Logic in Classical Indian Philosophy

First published Tue Apr 19, 2011; substantive revision Wed Aug 3, 2016

The exercise of reasoning and the practice of argument are recorded in the early texts of India. Preoccupation with the nature of reason and argument occurs in the earliest philosophical texts, where their treatment is intimately connected with questions of ontology, epistemology and dialectics. These questions continued to be at the center of philosophical discussion through the classical and medieval period of Indian philosophy. This article will chronicle the answers Indian philosophers gave to these questions during the pre-classical and classical period.

1. Reasoning and Logic

Humans reason: that is, taking some things to be true, they conclude therefrom that other things are also true. If this is done in thought, one performs an inference; and if this is done in speech, one makes an argument. Indeed, inference and argument are but two sides of the same coin: an argument can be thought, and hence become an inference; an inference can be expressed, and hence become an argument.

Logic, at least as traditionally conceived, seeks to distinguish good reasoning from bad. More particularly, it seeks to identify the general conditions under which what one concludes is true, having taken other things to be true. These conditions can be sought in the nature of things. One asks, then, under what conditions do certain facts require some other fact. This perspective on reasoning is an ontic perspective. Next, insofar as facts are grasped in thought, one can also ask under what conditions does knowledge of some facts permit knowledge of another fact. Such conditions, once identified, would distinguish good inferences from bad inferences. This perspective on reasoning is an epistemic one. A third perspective is a dialectic one. After all, insofar as facts have been stated, one can ask as well under what conditions does the acceptance by someone of some facts require him or her to accept some other fact. These conditions, once identified, would distinguish good arguments from bad arguments. Finally, since an argument is an expression of an inference, and to that extent, expressed in a language, it is natural to use the forms of linguistic expressions to identify forms of inferences and arguments and thereby to distinguish forms of good inferences and arguments from forms of bad inferences and arguments. This perspective is a linguistic one. The study of reasoning in India has been from the ontic, epistemic and dialectic perspective, and not from the linguistic perspective, the perspective best known to modern thinkers.

2. Pre Classical Period

The fact that humans reason is no guarantee that those who do reflect on which reasoning is good and which is bad. Clearly, the activity of reasoning, on the one hand, and the activity of reflecting on which reasoning is good and which is not, on the other, are distinct, though naturally they are intimately related. The exposition here, while reporting primarily on what is explicit, will also report on what is implicit. In looking at the origins of reasoning in India, it is natural to begin with the practices in which reasoning played a role and which, as a result, were likely candidates for reflection. The obvious starting points for such practices are all forms of rational inquiry.

Rational inquiry comprises the search for reasons for publicly accepted facts, subject to public and rational scrutiny. This activity involves people both severally and collectively. It involves people severally insofar as people, individually, are the locus of inference. It involves people collectively insofar as arguments, the public manifestation of inferences, are sharpened by the scrutiny of others.

Though the origins in India of public debate (pariṣad), one form of rational inquiry, are not clear, we know that public debates were common in pre-classical India, for they are frequently alluded to in various Upaniṣads and in the early Buddhist literature. A better known, but much later, example of such engagements is the Buddhist works, Milinda-pañho (Questions of King Milinda) and Kathā-vatthu (Points of controversy).

Public debate is not the only form of public deliberations in pre-classical India. Assemblies (pariṣad or sabhā) of various sorts, comprised of relevant experts, were regularly convened to deliberate on a variety of matters, including administrative, legal and religious matters. As reported by Solomon (1976: ch. 3), much of the legal vocabulary for such deliberations includes the well-known terms of debate and argument found in the philosophical literature (see also Preisendanz 2009).

By the fifth century BCE, rational inquiry into a wide range of topics was under way, including agriculture, architecture, astronomy, grammar, law, logic, mathematics, medicine, phonology and statecraft. Aside from the world’s earliest extant grammar, Pāṇini’s Aṣṭādhyāyī, however, no works devoted to these topics actually date from this pre-classical period. Nonetheless, scholars agree that incipient versions of the first extant texts on these topics were being formulated and early versions of them were redacted by the beginning of the Common Era. They include such texts as Kṛṣi-śāstra (Treatise on agriculture), Śilpa-śāstra (Treatise on architecture), Jyotiṣa-śāstra (Treatise on astronomy), Dharma-śāstra (Treatise on law), Caraka-saṃhitā (Caraka’s collection), a treatise on medicine, and Artha-śāstra (Treatise on wealth), a treatise on politics.

3. Early Classical Period

The first five hundred years of the Common Era also saw the redaction of philosophical treatises in which proponents of diverse philosophical and religious traditions put forth systematic versions of their world view. These latter works bear witness, in a number of different ways, to the intense interest in argumentation during this period. This interest reveals itself in three different ways. First, authors made arguments which correspond to well-known forms of logical argument. Second, authors used or adduced logical principles of reasoning such as the principle of non-contradiction, the principle of excluded middle and the principle of double negation. Third, some authors isolated canonical forms of argument.

3.1 Reasoning Used

Many of the arguments formulated in these texts correspond to such well recognized rules of inference as modus ponens (i.e., from \(\alpha\) and \(\alpha\rightarrow \beta\), one infers \(\beta\)), modus tollens (i.e., from \(\neg \beta\) and \(\alpha\rightarrow \beta\), one infers \(\neg \alpha\)), disjunctive syllogism (i.e., from \(\neg \alpha\) and \(\alpha\lor \beta\), one infers \(\beta\)), constructive dilemma (i.e., from \(\alpha\lor \beta\), \(\alpha\rightarrow \gamma \) and \(\beta\rightarrow \gamma \), one infers \(\gamma \)), categorical syllogism (i.e., from \(\alpha\rightarrow \beta\) and \(\beta\rightarrow \gamma \), one infers \(\alpha\rightarrow \gamma \)) and reductio ad absurdum (i.e., if something false follows from an assumption, then the assumption is false). This last form of argument, termed prasaṅga in Sanskrit, was extremely common. Indeed, so common are such arguments in the works of the Buddhist philosopher Nāgārjuna (2nd century CE) that his follower, Buddhapālita (470–540), took all of Nāgārjuna’s arguments to be prasaṅga arguments. As a result, Buddhapālita and his followers were, and are, referred to as prāsaṅgikas, or absurdists.

3.2 Principles Used

Though no author of classical India made the principle of non-contradiction an object of study, it was almost always presupposed. Thus, for example, in the Samyutta Nikāya (Collection of short discourses 4.298, 4.299), from the Buddhist Tri-piṭaka, one finds someone known as Nigaṇṭha Nātaputta saying: “See how upright, honest and sincere Citta, the householder, is”; and, a little later, he also says: “See how Citta, the householder, is not upright, honest or sincere.” To this, Citta replies: “if your former statement is true, your latter statement is false and if your latter statement is true, your former statement is false.”

Explicit formulations of the ontic principle of non-contradiction are found very early in the philosophical literature. Thus, the Buddhist philosopher Nāgārjuna (c. 2nd century CE) often invokes an ontic principle of non-contradiction, saying such things as “when something is a single thing, it cannot be both existent and non-existent” (Mūla-madhyamaka-kārikā (Basic verses on the middle way) MMK 7.30), clearly reminiscent of Aristotle’s own ontic formulation of the principle of non-contradiction, namely, “that a thing cannot at the same time be and not be” (Metaphysics: Bk. 3, ch. 2, 996b29–30). Nor are such formulations rare. Vātsyāyana (5th CE), in his Nyāya-bhāṣya (Commentary on logic), says:

Moreover, because of the exclusivity of being eternal and being non-eternal, eternality and non-eternality must be excluded as two properties of the very same property-possessor. (That is,) they cannot occur together. (comment to NS 5.1.36)

Bhartṛhari (6th CE), the eminent grammarian and philosopher of language, formulates an ontic version of the principle of excluded middle in his Vākyapadīya (On sentences and words), saying “A thing must be either existent or non-existent: There is no third” (VP 3.9.85).

Like Aristotle, classical Indian thinkers were aware of the possible limitation of the principle of excluded middle. Candrakīrti, for example, in his Prasannapadā (Clear-worded (commentary)), a commentary to Nāgārjuna’s Mūla-mādhyamaka-kārikā, points out that incompatible properties fail equally to apply to non-existent objects.

But to some who have acquired a clear view of truth through very long practice and by whom the roots of the trees of obstruction have been unuprooted by only a little, it has been taught that it is neither true nor untrue; in order to destroy the least obstruction, both have been denied, just as one denies both whiteness and blackness of the son of a barren woman. (comment to MMK 8.18; cited by Staal 1975: 43; reprint, p. 50)

Finally, in classical India, one finds ontic formulations of the principle of double negation. Vātsyāyana says: “It is well known that the absence of those things which exist is excluded” (commentary to NS 2.2.10).

