Supplement to David Lewis's Metaphysics

Reduction

Consider a pair of reductive claims, one scientific, the other more philosophical:

  • Facts about whether a physical object is alive reduce to facts about its chemical structure.
  • Facts about what causes what reduce to facts about what happens, together with facts about the fundamental laws of nature that govern what happens.

Both claims are plausible (the first overwhelmingly so). But that pesky verb “reduce” might prompt concern. You might worry that, left unanalyzed, the notion of “reduction” is too unclear and slippery to be put to serious philosophical work. And if you are Lewis, you will have an additional worry, since you wish to see no unanalyzed modal notions appear as primitives in your system (and you have the reasonable suspicion that “reduction” is a modal notion). So we should consider whether there is a way to analyze “the X-facts reduce to the Y-facts” that will dispel these worries.

Start with the obvious strategy: state the thesis in question as a supervenience claim—to wit, the claim that the X-facts supervene on the Y-facts—and proceed to define “supervenience” in the usual modal terms, e.g. by saying that the X-facts supervene on the Y-facts iff no two possible worlds differ with respect to the X-facts without differing with respect to the Y-facts. (See e.g. Lewis 1986e, chapter 1; and Stalnaker 1996.) In that way, it might seem, we can avoid unexplained talk of “reduction”: the core idea would now be that no two possible worlds differ at all without differing in their fundamental structure. (And note that for Lewis, talk of possible worlds can itself be analyzed away in non-modal terms.)

That won't do, for three reasons. The first reason is well-known: the notion of reduction we want is, logically speaking, asymmetric, whereas the foregoing notion of supervenience isn't. This problem subdivides. Begin with a purely conceptual point: we would like our understanding of “reduce to” to be such that it is a purely logical or analytical consequence of, for example, the claim that facts about tables reduce to facts about spacetime points, that facts about spacetime points do not reduce to facts about tables. There is nothing in the logic of supervenience that guarantees this consequence. Now, we might respond to that problem simply by analyzing reduction as asymmetric supervenience. But successful though that maneuver is at handling the purely conceptual problem, it runs afoul of a more substantive point, which is that there are cases where we would like to say there is reduction, but in which supervenience is symmetric.

As an artificial example, consider a square grid of pixels, each of which can be dimmed or lit. Stipulate that the total number of pixels N is odd. The relevant space of “possibilities” will simply be the 2N possible distributions of lit and dimmed pixels. Consider the N propositions each of which states, for a given pixel, that that pixel is lit; let the Y-facts be the facts about which of these propositions are true. Consider the N(N-1)/2 propositions each of which states, for a given pair of pixels, that those pixels are in the same state (both lit or both dimmed). Consider the N+1 propositions, the first of which states that no pixels are lit, the second of which states that exactly one pixel is lit, etc. Let the X-facts be the facts about which propositions of these latter two sorts are true. It would seem natural to say that the X-facts reduce to the Y-facts: the fact, concerning any pair of pixels, as to whether they are in the same state is surely nothing over and above the particular facts about those pixels' states; the fact, concerning the totality of pixels as a whole, is surely nothing over and above the particular facts about each pixel's state.[7] And we quite obviously have supervenience of the X-facts on the Y-facts: there could be no difference with respect to which pixels were in the same state, and what the total number of lit pixels was, without some difference with respect to which individual pixels were lit. But we also have, almost as obviously, supervenience in the other direction. To see this, observe that if we are given all the X-facts aside from the facts about how many pixels are lit, we can quickly deduce that the grid as a whole must be in one of two possible states: Begin with pixel 1. From the assumption that it is lit, the state of every other pixel follows from the X-facts; likewise from the assumption that it is dim. But given that N is odd, these two states must differ as to how many pixels are lit. So the remaining X-facts pin down the state exactly. So there can be no difference with respect to the Y-facts (i.e., with respect to which pixels are lit), without a difference with respect either to which pixels have the same state, or to what the total number of lit pixels is. But the fact that we have supervenience—indeed, of a particularly strong kind, given that the derivation of the Y-facts from the X-facts is purely logical—does nothing to suggest that we don't have reduction of the X-facts to the Y-facts (and, of course, no such reduction running in the other direction).

Just as we can have reduction without asymmetric supervenience, so too we can have asymmetric supervenience without reduction. I will offer three examples. First, suppose the fundamental physical laws of our world are deterministic. Let the X-facts be the facts about the state of the world at some specific future time t; let the Y-facts be the facts about the state of the world at some early time t0, together with the facts about the fundamental laws. Given determinism, no world could differ from ours with respect to its t-state without differing with respect to either its t0-state, or the laws. But a world could easily differ with respect to the Y-facts without differing with respect to the X-facts: such a world might have a different t0-state, together with different laws—ones that allow that early state to evolve into the actual t-state. So we have asymmetric supervenience of the X-facts on the Y-facts. But this does absolutely nothing to show that the facts about our world's t-state somehow reduce to, or are nothing over and above, the facts about its t0-state and laws.

