The Greek tradition regarded Leucippus as the founder of atomism in ancient Greek philosophy. Little is known about him, and his views are hard to distinguish from those of his associate Democritus. He is sometimes said to have been a student of Zeno of Elea, and to have devised the atomist philosophy in order to escape from the problems raised by Parmenides and his followers.
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Leucippus is variously said to have been born in Elea, Abdera or Miletus (DK 67A1). His dates are unknown, other than that he lived during the fifth century BCE. Diogenes Laertius reports that he was a student of Parmenides' follower Zeno (DK 67A1). Zeno is best known for paradoxes suggesting that motion is impossible because a magnitude can be divided into an infinite number of parts, each of which must be traversed; the fact that atomism is thought to have been formulated in response to these arguments may account for the story that Leucippus was a student of Zeno.
The extent of Leucippus' contribution to the developed atomist theory is unknown. His relationship to Democritus, and even his very existence, was a subject of considerable controversy in nineteenth century scholarship (Graham 2008). Most reports on early Greek atomism refer to the views of Democritus alone, or to both atomists together; Epicurus seems even to have denied that there was a philosopher Leucippus (DK 67A2). Aristotle certainly ascribes the foundation of the atomist system to Leucippus. Leucippus is sometimes said to have been the author of a work called the Great World-System; one surviving quotation is said to have come from a work On Mind.
Leucippus is named by most sources as the originator of the theory that the universe consists of two different elements, which he called ‘the full’ or ‘solid,’ and ‘the empty’ or ‘void’. Both the void and the solid atoms within it are thought to be infinite, and between them to constitute the elements of everything. Because little is known of Leucippus' views and his specific contributions to atomist theory, a fuller discussion of the developed atomist doctrine is found in the entry for Democritus.
Early Greek atomism is generally taken to have been formulated in response to the Eleatic claim that ‘what is’ must be one and unchanging, because any assertion of differentiation or change within ‘what is’ involves the assertion of ‘what is not,’ an unintelligible concept. While Parmenides' argument is difficult to interpret, he was understood in antiquity to have forced philosophers after him to explain how change is possible without supposing that something comes from ‘what is not,’ i.e. nothing. Aristotle tells us that Leucippus tried to formulate a theory that is consistent with the evidence of the senses that change and motion and a multiplicity of things exists in the world (DK 67A7). In the atomist system, change only occurs at the level of appearances: the real constituents of being persist unchanged, merely rearranging themselves into new combinations that form the world of appearance. Like Parmenidean Being, the atoms cannot change or disintegrate into ‘what is not’ and each is a solid unit; nonetheless, the combinations of atoms that form the world of appearance continually alter. Aristotle cites an analogy to the letters of the alphabet, which can produce a multitude of different words from a few elements in combinations; the differences all stem from the shape (schêma) of the letters, as A differs from N; by their arrangement (taxis), as AN differs from NA; and by their positional orientation (thesis), as N differs from Z (DK 67A6).
Leucippus also reportedly accepted the Eleatic Melissus' argument that void is necessary for motion, but took this to be evidence that, since we experience motion, there must be void (DK 67A7). The reason for positing smallest indivisible magnitudes is also reported to be a response to Zeno's argument that, if every magnitude could be divided to infinity, motion would be impossible (DK 29A22). Leucippus is reported to hold that the atoms are always in motion (DK 67A18). Aristotle criticizes him for not offering an account that says not only why a particular atom is moving (because it collided with another) but why there is motion at all. Because the atoms are indestructible and unchangeable, their properties presumably stay the same through all time.
As Diogenes Laertius reports Leucippus' cosmology, worlds or kosmoi are formed when groups of atoms combine to form a cosmic whirl, which causes the atoms to separate out and sort by like kind. A sort of membrane of atoms forms out of the circling atoms, enclosing others within it, and creating pressure by whirling. The outer membrane continually acquires other atoms from outside when it contacts them, which take fire as they revolve and form the stars, with the sun in the outermost circle. Worlds are formed, grow and perish, according to a kind of necessity (DK 67A1).