3.3 Arguments with Form

Awareness of the fact that the form of argument is crucial to its being good is found in a Buddhist work of the third century BCE, Moggaliputta Tissa’s Kathā-vatthu, in which is found the refutation of some two hundred propositions over which the Sthaviravādins, one of the Buddhist schools, disagreed with other Buddhist schools. The treatment of each point comprises an exchange between a proponent and an opponent. The refutations, of course, turn on demonstrating the inconsistency of a set of propositions. For example, in the passage below, the Sthaviravādin questions his opponent, here a Pudgalavādin, about whether or not the soul is known truly and ultimately.

  • Sthaviravādin: Is the soul known truly and ultimately?
  • Pudgalavādin: Yes.
  • Sthaviravādin: Is the soul known truly and ultimately just like any ultimate fact?
  • Pudgalavādin: No.
  • Sthaviravādin: Acknowledge your refutation, If the soul is known truly and ultimately, then indeed, good sir, you should also say that the soul is known truly and ultimately just like any ultimate fact. What you say here is wrong: namely, that we ought to say (a) that the soul is known truly and ultimately; but we ought not to say (b) that the soul is known truly and ultimately just like any ultimate fact. If the latter statement (b) cannot be admitted, then indeed the former statement (a) should not be admitted. It is wrong to affirm the former statement (a) and to deny the latter (b).

One easily abstracts from this the following form,

  • Sthaviravādin: Is A B?
  • Pudgalavādin: Yes.
  • Sthaviravādin: Is C D?
  • Pudgalavādin: No.
  • Sthaviravādin: Acknowledge your refutation, If A is B, then C is D. What you say here is wrong: namely, (a) that A is B but that C is not D. If C is not D, then A is not B. It is wrong that A is B and C is not D.

Indeed, this form is repeatedly instantiated throughout Book 1, Chapter 1.

Clearly, the author takes for granted the following: first, that the propositions assented to are inconsistent, satisfying the following inconsistent propositional schemata of \(\alpha\) , \(\neg \beta\) , \(\alpha\rightarrow \beta\); second, that it is wrong to hold inconsistent propositions; and, third, that if \(\alpha\rightarrow \beta\), then \(\neg \beta \rightarrow \neg \alpha\)—that is, half of the equivalence of the principle of contraposition.

The earliest passages concerned with argument and inference are found, on the one hand, in the philosophical literature, both Brahmanical and Buddhist, and, on the other, in Caraka-saṃhitā, a medical text, conjectured by some to have been redacted in its current form at the beginning of first century CE. The best known Brahmanical text pertaining to inference is Nyāya-sūtra (Aphorisms on logic) by Gautama, also known as Akṣapāda (c. 2nd CE), a treatise on rational inquiry, whose actual redaction is thought by some to date to the third century CE. Two other Brahmanical works which touch on inference are Vaiśeṣika-sūtra (Aphorisms on individuation), a treatise of speculative ontology attributed to Kaṇāda (c. 1st century CE), and Ṣaṣṭi-tantra (Sixty doctrines), attributed by some to Pañcaśikha (c. 2nd century BCE) and by others to Vrṣagaṇa (c. after the 2nd century CE), and surviving only in fragments.

The remaining texts are found in the Buddhist philosophical literature. An early Buddhist text of unknown authorship, whose original Sanskrit has been lost, but whose translations into Tibetan and Chinese have been preserved, is Sandhi-nirmocana-sūtra (Aphorisms on release from bondage). The earliest identified Buddhist author to write on argument and inference is the idealist Asaṅga (c. 4th century CE). One passage, often referred to as Vāda-viniścaya (Settling on what debate is), occurs in his Abhidharma-samuccaya (Compendium of the higher teachings) and another, usually referred to as Hetu-vidyā (Science of grounds), occurs at the end of a chapter of his Yogācāra-bhūmi-śāstra (Treatise on the stages of the practice of yoga). In addition, modern scholars have ascribed to Asaṅga two other texts which touch on reasoning but which survive only in Chinese. One is Xiǎn chàng shèng jiào lùn (Treatise which reveals and disseminates the wise teachings), whose Sanskrit title G. Tucci gives as Prakaraṇa-ārya-vācā-śāstra and E. Lamotte gives as Ārya-deśanā-śāstra. The other is Shùn zhōng lùn (Treatise on following the middle way), which seems to be a commentary on the introductory verse of Nāgārjuna’s Mūla-madhyamaka-kārikā (Katsura 1985: 166).

Shortly after Asaṅga, Vasubandhu (c. 5th century CE), another Buddhist idealist, thought to be the younger brother of the Asaṅga, wrote at least three works on debate: Vāda-hṛdaya (Heart of debate), Vāda-vidhāna (Precepts of debate) and Vāda-vidhi (Rules of debate). No Sanskrit original of any of these survives, though Sanskrit fragments of the last have been collected by E. Frauwallner (1957). Another work, ascribed to Vasubandhu, which survives only in Chinese, is Rú shí lùn (Treatise on truth). E. Frauwallner conjectures its Sanskrit name to be Prayoga-sāra, while G. Tucci (1929), when he translated it back into Sanskrit, gave it the Sanskrit title Tarka-śāstra, by which it is now generally known. Finally, there is another work which is only in Chinese. It is Fāng biàn xīn lùn (Treatise on the heart of means; T 1632). It is of unknown author and date. G. Tucci (1929) translated this text too into Sanskrit, giving it the Sanskrit title, Upāya-hṛdaya.

With the notable exceptions of Vaiśeṣika-sūtra and Ṣaṣṭi-tantra, which treat only inference, an epistemic process, the preponderance of the texts mentioned above is devoted more to argument in debate than to inference. These texts typically enumerate, define or classify public discussions, propositions as they are used in public discussions, parts of arguments, qualities which either enhance or detract from a discussant’s performance and statements or actions by a discussant which warrant his being considered defeated, including the uttering of various fallacies.

Early polemical Buddhist texts are filled with arguments, many of them analogical arguments. Particularly replete in such arguments is Bǎi lùn (Śata-śāstra; Treatise in one hundred verses) of Āryadeva, a student of Nāgārjuna. Though, at this point, there was no accepted, canonical form for analogical arguments, nonetheless many either have one of the two forms set out below, or can be easily and faithfully put into one of them. One form of argument is based on similarity (sādharmya; sārūpya). Such arguments have two premisses: one premiss asserts that two things share a property, the other premiss asserts that one of the two things has a second property. The conclusion asserting that the second thing also has the second property. Arguments by analogy through similarity, then, have this form. The names for the statements have been added for ease of comparison.)

Argument by Analogy Through Similarity
conclusion: p has S.
ground: because p has H.
corroboration: d has H and S.

The other form of argument is based on dissimilarity (vaidharmya; vairūpya). Such arguments also have two premisses, one asserting that two things fail to share a property and the other asserting that one of them fails to have a second property. Their conclusion asserts that the second thing fails to have the second property. Arguments by analogy through dissimilarity, then, have this form.

Argument by Analogy Through Dissimilarity
conclusion: p does not have S.
ground: because p does not have H.
corroboration: d has H and S.

Again, if the argument is not to be circular, p and d must be distinct. However, here, this follows from the law of non-contradiction.

Anticipating later discussion, let us see how these two kinds of analogical arguments might be characterized using two terms which become crucial technical terms in Indian logic: namely, subject-like (sa-pakṣa), or similar to the subject, and subject-unlike (vi-pakṣa), or dissimilar to the subject. The Sanskrit prefixes, sa- and vi-, and their respective English adjectives, like and unlike, which are also English prepositions, express the relation of similarity and dissimilarity respectively. These words express a three place relation, namely the relation of a thing being like (similar to) or unlike (dissimilar to) a thing in some respect, but both the Sanskrit and English expressions, when they are used, permit the complement referring to the respect in which things are similar or dissimilar to be left unexpressed. It is this omissibility which accounts for the fact that the following two sentences are not contradictory: Devadatta is like Yajñadatta and Devadatta is unlike Yajñadatta. After all, two people might be like one another, say, in temperament, but unlike one another, say, in appearance. The same is true of the Sanskrit counterparts of these English sentences. When the respect of similarity or dissimilarity is not expressed in a sentence, it must be gathered from the context. In Sanskrit, when the context is the discussion of an argument and no mention is made of the respect in which the things are similar or dissimilar, it is understood that the argument's property to be established (sādhya-dharma) is that with respect to which there is similarity or dissimilarity.

Now, using the technical term, subject-like (sa-pakṣa), one can say that an argument by analogy through similarity is correct just in case it satisfies two conditions:

first condition: The existence of the ground (H) in the subject (p).
second condition: The existence of the ground (H) in a subject-like thing (d).

An important feature of words for similarity in many languages, including English, is the strong pragmatic presumption that things which are alike, or similar, are distinct. If this is true of the Sanskrit words for similarity, then the two conditions just stated presume that p, the subject of the argument, and d, the corroborating instance, are distinct, thereby excluding circular arguments.

Next, using the technical term, subject-unlike (vi-pakṣa), one can say that an argument by analogy through dissimilarity is correct just in case it satisfies two conditions:

first condition: The existence of the ground (H) in the subject (p).
third condition: The non-existence of the ground (H) in a subject-unlike thing (d).