One might complain that we have the wrong kind of supervenience here: while it is true that no world could differ from ours with respect to its t-state without differing with respect either to its t0-state or laws, it doesn't follow—and seems clearly false—that no two worlds could differ with respect to their t-states without differing with respect to either their t0-states or laws. Perhaps this stronger supervenience claim holds the key to understanding reduction.

The next two examples suggest otherwise. The first begins with a controversial assumption: that the fundamental laws of our world are metaphysically necessary, so that metaphysical possibility coincides with nomological possibility. Assume, as before, that these fundamental laws are deterministic. This time, let the X-facts be extremely partial facts about the t-state of the world (e.g., whether there are two particles moving at a relative speed greater than such-and-such a threshold, or something like that). Let the Y-facts be facts about the complete physical state of the world at time t0. Given our controversial assumption, we can now say that no two worlds differ with respect to the X-facts without differing with respect to the Y-facts. But given that the X-facts are, as it were, extremely informationally impoverished, it won't be the case that no two worlds could differ with respect to the Y-facts without differing with respect to the X-facts: two distinct t0-states could have, for example, the same consequences with respect to certain broad and not-very-informative claims about goings on at time t. So now we have asymmetric supervenience of the strong kind, without reduction.

Should we blame the controversial assumption about metaphysical possibility? I think not: Those who hold that metaphysical and nomological possibility coincide do not thereby deprive themselves of a perfectly coherent grasp of the notion of “reduction” (according to which, inter alia, facts about the future do not reduce to facts about the past); nor is it particularly plausible that they are working with a conception of reduction fundamentally different from their opponents'. At any rate, the third example skirts this issue. It is this:

Consider four spatial points, A, B, C, and D. Let the distance AB = 5 (in whatever units); BC = 5; CD = 5; and AD = 15. By the triangle inequality, ACAB + BC = 10. Suppose that AC < 10. Then (again by the inequality) ADAC + CD < 15, so AD < 15, which is a contradiction. So AC = 10. Observe what we have shown: the facts about the AB, BC, CD, and AD distances fix the facts about the AC distance. So no world could differ from this one with respect to the AC distance without differing with respect to at least one of the other distances. But the fact that AC = 10 does not reduce to the facts about the other four distances.

As before, we have the weaker form of supervenience—no world could differ from this one in such-and-such a respect without differing in such-and-such other respect—but not the stronger. We can fix that problem at the cost of only a minor complication. Consider the totality of facts about distances between every pair of points, except the pair AC. Let these facts be the Y-facts; let the fact about the AC distance be the sole X-fact. Then no two worlds differ with respect to the X-facts without differing with respect to the Y-facts. From a logical standpoint, that does indeed show that the X-facts are in a certain sense redundant. But it emphatically does not show that they are “nothing over and above” the Y-facts.

We should hold out no hope for an analysis of reduction purely in terms of supervenience. But it does not follow that there is no analysis, nor indeed that there is no analysis partly in terms of supervenience. And, in fact, Lewis's own metaphysical commitments suggest an obvious candidate.[8] Lewis believes in a metaphysical hierarchy of properties and relations. A property or relation gets its place in the hierarchy depending on how “natural” it is. So he could happily say that reduction is supervenience of the less natural on the more natural: the X-facts reduce to the Y-facts just in case the X-facts supervene on the Y-facts, and the properties and relations the Y-facts concern are more natural than those that the X-facts concern.

That's an attractive idea, but how successful it is will turn squarely on how illuminating an account can be given of the “more natural than” ordering on properties and relations. There is some room for doubt here: couldn't it turn out that our grasp of this ordering derives from our prior grasp of such notions as “reduce to”, “holds in virtue of”, “is grounded in”, etc.? (Thus, properties and relations of one kind are more natural than properties and relations of another if the facts about how the latter are instantiated reduce to the facts about how the former are instantiated.) A provisional verdict, then: if Lewis wishes to do without a primitive notion of reduction, then his best bet is to complete a bit of unfinished business, producing an explicit account of the “more natural than” ordering on properties and relations. (See the supplement on uses for the natural/non-natural distinction for more discussion.)

One final comment. As noted, Lewis is a reductionist about modal facts themselves. For example, he holds that facts about which propositions are contingent and which non-contingent reduce to facts about the truth or falsity of propositions at different worlds—where the question of what worlds are, and what it comes to for a proposition to be true at a world, can both be answered in non-modal terms. But if we say that modal facts reduce to non-modal facts, then we cannot mean merely that modal facts supervene on non-modal facts more “natural” than those modal facts. The worry is not one of circularity: for Lewis can define the apparently modal expression “supervene on” in non-modal terms. It is rather that supervenience, in this case, is utterly trivial. Consider the modal facts about which propositions are contingent. For Lewis, no two possible worlds differ with respect to whether a given proposition P is contingent. A fortiori, no two worlds differ in this respect without differing in… any other respect you care to mention. So it is quite empty to say that the modal facts about which propositions are contingent supervene on some more natural, non-modal facts. Thus, for Lewis's reductionist claim about modality to be genuinely informative, it must be understood in some other way. See the (forthcoming) article on Lewis's modal metaphysics for more discussion. (And see also Lewis 1986e, esp. pp. 86ff.)

Copyright © 2010 by
Ned Hall <ehall@fas.harvard.edu>

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