Supplement to Location and Mereology

In this document we set out a fragment of the theory of location developed by Casati and Varzi (1999). Their full system includes a topological component (framed in terms of primitive two-place predicate for topological connectedness) that we ignore. It also includes some purely mereological axioms that we ignore. The fragment that will concern us here includes a pair of purely locational axioms (framed in terms of the primitive predicate ‘L(x, y)’ for ‘x is exactly located at y’) and a pair of ‘mereo-locational’ axioms that govern the interaction parthood and exact location. (In this respect the present exposition of Casati and Varzi follows the briefer discussion in Parsons 2007.) The four axioms are:

Functionalityxyz[(L(x, y) & L(x, z)) → y=z]
Nothing has more than one exact location.
Conditional Reflexivityxy[L(x, y) → L(y, y)]
Locations of entities are located at themselves.
Weak Expansivityxyzw[(P(x, y) & L(x, z) & L(y, w)) → P(z, w)]
Any exact location of any part of an entity is a part of any exact location of that entity.
Arbitrary Partitionxyz[(L(x, y) & P(z, y)) → ∃w(P(w, x) & L(w, z))]
If entity x is exactly located at y, then for any part z of y, there is some part w of x that is exactly located at z.
(The labels ‘Weak Expansivity’ and ‘Arbitrary Partition’ are due to Parsons 2007: 223.)

Functionality bans multilocation. It tells us that the exact location relation behaves like a function—nothing bears it to more than one entity. Note that Functionality leaves open the possibility of entities (numbers, properties, propositions, …) that do not have any exact location at all.

Conditional Reflexivity addresses the question ‘Are locations themselves located somewhere?’ According to Conditional Reflexivity, the answer is ‘Yes’. (See also Donnelly (2004: 158), who presents a system in which Conditional Reflexivity is a theorem, though she replaces the location predicate ‘L’ with a primitive function symbol ‘r’ for ‘the exact location of’.)

Let a location be an entity at which something is exactly located. Then, according to Conditional Reflexivity, each location is exactly located at itself. Suppose, for example, that Obama is exactly located at region r. Then Conditional Reflexivity says that region r is exactly located at itself. If we make the additional assumption that Obama is not identical to r, we get the result that there are two different entities exactly located at r—namely, r and Obama. In that case, we have a counterexample to the principle that no two entities are exactly located in the same region. Finally, if we further assume (as many do) that r and Obama do not even overlap, we get a counterexample to the principle (versions of which are discussed in Uzquiano 2006: 431, 2011: 204; Saucedo 2011: 228) that if x and y have exact locations that overlap, then x and y themselves overlap.

Some may take this as a reductio of Conditional Reflexivity. Others may take it as a reason to reject the given principles in favor of weaker variants. For example, the ban on co-located entities could be replaced with a ban on co-located non-locations or on co-located material objects. Similarly for the principle about overlapping.

With Conditional Reflexivity as a backdrop, Casati and Varzi (1999: 123) define a predicate for regionhood, ‘R’:

Regionhood R(x) =df L(x, x)
x is a region’ means ‘x is exactly located at itself’

Together with Conditional Reflexivity, (DR) entails that that if x is exactly located at y, then y is exactly located at itself and hence is a region. But the (DR) + Conditional Reflexivity package also allows for cases in which an entity r counts as a region even though nothing but r is exactly located at r.

The regionhood predicate is potentially useful in stating restricted versions of familiar mereological principles. One might want a principle to the effect that any set of regions has a mereological sum, while rejecting the more general claim that any set of entities whatever has a sum. (Perhaps {the Eiffel Tower, Barack Obama} has no sum.) Likewise one might want a principle to the effect that non-identical regions never mereologically coincide, while rejecting the more general claim that non-identical entities never mereologically coincide. (Perhaps a certain clay statue is mereologically coincident with, but not identical to, a certain lump of clay.) The most natural formulations of these restricted principles employ a regionhood predicate. Though one might take this predicate as primitive, a desire for ideological economy would provide some motivation for treating it as defined.

We turn now to Weak Expansivity. Informally, it says that if both the part and the whole are located, then the part ‘lies within’ the whole: the part's exact location is a part of the whole's exact location. This principle allows for a situation in which x is a part of y though one or both of these entities fails to be exactly located anywhere. (One might think, e.g., that a certain proposition has another proposition as a part though neither is exactly located anywhere, or that a person is a part of a proposition even though the person has an exact location and the proposition doesn't.) It also allows for situations in which an entity and one of its proper parts share the very same exact location.

Casati and Varzi take care to ensure that their system does not entail that if x's exact location is a part of y's exact location, then x is a part of y. (Call this WEC; it is the approximate converse of Weak Expansivity.) One reason to be cautious about this runs as follows. Suppose that my body, a material object, is exactly located at the region rb, that my head is exactly located at the region rh, and that my head is a part of my body. Then given Weak Expansivity, rh is a part of rb, and given Conditional Reflexivity, rh is exactly located at rh, and rb is exactly located at rb. So, if Casati and Varzi were committed to WEC­, they would be forced to conclude that a certain region, rh, is a part of a material object, my body.

Now consider Arbitrary Partition. Informally, it says that a located thing has a part located at each subregion of the thing's location. (It is a somewhat stronger version of the ‘Doctrine of Arbitrary Undetached Parts’ attacked by van Inwagen (1981).) Together with Functionality, Arbitrary Partition entails that simple things (things that lack proper parts) do not have complex (non-simple) exact locations. Given the popular assumption that a region is complex if and only if it is extended (better: not-point-like), this amounts to the claim that simple things do not have extended exact locations—roughly, that there are no extended simples. Arguments for and against the possibility of extended simples are discussed later.

It is worth noting right away, however, that one can reject extended simples without going so far as to embrace Arbitrary Partition. There are at least two reasons for this.

Here is the first reason. Let ‘the xs compose y’ and ‘y is a sum of the xs’ mean ‘each of the xs is a part of y, and each part of y overlaps at least one of the xs’. One might think that everything is composed of point-like simples but that composition is restricted, so that some pluralities of simples have no sum. In that case it would be natural to deny Arbitrary Partition. For example, one might say that Obama is composed of some point-like simples, the os, and is exactly located at region r, but that there are proper parts of r (say, the left half of r) at which no part of Obama is exactly located. (The material simples in the left half of r, one might say, do not have a sum.)

And here is the second reason. (What follows is rough and informal. See Cartwright (1975) and Uzquiano (2006) for a more careful discussion.) One might think that (i) all material objects must always be topologically open and gunky, that (ii) any part of a material object must itself be a material object, and that (iii) space or spacetime is a continuum of simple points, each plurality of which composes a region. Now let o be a material object whose exact location, r, is a topologically open sphere. Then, given (iii), presumably there will be a part r* of r that is not topologically open and so (by (ii)) is not the exact location of any material object and so (by (iii)) is not the exact location of any part of o, contrary to Arbitrary Partition. For reasons like these, Gabriel Uzquiano claims that Arbitrary Partition “seems far too strong to be classed as an axiom of any reasonable theory of location” (2011: 206).

Copyright © 2013 by
Cody Gilmore <>

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