The earliest text to contain an example of an analogical argument in a canonical form for debate is the Caraka-saṃhitā. Here is one of the two examples (CS 3.8.31) it provides:

Canonical Argument by Analogy
proposition: the soul is eternal
ground: because it is un-created,
corroboration: like space;
application: as space is uncreated and it is eternal, so is the soul uncreated;
conclusion: therefore, the soul is eternal

This form of the argument clearly reflects the debate situation. First, one propounds a proposition (pratijñā), that is, one sets forth a proposition to be proved. One then states the ground, or reason (hetu), for the proposition one is propounding. Next, one corroborates with an example (dṛṣṭānta) which illustrates the connection implicit between the property mentioned in the proposition and the property adduced as its ground. The immediately ensuing step, the application (upanaya), spells out the similarity between the example and the subject of the proposition. Finally, one asserts the proposition as a conclusion (nigamana).

That the argument is an analogical one is made clear by the use of the correlative expressions as (yathā) so (tathā); indeed, the example just given is an argument by analogy through similarity, albeit more prolix in its formulation than the analogical arguments alluded to above. Though Caraka-saṃhitā provides no example of an argument by analogy through dissimilarity in a canonical form, it does refer to the distinction (CS 3.8.36); and while no examples of arguments at all are found in Nyāya-sūtra, a pair of examples of analogical arguments, one through similarity (NS 1.1.33) and one through dissimilarity (NS 1.1.35), is found in Nyāya-bhāṣya. The analogical argument in Caraka-saṃhitā and the argument by analogy through similarity in Nyāya-bhāṣya are essentially the same, though the parts are grouped together differently.

Canonical Argument By Analogy Through Similarity
proposition: sound is non-eternal
ground: because it has the property of arising;
corroboration: a substance, such as a pot, having the property of arising, is non-eternal;
application: and likewise, sound has the property of arising;
conclusion: therefore, sound is non-eternal because of having the property of arising,

Canonical Argument By Analogy Through Dissimilarity
proposition: sound is non-eternal
ground: because it has the property of arising;
corroboration: a substance, such as the self, not having the property of arising, is eternal;
application: and obversely, sound does not have the property of arising;
conclusion: therefore, sound is non-eternal because of having the property of arising,

As is obvious from such texts, their authors were eager to distinguish good arguments from bad ones. Not surprisingly, the authors catalogued bad arguments. Grounds adduced in arguments catalogued as bad are referred to as non-grounds (a-hetu) or as pseudo-grounds (hetu-ābhāsa). It is difficult to be sure what the basis for the classification was. In the case of the Nyāya-sūtra, the author gives neither a definition nor an example. Even in cases where definitions and examples are given, the contemporary reader is not always sure what is intended. In all likelihood, included here are both cases where the premisses of the argument can be true but the conclusion false, formal fallacies, as well as cases where an argument, though formally valid, is nonetheless unpersuasive, since, for example, its ground (hetu) is as controversial as its conclusion.

These very same texts, as well as Vaiśeṣika-sūtra, touch on inference as an epistemic act. While the examples of inference furnished all have parts corresponding to a proposition (pratijñā) and to a ground (hetu), not all the texts are equally explicit in identifying the form of inference. In particular, both Caraka-saṃhitā (CS 1.11.21–22) and Nyāya-sūtra (NS 1.1.5) define inference as knowledge of one fact on the basis of knowledge of another, leaving unmentioned any knowledge of a relation linking the two. Moreover, these texts classify inferences on the basis of characteristics completely extrinsic to logical features of the inferences adduced. Inferences appear to be classified according to the temporal order of the occurrences of the properties of the parts corresponding to a proposition (pratijñā) and to a ground (hetu).

Improved definitions, which mention not only the parts corresponding to a proposition (pratijñā) and to a ground (hetu) but also the relation between these two parts, are found in Ṣaṣṭi-tantra and Vaiśeṣika-sūtra, where knowledge of the relation is explicitly included in their definitions of inference. However, the relation is not a formal one, but several from a miscellany of material relations. Ṣaṣṭi-tantra enumerates seven such relations, while Vaiśeṣika-sūtra (VS 9.20) enumerates five: the relation of cause to effect, of effect to cause, of contact, of exclusion and of inherence. In each of these texts, the miscellany of material relations serves to classify inferences. Thus, although, in these two works, the parts of an inference are made explicit, the formal connection among these parts remains implicit.

Another author who is aware that sound inference must be based on a relation between the proposition and the ground is Vātsyāyana (5th century CE), also known as Pakṣalisvāmin, the author of the Nyāya-bhāṣya. Though, as noted above, the form of argument he uses has the form of an analogical argument, Vātsyāyana rejects the mere similarity (sādharmya-mātra) and the mere dissimilarity (vaidharmya-mātra), which underlie reasoning by example, as underlying a sound canonical argument. Vātsyāyana seems to think that sound canonical arguments are underpinned by the causation relation. This identification of cause with ground leaves Vātsyāyana unclear about the difference between obversion and contraposition. (See Gillon 2010 for discussion).

Vasubandhu, a contemporary of Vātsyāyana, is the first thinker known to have made clear that the relation, knowledge of which is necessary for inference, is not just any in a miscellany of material relations, but a formal one, which he designates, in some places, as a-vinā-bhāva --- literally, not being without (cp. the Latin expression sine qua non) --- and in others, as nāntarīyakatva --- literally, being unmediated.

The recasting of the argument form from an analogical argument to a deductive one seems to have taken place around the time of Vasubandhu. The earliest record that such a step had been taken is found in Fāng biàn xīn lùn (Upāya-hṛdaya) (T 1632 28.1.4), where the following argument is set out, though without the names of the parts, which have been added here for the ease of comparison.

A Deductive Argument
proposition: the self is eternal
ground: because it is not perceptible by the senses;
corroboration: space, not being perceptible by the senses, is eternal; that which is not perceptible by senses is eternal;
application: the self is not perceptible by senses;
conclusion: how can the self be non-eternal?

Notice that the third statement consists in two statements, one a statement to the effect that an instance of something, distinct from the subject of the argument, has both the ground and the property to be established, the other to the effect that whatever has the ground has the property to be established. The former statement corresponds to the corroboration statement in the argument by analogy through similarity found in the Nyāya-bhāṣya. The latter statement is an innovation, which renders the argument a deductively valid one.

Strikingly, the author of Fāng biàn xīn lùn (Upāya-hṛdaya) rejects the argument as a bad argument. No other argument in the text is given a canonical form. Moreover, almost all arguments given in the text as examples are analogical ones. Yet, arguments of this deductive form are given as examples of good arguments in Rú shí lùn (Tarka-śāstra), where the author explicitly rejects analogical arguments as bad arguments. Moreover, its author justifies this kind of argument by appealing to a criterion which holds that a proper ground (hetu) (H) satisfy three forms (tri-rūpa) (T 1633 30.3.18--26). The first is that the ground (H) occur in the subject (p). The second is that the ground (H) occur in what is similar (to the subject). The third is that the ground (H) is excluded from what is dissimilar (to the subject).

Though there are no texts with passages to this effect, the first and second forms of a proper ground (tri-rūpa-hetu) could have been used to characterize an argument by analogy through similarity, while the first and third forms could have been used to characterize an analogical argument through dissimilarity. Thus, in an argument by analogy through similarity, on the one hand, the ground (H) must occur in the subject of the argument (p) and it must occur in the example, which itself must be distinct from the subject but still similar to it insofar as it too must possess the property to be established (S). In an analogical argument through dissimilarity, on the other hand, the ground (H) must occur in the subject of the argument (p) and it must not occur in the example, which itself must be distinct from the subject and also dissimilar from it insofar as it does not possess the property to be established (S). (This paragraph elaborates on a remark made by Randle (1930: 183) in passing.)

What is clear both from the form of the good arguments and from the so-called three forms (tri-rūpa) is that a necessary condition for a canonical argument to be good is this: any choice of a subject of an argument (p), a ground (H) and a property to be established (sādhya-dharma) (S) satisfy the following schema.

Deductive Schema
major premiss: Whatever has H has S;
minor premiss: because p has H;
conclusion: p has S.

It is important to add that satisfaction of this schema is not a sufficient condition for an argument to be a good one, for such a schema does not exclude arguments in which the ground (H) and the property to be established (sādhya-dharma) (S) are the same; that is to say, it does not rule out circular arguments, for example.

Though there are no passages to this effect, the first and second forms of a proper ground (tri-rūpa-hetu) could have been used to characterize an argument by analogy through similarity, while the first and third forms could have been used to characterize an argument by analogy through dissimilarity. Thus, in an argument by analogy through similarity, on the one hand, the ground (H) must occur in the subject of the argument (p) and it must occur in the example, which itself must be distinct from the subject but still similar to it insofar as it too must possess the property to be established (S). In an argument by analogy through dissimilarity, on the other hand, the ground (H) must occur in the subject of the argument (p) and it must not occur in the example, which itself must be distinct from the subject and also dissimilar from it insofar as it does not possess the property to be established (S). (This paragraph elaborates on a remark made by Randle (1930: 183) in passing.)