One direct quotation preserved from Leucippus says that nothing happens in vain (matên) but everything from logos and by necessity (DK 67B2). This has been found puzzling, since the reference to logos might seem to suggest that things are ruled by reason, an idea that Democritus' system excludes. Either Leucippus' system is different in this respect from that of Democritus, or the reference to logos here cannot be to a controlling mind. Barnes takes there to be no grounds for preferring either interpretation (Barnes 1984), but Taylor argues that Leucippus' position is that an account (or logos) can be given of the causes of all occurrences (Taylor 1999, p. 189). There is nothing in other reports to suggest that Leucippus endorsed the idea of a universal intelligence governing events.
Aristotle frequently pairs Leucippus and Democritus in his reports, including his account of the motivation for positing atoms and void. In particular, Aristotle associates Leucippus as well as Democritus with the deliberately paradoxical assertion that ‘being is no more than not-being,’ i.e., that void exists as much as the full or solid (DK 67A6). Schofield (2002) has argued that the more careful account in Simplicius shows that the ou mallon or ‘no more’ doctrine is due to Democritus. Following this lead, Graham (2008) suggests a new reading of Leucippus, wherein the distinction between atom and void is actually based on a reading of Parmenides' Doxa, his cosmological account. Rather than logical abstractions, Being and Not-being, Leucippus' atoms would in essence be based on Parmenides' cosomological contraries, night and light. If this line of interpretation is followed, Leucippus' notion of atom and void might have been rather different from Democritus', and Aristotle's tendency to refer to the two in conjunction somewhat misleading.
The standard scholarly edition of the ancient reports concerning the views of the Presocratic philosophers is Diels-Kranz' work (cited as DK): H. Diels and W. Kranz, Die Fragmente der Vorsokratiker, 6th edition, Berlin: Weidmann, 1951. For an English translation and commentary: C.C.W. Taylor, The Atomists: Leucippus and Democritus. Fragments, A Text and Translation with Commentary, Toronto: University of Toronto Press, 1999. See also the report on Leucippus in: Diogenes Laertius, Lives of Eminent Philosophers (Loeb Classical Library), R.D. Hicks (trans.), Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1925, book 9.30–33.
- Bailey, Cyril, 1928, The Greek Atomists and Epicurus, Oxford: Clarendon.
- Barnes, Jonathan, 1982, The Presocratic Philosophers , rev. ed., London and New York: Routledge.
- –––, 1984, ‘Reason and Necessity in Leucippus,’ in Linos G. Benakis (ed.), Proceedings of the First International Congress on Democritus (Volume 1), Xanthi: International Democritean Foundation, pp. 141–58.
- Furley, David J., 1967, Two Studies in the Greek Atomists, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
- –––, 1987, The Greek Cosmologists vol 1: The Formation of the Atomic Theory and its Earliest Critics, Cambridge: Cambridge University PRess.
- Graham, Daniel, 2008. ‘Leucippus' Atomism,’ in Patricia Curd and Daniel W. Graham (eds.), The Oxford Handbook of Presocratic Philosophy, Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 333–352.
- Kirk, G.S., J.E. Raven and Malcolm Schofield, 1957, The Presocratic Philosophers, second edition, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- McKirahan, Jr., Richard D., 1994, Philosophy Before Socrates: An Introduction with texts and Commentary, Indianapolis: Hackett.
- Schofield, Malcolm, 2002, ‘Leucippus, Democritus and the ou mallon Principle: An Examination of Theophrastus Phys. Op. Fr. 8,’ Phronesis, 47(3): 253–63.
- Taylor, C.C.W., 1999, ‘The Atomists,’ in A.A. Long (ed.), The Cambridge Companion to Early Greek Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 181–204.
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I wish to thank the ancient philosophy editor John Cooper, A.P.D. Mourelatos and Tim O'Keefe for helpful comments and suggestions.