Notes to Ancient Logic

1. The title is almost certainly not by Aristotle.

2. This strange sounding bit of theory becomes comprehensible when one takes into account (i) that logic was mostly practiced orally, and (ii) that, even in written form, no quotation marks were available. Hence ‘a wagon has six letters’ and ‘a wagon has wheels’ could each express a true assertible, but each would then denote a different subject.

3. At least, this seems to have been the view of Chrysippus and the early Stoics. Some later texts seem ambiguous regarding the question whether or not Stoic conjunctions could have more than two conjuncts logically on a par.

4. This is not so alien to some 20th-century logicians: cf. Anderson and Belnap (1975), 152–3, who quote similar views propounded by G. H. von Wright, Peter Geach and Timothy Smiley.

Copyright © 2006 by
Susanne Bobzien <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free

The SEP would like to congratulate the National Endowment for the Humanities on its 50th anniversary and express our indebtedness for the five generous grants it awarded our project from 1997 to 2007. Readers who have benefited from the SEP are encouraged to examine the NEH’s anniversary page and, if inspired to do so, send a testimonial to