As pointed out by H. Ui almost a century ago (Katsura 1985: 166), neither the canonical argument with a deductive core nor the three forms of a proper ground characterizing it is original with the author of Rú shí lùn (Tarka-śāstra), for these ideas were already mentioned in Asaṅga’s Shùn zhōng lùn, though Asaṅga neither endorses the ideas in this text, nor does he even mention them in either of his two extant works on argument. If the attribution of Rú shí lùn (Tarka-śāstra) to Vasubandhu is indeed correct, then he will turn out to be the first Buddhist author known to have adopted explicitly as a canonical argument one with a deductive core and to have used the three forms of a ground (tri-rūpa-hetu) to justify its form.

4. Classical Period

A clearer and more comprehensive view of inference and argument emerges in the extant works of Dignāga (c. 5th – 6th century CE) devoted to these topics. Unfortunately, in each case, the original Sanskrit text has been lost. Two, however, are extant in Tibetan translation: Hetu-cakra-ḍamaru (The drum wheel of reason) and his magnum opus, Pramāṇa-samuccaya (Compendium on epistemic means of cognition), four of whose six chapters are devoted to inference and argument. One is extant in both a Chinese and a Tibetan translation: Nyāya-mukha (Introduction to logic).

One idea which is particularly clear in Dignāga’s work is his explicit recognition that inference, the cognitive process whereby one increases one’s knowledge, and argument, the device of persuasion, are but two sides of a single coin.

What also emerges in these works is the continued refinement of a canonical form of argument. Though the texts just mentioned are not extant in Sanskrit, some of their commentaries are and some of these texts’ passages are found cited in existing Sanskrit works. Availing himself of these works, S. Katsura (2004a: 143) has identified the following as an argument instantiating what Dignāga considers the canonical form of a good argument.

Canonical Argument for Dignāga
thesis: sound is non-eternal
ground: because it results from effort;
similarity corroboration: that which is immediately connected with an effort is observed to be non-eternal, like a pot.
dissimilarity corroboration: that which is eternal is observed not to be immediately connected with an effort, like space.

Dignāga’s canonical argument differs in four respects from the sole deductively valid argument, cited above, found in Fāng biàn xīn lùn (Upaya-hṛdaya). First, Dignāga’s canonical argument has neither an application statement nor a conclusion statement. Second, it has two corroboration statements, instead of one. His first corroboration statement corresponds to the corroboration statement of the schematic argument by analogy through similarity and his second corresponds to the corroboration statement of the schematic argument by analogy through dissimilarity. These statements come to be known in Sanskrit as statements of similarity corroboration (sādharmya-dṛṣṭānta) and of dissimilarity corroboration (vaidharmya-dṛṣṭānta) respectively. Third, each of his two corroboration statements comprises a single universal statement, though each also includes a phrase referring to an example which is an instance the universal statement. In other words, the universal statement in the corroboration statement of the argument found in Fāng biàn xīn lùn (Upaya-hṛdaya) is retained and the singular statement is reduced to what, in English, amounts to a prepositional phrase. We shall call this phrase the example phrase. Last, Dignāga seems to have added a word to the canonical form of the corroboration statement, namely, the word dṛṣṭa (observed), the past passive participle of the verb dṛś (to see), which means not only to see but also to observe, to notice and even to know.

Perhaps most original in Dignāga’s work on argument and inference is what he called wheel of grounds (hetu-cakra), an equivalent alternative to the three forms of an argument’s ground. It comprises a three by three matrix, which distinguishes a proper from an improper ground. It specifies, on the one hand, the three cases of the ground (hetu) occurring in some, none, or all of subject-like things (sa-pakṣa), and, on the other, the three cases of the ground (hetu) occurring in some, none, or all of subject-unlike things (vi-pakṣa). Letting H be the ground, S the subject-like things and \(\bar{S}\) the subject-unlike things, we obtain the following table.

H occurs in: all \(S\)
all \(\bar S\)
all \(S\)
no \(\bar S\)
all \(S\)
some \(\bar S\)
H occurs in: no \(S\)
all \(\bar S\)
no \(S\)
no \(\bar S\)
no \(S\)
some \(\bar S\)
H occurs in: some \(S\)
all \(\bar S\)
some \(S\)
no \(\bar S\)
some \(S\)
some \(\bar S\)

Dignāga identified the arguments corresponding to the top and bottom cases of the middle column as good arguments and those corresponding to the other cases as bad.

These developments have led to a rather lively debate among scholars of the development of logic in early classical India. A very succinct, but somewhat misleading, way to put the question at the center of the debate is whether or not Dignāga’s canonical argument is inductive or deductive. A more cumbersome, but more precise way, to put the question is this: is there a choice of a subject of an argument (p), a ground (H) and a property to be established (sādhya-dharma) (S) which Dignāga would accept to constitute a good argument but which fail to satisfy the deductive schema given above. Let us now consider those aspects of Dignāga’s treatment of argument which are at the center of this debate.

One reason to doubt that Dignāga would think that arguments failing to satisfy the deductive schema might nonetheless be good arguments is the inclusion of the word dṛṣṭa (observed) in the corroboration statement. In particular, one might think that Dignāga would accept as good argument one in which it is not the case that whatever is H is S, but it is the case that whatever is an observed instance of H is S: that is to say, the universal statement in the corroboration statement hold only for observed cases of H, and not for every case of H, regardless of whether or not the case of H has been observed. However, no such arguments are accepted by Dignāga. Moreover, the addition of the word dṛṣṭa (observed) does not permit attributing such an idea to Dignāga, for the word is added, not to the corroboration statement’s subordinate, relative clause, but to its main clause. Thus, what the universal statement says is, not that every observed instance of the ground (H) is an instance of the property to be established (S), but rather that every instance of the ground (H) is observed to be an instance of the property to be established (S). Moreover, if the word dṛṣṭa (observed) has a factive sense, that is, a sense which presupposes the truth of the clause into which the word is inserted, as do several of its English translations, for example, noticed, known, then the word in the statement leaves the truth conditions of the universal statements un affected.

A further reason which has prompted scholars to doubt that the good arguments Dignāga had in mind are not ones which would satisfy the deductive schema is the fact that he has retained an example phrase in his corroboration statements, for such phrases have no bearing on the deductive validity of a canonical argument. This doubt is re-enforced by the fact that statements of similarity corroboration and of dissimilarity corroboration, stripped of their example phrases, are contrapositives of another. Thus, one being logically equivalent to the other is also logically superfluous with respect to it. Indeed, Dignāga seems to be aware of the equivalence, for he acknowledges in his commentarial discussion of the three forms (PS 2.5) that the second and third forms are equivalent (Katsura 2000 p. 245; Katsura 2004b pp. 121--124), from which it follows that any two statements, one of which satisfies the second form and the other of which satisfies the third form are equivalent.

However, perfectly valid deductive arguments are reasonably excluded as good arguments. Consider, for example, an argument whose conclusion is identical with one of its premisses. It is a valid argument, though it is utterly unpersuasive. Dignāga, like any rational thinker, would not, and did not, accept as a good argument any argument in which the ground (H) and the property to be established (S) are the same property, even if such arguments satisfy the deductive schema. Excluding such circular arguments is fully consistent with the view that satisfaction of the deductive schema is a necessary condition on Dignāga's canonical arguments. (For extensive scholarly discussion of the role of corroborating instances in Buddhist arguments, see the collection of articles in Katsura and Steinkellner (eds) 2004.)

A good reason for Dignāga to retain an example phrase in the corroboration statements of his canonical argument would be to exclude arguments which are patently unpersuasive, even though, like circular arguments, they are deductively valid. Consider the following argument:

thesis: sound is non-eternal
ground: because it is audible
corroboration: whatever is audible is non-eternal.

This argument, rejected as a bad argument by Dignāga, was put forth by a school of Brahmin thinkers who held, for doctrinal reasons, that sound is eternal. To maintain this claim in the face of observation to the contrary, these thinkers maintained instead that what is transitory is the revelation of sound, not sound itself. According to them, in other words, sound is constantly present, but we hear it only when its presence is revealed.

Their argument, though formally valid, is utterly unpersuasive. The reason is that the instances of audibility (H), are coextensive with sound (p). Thus, there is no independent empirical evidence to support the universal statement that whatever is audible is non-eternal. Requiring that there be at least some thing different from sound which is both audible and non-eternal is an obvious and plausible way to eliminate such patently unpersuasive arguments. Dignāga, therefore, rules out the argument as a bad argument, rather than, as we would, accept it as a valid argument with a flawed premiss. (See also Tillemans 1990.)

But this cannot be the entire explanation of why Dignāga appears to insist on example phrases in statements of corroboration, for no where does he rule out as a good argument one which, though valid, is unpersuasive for want of some subject-unlike thing.

