Supplement to David Lewis's Metaphysics

Physicalism

It is a much bigger deal than has been recognized that the space of perfectly natural relations must, apparently, encompass more than just the spatiotemporal relations (and not just in some possible world, but in the actual world). Seeing why will both showcase some of the power Lewis's conception of fundamental ontology has in shaping and clarifying metaphysical debates, and highlight a centrally important question that he has (perhaps unintentionally) bequeathed to us.

Part of Lewis's reductionist aspirations include a rock-solid commitment to physicalism—a commitment, of course, that is about as close to a bit of orthodoxy as one will find in contemporary philosophy:

Roughly speaking, Materialism [= physicalism] is the thesis that physics—something not too different from present-day physics, though presumably somewhat improved—is a comprehensive theory of the world, complete as well as correct. The world is as physics says it is, and there's no more to say. (1999, pp. 33–34)

Many questions arise when one tries to make this rough statement of physicalism precise. We'll focus on just one. So suppose that, as a first step towards precision, we take physicalism to entail that the only perfectly natural properties are physical properties.[9] (Perfectly natural properties that are actually instantiated—the physicalism we are trying to define is meant to be, or least to be allowed to be, a contingent thesis.) Then our question is obvious: What makes a property a physical property? Without a substantive answer, physicalism must remain a mere framework for a doctrine—and not something with immediate, and allegedly profound, consequences for the nature of the mind, or of ethics, etc.

It won't do to say that physical properties are those recognized by contemporary physics, since that physics may be wrong—and at any rate, we should hope for broader scope for our thesis than that. Nor is reference of the sort Lewis makes to a physics “not too different from present-day physics” acceptable: in general, to point to the properties recognized by present-day physics and say only that physical properties are “relevantly like those” is, however popular a strategy, nothing more than an abdication of philosophical responsibility.

There is a deeper issue. What, after all, distinguishes the discipline of physics from other sciences? Just this: Physics is the one discipline that aims at producing a correct and complete theory of the world—complete, not in the sense that it includes chemistry, biology, etc. as parts, but in the sense that it describes those aspects of concrete reality to which all other aspects (hence chemistry, biology, etc.) reduce. It will posit whatever entities, properties, and relations it needs to do the job—including, if necessary, those whose existence a card-carrying “physicalist” would reject.

So physicalism cannot, on pain of triviality, be taken to require that the perfectly natural properties and relations that characterize our world are restricted to those that would be posited by a successful physics. It must, instead, be viewed as incorporating a substantive and independently specified constraint on what those properties and relations could turn out to be.

To illustrate the point, imagine a vitalist who defends her view as physicalistically respectable in the following way: “Yes, I believe that living things differ from non-living things in a fundamental, irreducible respect. And I am no epiphenomenalist about this difference: that something is alive matters tremendously to, for example, how it moves. But I am still a physicalist in good standing. For I believe that every concrete thing, living or non-living, is exhaustively composed of particles, and that its intrinsic state at any moment is completely specified by specifying the state—the physical state—of this system of particles. It is just that it is possible to have two systems of particles in different physical states, even though there is a one-one mapping f(•) from the particles in one system to the particles in the other such that (i) for every particle p in the first system, p and f(p) are in the same (single-particle) physical state; (ii) for every sequence of particles <p1, …, pn> taken from the first system, <p1, …, pn> and < f(p1), …, f(pn)> instantiate exactly the same spatiotemporal relations. In the language of ‘perfectly natural properties and relations’, I can put the point in this way: I believe in perfectly natural relations among particles that are not spatiotemporal relations. (So I am still just as much of a metaphysical reductionist as Lewis, for I too hold that all facts about the world are determined by the pattern of instantiation of perfectly natural properties and relations among the fundamental particulars.) My vitalism consists precisely in the thesis that some particles can be related in a way that is not determined by the monadic, perfectly natural properties these particles instantiate, together with their spatiotemporal relations to one another. I call this being related lifewise.

Why isn't vitalism, so understood, perfectly compatible with physicalism, as understood by the legions of contemporary philosophers who subscribe to it? Not because our vitalist believes in non-physical properties or relations; for if she is correct, and physics does its job right, then physics will come to recognize, and develop theories of, these properties or relations: doing so, after all, is just part of its writ. Nor can it be said that she denies that facts about life reduce to (or supervene on, if you like) microphysical facts. This complaint might seem apt, if she insists on characterizing life as a perfectly natural property, typically had only by sums of particles; one might then suspect that she posits irreducible facts that are not facts about particles (but rather about particle-sums). But she has deftly avoided this complaint by insisting that it is an irreducible fact about particles that some of them are related lifewise.

If Almost-Lewis had been right to put forth the fifth thesis—that the only perfectly natural relations are spatiotemporal ones—as a necessary truth, then we would have had a ready answer to vitalism: it is, at least as set forth above, necessarily false. And even if we had not wished to side with Almost-Lewis—because, specifically, we considered vitalism to be merely contingently false—we might have hoped to use his position as inspiration for the needed substantive characterization of physicalism: Physicalism, so the story might have gone, entails that the only perfectly natural relations instantiated in our world are spatiotemporal ones (never mind that other worlds feature additional perfectly natural relations). That characterization is clear and substantive enough to do real philosophical work, while respecting the typical physicalist's desire to be seen as putting forth a contingent thesis.

In fact, however, we face a dilemma. For, as noted, quantum mechanical entanglement pretty clearly establishes that Almost-Lewis's position is false. But as far as I know, no one takes it to establish that physicalism is false—certainly, Lewis himself did not. But then one wonders what the content of Lewis's (and everyone else's) physicalism really is. At all events, here is a proposal: Physicalism should be construed as entailing a constraint on what perfectly natural relations there are. (For if it doesn't, then as we have seen it will be too weak even to rule out vitalism.) Taking it as non-negotiable that spatiotemporal relations are perfectly natural, the question then becomes this: What other sorts of relations can be admitted as perfectly natural, without violating physicalism? Almost-Lewis provided the simplest answer: No others. That won't do, and so we need a fallback answer. I take it to be an important piece of unfinished business in Lewis's metaphysical program—important even for those who do not subscribe to that program—to figure out what that fallback answer should be.

Copyright © 2010 by
Ned Hall <ehall@fas.harvard.edu>

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