
|[A]||German Academy of Sciences, ed., Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz: Sämtliche Schriften und Briefe, Darmstadt and Berlin: Akademie Verlag, 1926-. Reference is to series, volume and page.|
|[AT]||Oeuvres de Descartes, eds., Charles Adam and Paul Tannery, Paris: J. Vrin, 1964–74. Reference is to volume and page.|
|[G]||C. I. Gerhardt, ed., Die philosophischen Schriften von Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz, Berlin: Weidmann, 1875–90; reprinted Hildesheim: Georg Olms, 1965. Reference is to volume and page.|
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|[Alexander]||H. G. Alexander, ed., The Leibniz-Clarke Correspondence, Manchester: Manchester University Press.|
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|[CSM]||The Philosophical Writings of Descartes, ed. and trans., J. Cottingham, R. Stoothoff, and D. Murdoch, 2 vols. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1985. Reference is to volume and page.|
|[FW]||R. Franks and R. Woolhouse, G. W. Leibniz: Philosophical Texts, New York, Oxford University Press, 1998.|
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|[Langely]||Langely, Alfred G. 1949. New Essays Concerning Human Understanding together with An Appendix of Some of His Shorter Pieces, La Salle, Illinois: The Open Court Publishing Company).|
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