Because of the doubts just discussed, some scholars think that Dignāga was not striving work out a deductivist form of reasoning and argument. Rather, according to some, such as Hayes (1980; 1988 ch. 4.2), Dignāga was seeking to develop an inductivist form of reasoning and argument. According to others, such as Oetke (1994; 1996), Dignāga and some of his predecessors and contemporaries were striving to spell out a defeasible form of reasoning and argument. (See Taber 2004 for a critical assessment of Oetke's view.)

However much scholars may disagree about Dignāga’s aim in the formulation of the canonical argument, all agree that his works set the framework within which subsequent Buddhist thinkers addressed philosophical issues pertaining to inference and debate. Thus, Śaṅkarasvāmin (c. 6th century CE) wrote a brief manual of inference for Buddhists, called the Nyāya-praveśa (Beginning logic), based directly on Dignāga’s work. Not long thereafter, Dharmakīrti (c. 7th century CE), the great Buddhist metaphysician, also elaborated his views on inference and debate within the framework found in Dignāga.

The canonical argument, conceived of as an inference, is that whereby one who knows the truth of its premisses may also come to know the truth of its conclusion. The truth of the premiss corresponding to the ground, the minor premiss of the deductive schema, is known, of course, either through perception or through another inference. But how is the truth of the universal statement of the corroboration statement, the major premiss of the deductive schema, known? It cannot be known by inference, since the major premiss is a universal statement and the conclusion of a canonical argument is a particular statement. However, to know the truth of the major premiss by perception would seem to require that one know of each thing which has H, whether or not it also has S. Yet if one knew that, one would already know by perception the canonical argument’s conclusion. As a result, inference would be a superfluous means of knowledge.

The earliest classical Indian philosopher thought to have recognized the problem of how one comes to know the major premiss of the Indian canonical argument seems to have been Dignāga’s student, Īśvarasena (Steinkellner 1997: 638). He appears to have thought that knowledge of the canonical argument’s major premiss is grounded in non-perception (anupalabdhi). That is, according to Īśvarasena, knowledge that whatever has H has S comes from the simple failure to perceive something which has H but which does not have S. (See Steinkellner 1993, where he draws on Steinkellner 1966).

However, this suggestion does not solve the problem, for reasons laid out in detail by Īśvarasena’s student, Dharmakīrti (c. 7th century CE). His extensive writing on epistemology in general and on reason and argument in particular formed a watershed in classical India philosophy. Besides his magnum opus, Pramāṇa-vārttika (Gloss on the means of epistemic cognition), one of whose four chapters is devoted to inference (svārtha-anumāna), comprising 340 verses and a commentary by him to it, and another devoted to argument (para-anumāna), which comprises 285 verses, he wrote several smaller works, including Pramāṇa-viniścaya (Settling on what the epistemic means of cognition are), Nyāya-bindu (Drop of logic), Hetu-bindu (Drop of reason) and Vāda-nyāya (Logic of debate). As he makes abundantly clear in verses 13–25 and his commentary thereto of the chapter on inference (svārtha-anumāna) of his Pramāṇa-vārttika, the simple failure to perceive something which has H but which does not have S is no guarantee that whatever has H has S; after all, while one has never encountered something which has H and does not have S, what guarantee is there that something which has H and does not have S is not among the things which one has yet to encounter? Dharmakīrti’s answer was that the truth of the first premiss is guaranteed by either of two relations obtaining between properties: causation relation (tadutpatti) and the identity relation (tādātmya). Unfortunately, as one might suspect, Dharmakīrti’s solution does not work. (See Gillon 1991 for details.)

During the time between Dignāga and Dharmakīrti, thinkers started to add the particle eva to their statement of the three forms (tri-rūpa) with a view to making it more precise. (See Katsura 1985.) By the time we reach Dharmakīrti, we see a formulation of his in which it appears in each of the three conditions (NB 2.5).

Three Forms of a Ground (tri-rūpa-hetu)
first form: the ground's (H) definite (eva) existence in the subject (p);
second form: the ground's (H) existence in subject-like things only (eva);
third form: the ground's (H) utter (eva) non-existence in subject-unlike things.

Alas, the hoped for precision is undermined by the ambiguity in the meaning of the particle (eva) and of the noun sa-pakṣa (subject-like). This change came in for criticism at the hands of the Nyāya thinker, Uddyotakara (c. late 6th century CE), and has led to much controvery among contemporary scholars. Let me explain the problem.

The particle eva has two principal uses, one emphatic, the other restrictive. What it emphasizes or restricts depends on the word after which it is placed. The particle in the statement of the first form applies to the abstract noun existence and, in its emphatic use, is well translated by definite or actual. The particle in the statement of the third form applies to the negative abstract noun non-existence and, in its emphatic use with negation, is best translated by utter or at all. (Some scholars translate the particle in these statements as necessary. There is, however, no philological justification for such a translation.) The particle in the second form particle applies to a concrete noun. Though here the particle could have either an emphatic or a restrictive use, only the restrictive use fits the context. A problem arises from the expression sa-pakṣa) (subject-likea). As explained earlier, i can be construed in two ways: either as including or as excluding the subject. If it is construed as inclusive, then the second and third forms are logically equivalent and the statement of the three forms has the rhetorical blemish of containing a logically superfluous form. If it is taken as exclusive, then the three forms are inconsistent, for in that case the second form entails the contradictory of the first form. (For full details, see Gillon 1999.)

Ideas on the nature of argument and inference very similar to those of Dignāga’s are found in works of several of his contemporaries. For example, in the Padārtha-dharma-saṃgraha (Summary of categories and properties), better known as Praśastapāda-bhāṣya (Praśastapāda’s commentary, understood as being a commentary on the Vaiśeṣika-sūtra), its author, Praśastapāda (c. 6th century CE), an adherent of the Vaiśeṣika school and a near contemporary of Dignāga, also clearly viewed the Indian canonical argument as a formal, valid argument. He made this clear by using the Sanskrit quantificational adjective sarva (all) to formulate the second and third conditions of three forms of a ground.(See Randle 1930, ch. 3.1, for discussion.)

Whether or not the view of the canonical argument as a formally valid one spread from Dignāga to his contemporaries, or from one of his contemporaries to him, or from some other person predating all of them has yet to be decided. Whatever the answer is to this question, it is clear that the canonical argument came to be adopted virtually by every classical Indian thinker and this same conception, through the spread of Buddhism, spread to China, Korea and Japan.

It was not long before the ideas on inference and argument became generally accepted not only by other non-Brahmanical thinkers, such as the Jains, but also by Brahmanical thinkers. For example, the Jain thinker, Jinabhadra (6th CE), a junior contemporary of Dignāga, wrote a commentary on the Jain thinker, Bhadrabāhu, where he took claims in the latter’s work and recast them in the form of the canonical argument as found in Dignāga’s work (Uno 2009.) In addition, one finds that the Mīmāṃsā thinker, Kumārila Bhaṭṭa (c. early 7th century CE), adopted, without special comment, the deductive perspective. His logical ideas are developed at length in the one hundred eighty-eight verses of his Śloka-vārttika’s (Gloss in verses) Anumāna-pariccheda (Section on inference). On the other hand, one also finds that, though the Nāya thinker, Uddyotakara, argued vigorously against many of Dignāga’s views, he nonetheless advocated a view which presupposed the same deductive schema as that presupposed by Dignāga’s works. Thus, Uddyotakara classified grounds (hetu) as: concomitant (anvaya), where nothing distinct from particular substratum p (in the inferential schema) fails to have the property S; exclusive (vyatireka), where nothing distinct from p (in the inferential schema) has the property S; and both concomitant and exclusive, where some things distinct from p have the property S and some fail to have the property S. This classification becomes the standard classification for the adherents of Nyāya during the scholastic period.

While Brahmanical thinkers accepted the insight of the Buddhists that the canonical inference is underpinned by indispensability, they refrained from modifying the form of the canonical argument they used. Rather, the Brahmanical thinkers retained the form of inference found in Vātsyāyana’s Nyāya-bhāṣya. However, they understood the steps of corroboration and application to convey the indispensability relation.

In addition, in spite of the metaphysical differences which distinguished the various schools of thought, both Buddhist and Brahmanical, all thinkers came to use a naive realist’s ontology to specify the states of affairs used to study the canonical argument. According to this view, the world consists of individual substances, or things (dravya), universals (sāmānya) and relations between them. The fundamental relation is the one of occurrence (vṛtti). The relata of this relation are known as substratum (dharmin) and superstratum (dharma) respectively. The relation has two forms: contact (saṃyoga) and inherence (samavāya). So, for example, one individual substance, a pot, may occur on another, say the ground, by the relation of contact. In this case, the pot is the superstratum and the ground is the substratum. Or, a universal, say treeness, may occur in an individual substance, say an individual tree, by the relation of inherence. Here, treeness, the superstratum, inheres in the individual tree, the substratum. The converse of the relation of occurrence is the relation of possession.

Another important relation is the relation which one superstratum bears to another. This relation, mentioned above as indispensability (a-vinā-bhāṣva), and later known as pervasion (vyāpti), can be defined in terms of the occurrence relation. One superstratum pervades another just in case wherever the second occurs the first occurs. The converse of the pervasion relation is the concomitance relation.

