Supplement to David Lewis's Metaphysics

Spacetime Points

Almost-Lewis says that the fundamental entities are spacetime points. Lewis expresses agnosticism, allowing that the fundamental entities may, for all he knows, include spacetime-point-sized particulars that are not themselves spacetime points, but merely occupy such points: “Humean Supervenience … says that in a world like ours, the fundamental relations are exactly the spatiotemporal relations: distance relations, both spacelike and timelike, and perhaps also occupancy relations between point-sized things and spacetime points.” (1994, p. 474; italics added.) It seems, though, that there is much less of a difference here than meets the eye, and that Lewis would have been better off explicitly adopting the more opinionated view of Almost-Lewis.

To see why, we need to focus closely on just what, by Lewis's lights, the “dualist” position comes to. Here is Lewis's characterization:

There are three different conceptions of what the spatiotemporal relations might be. There is the dualist conception: there are the parts of spacetime itself, and there are the pieces of matter or fields or whatnot that occupy some of the parts of spacetime. Then the spatiotemporal relations…consist of distance relations that hold between parts of spacetime; relations of occupancy that hold between occupants and the parts of spacetime they occupy; and, derivatively from these, further distance relations between the occupants, or between occupants and parts of spacetime. (1986e, p. 76.)

It's tempting to think that the “dualist conception”, properly glossed, comprises these theses:

  1. There are two fundamentally different kinds of (fundamental) particulars.
  2. Particulars of the first kind have a nature that renders them capable of entering into spatiotemporal relations with one another; particulars of the second kind do not, and in fact cannot enter into spatiotemporal relations with anything.
  3. Particulars of the second kind have a nature that renders them capable of instantiating perfectly natural monadic properties; particulars of the first kind do not.
  4. There is a special, perfectly natural, asymmetric relation that particulars of the second kind can bear to particulars of the first kind (but not vice versa; nor can particulars of the same kind bear it to each other). This is the occupancy relation.

But this picture can't make any sense, for Lewis. The reason is worth emphasizing, as it highlights yet another distinctive feature of Lewis's metaphysics, which is its thoroughgoing anti-essentialist character. What I have in mind is this: Many philosophers will wish to distinguish between fundamentally different kinds of particulars by way of some sort of doctrine of essences or essential natures. As noted, such a doctrine is highly tempting in the present case: that is, what distinguishes spacetime from stuff in it is that spacetime is a kind of substance with a different essential nature than its occupiers. For example, one might hold that it is part of the essence of a spacetime point that it be part of a manifold of such points, whereas it is no part of the essence of an electron (or electron-time-slice, if you prefer) that it coexist with any other electrons.

But Lewis's official positions in ontology stand squarely in opposition to any such approach to distinguishing particulars. It is not that he lacks any resources to distinguish kinds of particulars: obviously, they can be distinguished by what perfectly natural properties and relations they in fact instantiate. But he cannot go further, and explain why they instantiate the perfectly natural properties and relations they do by appeal to some further distinguishing feature (e.g., their essential natures). Nor can he distinguish them by the manner in which they instantiate properties or relations. For example, he cannot say that what distinguishes spacetime points A and B as such is that they necessarily instantiate whatever spatiotemporal relations they do—as opposed to point-sized occupiers C and D (which, one might grant, instantiate these very same relations, but only accidentally). And that is because, at the level of fundamental ontology, such modal distinctions simply have no place. There is nothing for them to be grounded in.

That is not to say that Lewis cannot make room for de re modal ascriptions; of course he can. We'll see in the companion article how he does so. But we'll also see that he does so in, surprisingly, a thoroughly anti-essentialist manner. To foreshadow: Lewis could, if he liked, say of two spacetime points A and B that they necessarily instantiate the spatiotemporal relations they do; but that would amount to nothing more than a decision to call spacetime points in some other possible world “counterparts” of A and B only if those other points instantiated the same relations as A and B. Such de re modal ascriptions are grounded, according to Lewis, in the way our thought and talk happens to pick out certain counterpart relations among the vast profusion of logically possible ones. As such, they latch onto nothing ontologically deep—certainly, nothing deep enough to be of use in imposing structure on Lewisian fundamental ontology.

So Lewis needs to understand dualism about spacetime and the stuff it contains in a more prosaic manner, e.g. as follows:

  1. There are simple particulars.
  2. Some of them bear spatiotemporal relations to others of them; call any such simple particulars—i.e., any that enter into spatiotemporal relations—“spacetime points”.
  3. Some of them bear a different perfectly natural relation, the “occupancy” relation, to others of them; call any of these—i.e., particulars that bear the occupancy relation to something else—“occupants”.
  4. No simple particular is both a spacetime point and an occupant.
  5. Only occupants instantiate perfectly natural monadic properties.

But even in this toned down form, the view is up to its ears in metaphysically mysterious necessary connections of the kind that Lewis seems at pains to reject, given his broadly combinatorial conception of possibility. (Though the exact sense in which Lewis is a combinatorialist about metaphysical possibility is more subtle than this comment suggests; see the companion article on his modal metaphysics.) The occupancy relation is just a completely different perfectly natural relation from any spatiotemporal relation. So why can't we simply mix and match the two? Why can't something be both an occupant and a spacetime point?

Furthermore, solutions to these puzzles will likely still leave it mysterious what possible motivation there could be for Lewis to admit that in addition to spacetime points, there might be things that occupy them. Physics surely needs no such distinction. And compare a manifestly bizarre view, which says that where we ordinarily say that there is a single electron, there are in fact two entities: one with mass (and no charge), and one with charge (and no mass); it is simply an extra “law” that this pair of entities must remain together, as long as they exist. Whatever virtue there is in remaining agnostic where possible, surely it does not suggest that we take this view seriously. Why, then, ought Lewis to take seriously the parallel view about spacetime points and their occupants? (Though see

Supplement on the Contingency of Humean Supervenience

for one motivation, together with reasons to think it is not nearly strong enough.)

Copyright © 2010 by
Ned Hall <ehall@fas.harvard.edu>

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