As a result of these relations, the world embodies a structure: if one superstratum, designated as H, is concomitant with another superstratum, designated as S, and if a particular substratum, say p, possesses the former superstratum, then it possesses the second. This structure is the one which underlies the classical Indian canonical argument.

Bibliography

Original Texts

  • Abhidharma-samuccaya (Compendium of the higher teachings) by Asaṅga.
    Edition: Tatia 1976.
    French translation: Rahula 1971.
  • Bǎi lùn (Treatise in one hundred verses; Śata-śāstra) by Āryadeva.
    Edition: Taishō Chinese Tripiṭaka 1569.
    English translation: Tucci 1930.
  • Caraka-saṃhitā (Caraka’s collection) by Agniveśa.
    Edition: Sharma and Dash 1976.
    English translation: Sharma and Dash 1976.
    Reference: CS sthāna.adhyāya.sūtra
  • Fāng biàn xīn lùn (Treatise on the heart of means).
    Edition: Taishō Chinese Tripiṭaka 1632.
    Reference: T 1632 page.horizontal-band.vertical-line
  • Hetu-bindu (Drop of reason) by Dharmakīrti.
    Edition: Steinkellner 1967.
    English translation: Gokhale 1997.
  • Kathā-vatthu (Points of controversy) by Moggaliputta Tissa.
    Edition: Kāśyapa 1961.
    English translation: Aung and Davids 1915.
  • Milinda-pañho (Questions of King Milinda)
    Edition: Trenckner 1880.
    English translation: Davids 1890.
  • Mūla-madhyamaka-kārikā (Basic verses on the middle way) by Nāgārjuna.
    Edition: de Jong 1977.
    English translation: Siderits and Katsura 2013.
    Reference: MMK chapter.verse
  • Nyāya-bhāṣya (Commentary on logic), a commentary on the Nyāya-sūtra, by Vātsyāyana, who is also known as Pakṣalisvāmin.
    Edition: Taranatha and Amarendramohan 1936.
    English translation: Jha 1913.
    Reference: NSB adhyāya.āhnika.sūtra
  • Nyāya-bindu (Drop of logic) by Dharmakīrti.
    Edition: Malvania 1955.
    English translation: Shcherbatskoï 1930 v. 2.
    Reference: NB chapter.passage
  • Nyāya-mukha (Introduction to logic) by Dignāga
    Edition: Original Sanskrit text lost.
    Chinese translation: Tai Shou no. 1628 (v. 32,: 1–2).
    English translation: Tucci 1930.
    Reference: NM.
  • Nyāya-praveśa (Primer on logic) by Śaṅkarasvāmin.
    Edition: Dhruva 1930.
    English translation: Gillon and Love 1980; Tachikawa 1971.
  • Nyāya-sūtra (Aphorisms on logic) by Gautama, who is also known as Akṣapāda.
    Edition: Taranatha and Amarendramohan (eds.) 1936.
    English translation: Jha 1913.
    Reference: NS adhyāya.āhnika.sūtra.
  • Nyāya-vārttika (Glosses on logic) by Uddyotakara, a commentary on the Nyāya-bhāṣya.
    Edition: Taranatha and Amarendramohan 1936.
    English translation: Jha 1913.
  • Pramāṇa-samuccaya (Compendium on epistemic means of cognition) by Dignāga.
    Edition: Original Sanskrit text lost.
    English translation: first chapter, Hattori 1968; second chapter, Hayes 1988 ch. 6; fifth chapter, Hayes 1988 ch. 7.
    Reference: PS chapter.verse
  • Pramāṇa-vārttika (Gloss on epistemic means of cognition) by Dharmakīrti.
    Edition: Pandeya 1989.
    English translation: first chapter to verse 38 with autocommentary, Hayes and Gillon 1991 and Gillon and Hayes 2008; first chapter verses 312 -- 340 with autocommentary, Eltschinger, Krasser and Taber (trans.) 2012.
    English translation of the Chapter on argument: Tillemans 2000.
  • Pramāṇa-viniścaya (Settling on what the epistemic means of cognition are) by Dharmakīrti.
    Edition of the chapter on perception: Vetter 1966.
    Edition of the chapter on inference: Steinkellner 1973.
  • Prasanna-padā (Clear-worded (Commentary)) by Candrakīrti, a commentary on Mūla-madhyamaka-kārikā.
    Edition: Shastri 1983.
    English translation: Sprung 1977.
  • Praśastapāda-bhāṣya (Praśastapāda’s Commentary), also known as Padārtha-dharma-saṃgraha (Summary of categories and properties), by Praśastapāda.
    Edition: Bronkhorst and Ramseier 1994.
    English translation: Jha 1916.
  • Rú shí lùn (Treatise on truth; Tarka-śāstra).
    Edition: Taishō Chinese Tripiṭaka 1633.
    Reference: T 1633 page.horizontal-band.vertical-line
  • Sandhi-nirmocana-sūtra (Aphorisms on release from bondage)
    Edition: Lamotte 1935.
    French Translation: Lamotte 1935.
  • Śata-śāstra: see Bǎi lùn.
  • Śloka-vārttika (Gloss in verses), a commentary on Śabara’s commentary on Jaimini’s Mīmāṁsā Sūtra, Bk. 1, Ch. 1, by Kumārila Bhaṭṭa.
    Edition: Musalgaonkar 1979.
    Translation: Jha 1924.
  • Tarka-śāstra: see Rú shí lùn.
  • Upāya-hṛdaya: see Fāng biàn xīn lùn.
  • Vāda-nyāya (Logic of debate) by Dharmakīrti.
    Edition: Shastri 1972; Gokhale 1993.
    English translation: Gokhale 1993.
  • Vāda-vidhi (Rules of debate) by Vasubandhu.
    Edition: Frauwallner 1957.
    English translation: Anacker 1984 ch. 3.
  • Vaiśeṣika-sūtra (Aphorisms on individuation) by Kaṇāda.
    Edition: Jambuvijāyajī 1961.
    English translation: Sinha 1911.
    Reference: VS adhyāya.āhnika.sūtra
  • Vākyapadīya (On sentences and words) by Bhartṛhari.
    Edition: Rau 1977.
    English translation: Subramania Iyer, K.A. 1965, 1971, 1974, 1977.
    Reference: VP kāṇḍa.kārikā or kāṇḍa.samuddeśa.kārikā

General Works

  • Bochenski, Joseph M., 1956 [1961], Formale Logik, Munich: Verlag Karl Alber. Translated by Ivo Thomas, 1961, as A history of formal logic, Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press. 2nd edition, 1970. Reprinted: Chelsea Publishing Co., New York.
  • Chi, Richard S.Y., 1969, Buddhist formal logic: a study of Dignāga’s Hetucakra and K’uei-chi’s Great Commentary on the Nyāyapraveśa, London: The Royal Asiatic Society of Great Britain.
  • Ganeri, Jonardon (ed.), 2001, Indian logic: a reader, Richmond: Curzon.
  • –––, 2004, Indian logic, in Handbook of the history of logic (vol. 1), Dov Gabbay and John Woods (eds.), Amsterdam, The Netherlands: Elsevier, pp. 241–266.
  • Hamblin, Charles Leonard, 1970, Fallacies, London: Methuen.
  • Herzberger, Hans H., 1982, “Three systems of Buddhist logic”, in Buddhist logic and epistemology, Bimal Krishna Matilal and Robert D. Evans (eds.), Dordrecht: D. Reidel Publishing Co., pp. 59–76.
  • Jayatilleke, Kulatissa Nanda, 1963, Early Buddhist theory of knowledge, London: George Allen and Unwin Ltd.
  • Katsura, Shōryū, 1998, Indojin no ronrigaku : mondōhō kara kinōhō e (Logic of the Indians : from dialectics to induction) (in Japanese), Tokyo, Chūōkōronsha chūōkōshinsho: 1142). Translated into Chinese, Xiāo, Píng and Yáng, Jīnpíng (trans.), 2010.
  • Matilal, Bimal Krishna, 1971, Epistemology, logic, and grammar in Indian philosophical analysis, The Hague: Mouton and Co. (Series Minor: 111).
  • –––, 1985, Logic, language, and reality: an introduction to Indian philosophical studies, Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass.
  • –––, 1990, Logic, language and reality: Indian philosophy and contemporary issues, Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass chapters 1 and 2.
  • –––, 1998, The character of logic in India, Jonardon Ganeri and Heeraman Tiwari (eds.), Albany, NY: State University of New York Press.
  • Potter, Karl H., 1977, Introduction to the Philosophy of Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika, in Encyclopedia of Indian Philosophies, v. 2, Part I. Chapter 9 (Logical Theory).
  • Perrett, Roy W., 1984, “The problem of induction in Indian philosophy”, Philosophy East and West, 34: 161–174.
  • Oetke, Claus, 1994, Studies on the doctrine of trairūpya, Vienna: Arbeitskreis für Tibetische und Buddhistische Studien (Wiener Studien zur Tibetologie und Buddhismuskunde: 33).
  • Shcherbatskoï, Fedor Ippolitovich (Stcherbatsky, F. Th.), 1930, Buddhist logic, 2 vols, Saint Petersburg (formerly, Leningrad): Academy of Sciences of the U.S.S.R. (Bibliotheca Buddhica: v. 26). Reprinted: Dover Publications, New York, NY, 1962.
  • Solomon, Esther A., 1976, Indian Dialectics: Methods of Philosophical Discussion, 2 vols, Ahmedabad: B.J. Institute of Learning and Research (Research Series: 70).
  • Staal, J.F. (ed.), 1988, Universals: studies in Indian logic and linguistics, Chicago: The University of Chicago Press.
  • Tillemans, Tom J.F., 1990, “On sapakṣa”, Journal of Indian Philosophy, 18: 53–80.
  • –––, 1992, “La logique bouddhique est-elle une logique non-classique ou deviante?” Les cahiers de philosophie, 14: 183–198.
  • Vidyabhusana, Satis Chandra, 1921, A history of Indian logic: ancient, medieval and modern, Calcutta: Calcutta University. Reprinted: Motilal Banarsidass, Delhi, 1971.
  • Xiāo, Píng and Yáng Jīnpíng (trans.) 2010, yīndùrén de luóji : cóng wèndáfǎ dào guīnàfǎ. Beijing: jiàowènhuà chūbǎnshè (Chinese translation of Katsura 1998).

References

  • Anacker, Stefan (trans.), 1984, Seven works of Vasubandhu: the Buddhist psychological doctor, Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass.
  • Aung, Shwe Zan and Caroline Anne Foley Rhys Davids (trans.), 1915, Points of controversy, or subjects of discourse, being a translation of the Kathā-vatthu from the Abhidhamma-piika, London: The Pali Text Society.
  • Bronkhorst, Johannes and Yves Ramseier (eds.), 1994, Word index to the Praśastapādabhāṣya: a complete word index to the printed editions of the Praśastapādabhāṣya, Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass.
  • Davids, T.W. Rhys (trans.), 1890, The questions of King Milinda, London: Pali Text Society (Sacred books of the East: v. 35–36). Reprinted: Dover Publications, New York, NY, 1963.
  • Dhruva, Ānandaśaṅkar (ed.), 1930, The Nyāyapraveśa: Sanskrit text with commentaries, Baroda: Oriental Institute (Gaekwad’s Oriental Series), 2nd, 1968.
  • Frauwallner, Erich, 1957, “Vasubandhu’s Vādavidhiḥ”, Wiener Zeitschrift für die Kunde Süd- und Ostasiens und Archiv für Indische Philosophie, 1: 104–146.
  • Gillon, Brendan S., 1991, “Dharmakīrti and the problem of induction”, in Studies in the Buddhist Epistemological Tradition, Proceedings of the Second International Dharmakīrti Conference (Vienna, 11–16 June, 1989), Ernst Steinkellner (ed.), Vienna: Verlag der Österreichischen Akademie der Wissenschaften, pp. 53–58.
  • –––, 1999, “Another look at the Sanskrit particle eva”, in Dharmakīrti’s thought and its impact on Indian and Tibetan philosophy, Proceedings of the Third International Dharmakīrti Conference (Hiroshima, 11–16 November, 1997), Shoryu Katsura (ed.), Vienna: Verlag der Österreichischen Akademie der Wissenschaften, pp. 117–130.
  • –––, 2010a, “Obversion and contraposition in the Nyāyabhāṣya”, in Logic in earliest classical India, Brendan S. Gillon (ed.), Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass Publishers (Papers of the 12th World Sanskrit Conference: v. 10.2), pp. 167–182.
  • Gillon, Brendan S. and Richard P. Hayes (trans.), 2008, “Dharmakīrti on the role of causation in inference as presented in Pramāṇavārttika Svopajñavṛtti 11–38”, Journal of Indian Philosophy, 36: 335–404.
  • Gillon, Brendan S. and Martha Lyle Love (trans.), 1980, “Indian logic revisited: Nyāyapraveśa reviewed”, Journal of Indian Philosophy, 8: 349–384.
  • Gokhale, Pradīpa P. (ed./trans.), 1993, Vādanyāya of Dharmakīrti: the logic of debate, critically edited and translated with introduction and notes, Delhi: Sri Satguru Publications.
  • ––– (ed./trans.), 1997, Hetubindu of Dharmakīrti: a Sanskrit version translated with an introduction and notes, Delhi: Sri Satguru Publications (Bibliotheca Indo-Buddhica series: no. 183).
  • Hayes, Richard P., 1980, “Dignāga’s views on reasoning (svārthānumāna)”, Journal of Indian Philosophy, 8: 219–277.
  • –––, 1988, Dignāga on the interpretation of signs, Dordrecht: Kluwer (Studies of Classical India: 9).
  • Hayes, Richard P. and Brendan S. Gillon (trans.), 1991, “Introduction to Dharmakīrti’s theory of inference as presented in Pramāṇa-vārttaka Svopaj navṛtti 1–10”, Journal of Indian Philosophy, 19: 1–73.
  • Jambuvijāyajī (ed.), 1961, Vaiśeṣikasūtra of Kaṇāda, with the commentary of Candrānanda, Baroda: Oriental Institute (Gaekwad’s Oriental Series), 2nd, 1982.
  • Jha, Ganganatha (trans.), 1913, The Nyāya-sūtras of Gautāma, with the bhāṣya of Vātsyāyana and the Vārtika of Uddyotakara, translated into English, with notes from Vāchaspati Mishra’s Nyāya-vārtika-tātparyaṭīkā, Udayana’s Pariśuddhi and Raghūttama’s Bhāṣyacandra, Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass, 1984 (reprint).
  • ––– (trans.), 1916, Padārthadharmasaṃgraha of Praśastapāda, with the Nyāyakandalī of Śrīdhara, Vārāṇasī: Chaukhambha Orientalia, 1982 (reprint).
  • ––– (trans.), 1924, Ślokavārttika, translated from the original Sanskrit, with extracts from the commentaries Kāśikā of Sucaritamiśra and Nyāyarathn=akara of Pārthasārathimiśra, Delhi: Sri Satguru Publications, 1983 (reprint).
  • de Jong, Jan Willem (ed.), 1977, Mūlamadhyamakakārikāḥ / Nāgārjuna, Madras: Adyar Library and Research Centre.
  • Kāśyapa, Jagadīśa (ed.) 1961 Abhidhammapiṭake Kathāvatthupāli, Nālandā, Bihārarājakīya Pālipakasanamaala (Nālandā-Devanāgarī-Pāli-ganthamālāya).
  • Katsura, Shoryu, 1985, “On the origin and development of the concept of vyāpti in Indian logic”, Hiroshima Tetsugakkai, 38: 1–16.
  • –––, 1986, “On trairūpya formulae”, in Buddhism and its relation to other religions: Essays in honour of Dr. Shozen Kumoi on his seventieth birthday, Kyoto: Heirakuji Shoten, 161–172.
  • –––, 2000, “Dignāga on trairūpya reconsidered: a reply to Prof. Oetke”, in Felicitation volume on the occasion of the 70th birthday of Dr. Tosaki Hiromasa, Culture and logic in India, Akihiko Akamatsu (ed.), Fukuoka, Japan: Kyushu University Press, pp. 241–266.
  • –––, 2004a, “The role of dṛṣṭānta in Dignāga’s logic”, in The role of the example (dṛṣṭānta) in classical Indian logic, Shoryu Katsura and Ernst Steinkellner (eds.), Vienna: Arbeitskreis für Tibetische und Buddhistische Studien (Wiener Studien zur Tibetologie und Buddhismuskunde: 58), pp. 135–174.
  • –––, 2004b, “Pakṣa, sapakṣa and asapakṣa in Dignāga's logic”. Hōrin, 11: 119–128.
  • Lamotte, Étienne (ed./trans.), 1935, Samdhi-nirmocana-sūtra: L’explication des mystères (Texte Tibétain édité et traduit), Louvain: Université de Louvain (Recueil de travaux publiés par les membres des Conférences d’Histoire et de Philologie: 2e Série, 343 Fascicule).
  • Malvania, Dalsukhbhai (ed.), 1955, Paṇḍita Durveka Miśra’s Dharmottarapradīpa, being a sub-commentary on Dharmottara’s Nyāyabinduṭīkā, a commentary on Dharmakīrti’s Nyāyabindu, Patna: Kashiprasad Jayaswal Research Institute, 2nd edition, 1971.
  • Musalgaonkar, Gajānan Śastrī (ed.), 1979, Mīmāmsādarśana : tatra śrikumārilabhaṭṭa-viracitam mīmāmsā-ślokavārtikam, tacca śabarabhāṣyeṇa, nyāyaratnākaravyākhyayā tīppaṇṇā [sic] ca saṃvalitam, Vārāṇasī: Bhāratīya Vidyā Prakāśana.
  • Oetke, Claus, 1994, Studies on the doctrine of trairūpya, Vienna: Arbeitskreis für Tibetische und Buddhistische Studien (Wiener Studien zur Tibetologie und Buddhismuskunde: 33).
  • –––, 1996, “Ancient Indian logic as a theory of non-monotonic reasoning”, Journal of Indian Philosophy, 24: 447–539.
  • Pandeya, Ram Chandra (ed.), 1989, ācāryadharmakīteḥ pramāṇavārttikam: granthakartṛviracitayā svopajñavṛttyā ācāryamanorathanandikṛtayā pramāṇavārttikavṛttyā ca samupetam, Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass.
  • Preisendanz, Karin, 2009, “Logic, debate and epistemology in ancient Indian medical science—an investigation into the historyand historiography of Indian philosophy”, Indian Journal of history of science, 44: 261–312.
  • Rahula, Walpola (trans.), 1971, Le compendium de la super-doctrine (philosophie) (Abhidharmasamuccaya) d’Asanga, Paris: École française d’Extrême-Orient.
  • Randle, Herbert Niel, 1930, Indian logic in the early schools. A study of the Nyāyadarśana in its relation to the early logic of other schools, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Rau, Wilhelm (ed.), 1977, Bhartṛharis Vākyapadīya: Die Mūlakārikās nach den Handschriften herausgegeben und mit einem Pāda-Index versehen, Wiesbaden: Steiner (Abhandlungen für die Kunde des Morgenlandes: 42, 4).
  • Sharma, Ram Karan and Bhagawam Dash (eds.) (trans.), 1976, Agniveśa’s Caraka saṃhita: text with English translation and critical exposition based on Cakrapaṇi Datta’s Ayurveda dīpika, Vārāṇasī: Chowkhamba Sanskrit Series Office (Chowkhamba Sanskrit Studies: 94)
  • Shastri, Dvārikādasa (ed.), 1972, Vādanyāyaprakaraṇam ācāryaśantarakṣitakṛtavipañcitārthavyākhyāyutam evaṃ ācāryaprabhācandrakṛtavyākhyānāthā sambandhaparīkṣā, Vārāṇasī: Bauddhabhāratī.
  • ––– (ed.), 1983, Āryanāgārjunīyam Madhyamakaśāstram: Candrakīrtteḥ Prasannapadākhyavṛttyā samvalitam, Vārāṇasī: Bauddhabhāratī.
  • Shcherbatskoï, Fedor Ippolitovich (Stcherbatsky, F. Th.), 1930, Buddhist logic, 2 vols, Saint Petersburg (formerly, Leningrad): Academy of Sciences of the U.S.S.R. (Bibliotheca Buddhica: v. 26). Reprinted: Dover Publications, New York, NY, 1962.
  • Siderits, Mark and Shoryu Katsura (trans.), 2013, Nāgārjuna's Middle Way. Mūlamadhyamakakārikā. Boston, Masssachusetts: Wisdom Publications.
  • Sinha, Nandalal (ed./trans.), 1911, The Vaiśeṣika sūtras of Kaṇāda, with the commentary of Śānkara Miśra and extracts from the gloss of Jayanārāyaṇa. Together with notes from the commentary of Chandrakānta and an introduction by the translator, Allahabad, Pāṇini Office Sacred books of the Hindus: v. 6, pts. 1–4). Reprinted: AMS Press, New York, NY, 1974.
  • Solomon, Esther A., 1976, Indian Dialectics: Methods of Philosophical Discussion, 2 vols, Ahmedabad: B.J. Institute of Learning and Research (Research Series: 70).
  • Sprung, Mervyn (trans.), 1977, Lucid exposition of the middle way: the essential chapters from the Prasannapadā of Candrakīrti (in collaboration with T.R.V. Murti and U.S. Vyas), London: Routledge and K. Paul.
  • Staal, J.F., 1975, Exploring mysticism: a methodological essay, Berkeley, CA: The University of California Press. Reprinted: Penguin Books, Harmondsworth, England, 1976.
  • Steinkellner, Ernst, 1966, “‘Bemerkungen zu Īśvarasenas Lehre vom Grund’’, Wiener Zeitschrift für die Kunde Südasiens, 10:73–85.
  • ––– (ed.), 1967, Dharmakīrti’s Hetubinduḥ, Teil 1, tibetischer Text und rekonstruierter Sanskrit-Text, Vienna: Österreichische Akademie der Wissenschaften (Sitzungsberichte philosophich-historische Klasse: 252/1) (Veröffentlichungen der Kommission für Sprachen und Kulturen Süd-und Ostasiens: 4)
  • ––– (ed.), 1973, Dharmakīrti’s Pramāṇaviniścaya.h 2, Kapitel: Svārthānumānam. Teil II: Übersetzung und Anmerkungen, Vienna: Verlag der Österreichischen Akademie der Wissenschaften (Sitzungsberichte der philosophisch-historischen Klasse: 287) (Veröffentlichungen der Kommission für Sprachen und Kulturen Südasiens: 12).
  • –––, 1993, “Buddhist logic: the search for certainty”, in Buddhist Spirituality: Indian, Southeast Asian, Tibetan, and Early Chinese, Takeuchi Yoshinori (ed.), New York, NY: Crossroad, pp. 171–187.
  • –––, 1997, “Kumārila, Īśvarasena, Dharmakīrti in dialogue. A new interpretation of Pramāṇavārttika I 33”, in Bauddhavidyāsudhākaraḥ: Studies in Honour of Heinz Bechert on the Occasion of His 65th Birthday, Petra Kieffer-Pulz and Jens-Uwe Hartmann (eds.), Swisttal-Odendorf: Indica et Tibetica Verlag (Monographien zu den Sprachen und Literaturen des indo-tibetischen Kulturraumes: 30), pp. 625–646.
  • Subramania Iyer, K.A. (trans.), 1965, The Vākyapadīya of Bhartṛhari with the Vṛtti: chapter I, English translation, Pune: Deccan College (Deccan College Building Centenary and Silver Jubilee Series: v. 26).
  • ––– (trans.), 1971, The Vākyapadīya of Bhartṛhari, chapter 3, part I: English translation, Pune: Deccan College (Deccan College Building Centenary and Silver Jubilee Series: v. 71).
  • ––– (trans.), 1974, Vākyapadīya of Bhartṛhari with the commentary of Helārāja, kāṇḍa III, part II; English translation with exegetical notes, Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass.
  • ––– (trans.), 1977, Vākyapadīya of Bhartṛhari, kāṇḍa II; English translation with exegetical notes, Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass.
  • Taber, John, 2004, “Is Indian logic nonmonotonic?”, Philosophy East and West, 54: 143–170.
  • Tachikawa, Musashi, 1971, “A sixth-century manual of Indian logic. A translation of the Nyāya-praveśa”, Journal of Indian Philosophy, 1: 111–145.
  • Taranatha and Amarendramohan (eds.), 1936, Nyāya-darśanam with Vātsyāyana’s Bhāṣya, Uddyotakara’s Vārttika, Vācaspati Miśra’s Tātparyaṭīkā and Viśvanātha’s Vṛtti, Delhi: Munshiram Mahoharlal Publishers Limited, 1985 (reprint).
  • Tatia, Nathamal (ed.), 1976, Abhidharmasamuccaya-bhāṣyam, Patna, Kashi Prasad Jayaswal Institute (Tibetan Sanskrit Works Series: 17), 2nd edition, 2005.
  • Tillemans, Tom J.F. (trans.), 2000, Dharmakīrti’s Pramāṇa-vārttaka: An annotated translation of the fourth chapter (parārthānumāna), Vienna: Verlag der Österreichischen Akademie der Wissenschaften (Sitzungsberichte philosophisch-historische Klasse: 675) (Veröffentlichungen der Kommission für Sprachen und Kulturen Südasiens: 32).
  • Trenckner, Vilheim (ed.), 1880, The Milindapañho with Milinda-ṭīkā, London, Pali Text Society, indexed by C.J. Rylands and Caroline A.F. Rhys Davids, re-edited by Padmanabh S. Jaini, 1961. Reprinted: 1986.
  • Tucci, Giuseppe, 1929, Pre-Dinnāga Texts on Logic from Chinese Sources, Baroda: Oriental Institute (Gaekwad’s Oriental Series: 49).
  • ––– (trans.), 1930, The Nyāyamukha of Dignāga: The Oldest Buddhist Test on Logic, Heidelberg, Otto Harrasowitch (Materialen sur Kunde des Buddhismus: 15).
  • Uno, Tomoyuki, 2009, “On the Theory of Logic in the Niryukti Literature”, 14th World Sanskrit Congress, Kyoto, Japan.
  • Vetter, Tilmann (ed.), 1966, Dharmakīrti’s Pramāṇaviniścaya.h 1, Kapitel: Pratyakṣam, Vienna: Verlag der Österreichischen Akademie der Wissenschaften (Sitzungsberichte der philosophisch-historischen Klasse: 250/3) (Veröffentlichungen der Kommission für Sprachen und Kulturen Südasiens: 3).

Other Internet Resources

Copyright © 2016 by
Brendan Gillon <brendan.gillon@mcgill.ca>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free