Linear Logic

First published Wed Sep 6, 2006; substantive revision Fri Sep 19, 2014

Linear logic is a refinement of classical and intuitionistic logic. Instead of emphasizing truth, as in classical logic, or proof, as in intuitionistic logic, linear logic emphasizes the role of formulas as resources. To achieve this focus, linear logic does not allow the usual structural rules of contraction and weakening to apply to all formulas but only those formulas marked with certain modals. Linear logic contains a fully involutive negation while maintaining a strong constructive interpretation. Linear logic also provides new insights into the nature of proofs in both classical and intuitionistic logic. Given its focus on resources, linear logic has found many applications in Computer Science.

1. Legend

This entry uses special symbols that have become standard in texts on linear logic. We've told your web browser to display them as certain Unicode symbols. However, not all browsers will have these symbols available in all fonts.

Symbol What Your Browser Displays What It Should Look Like
additive and & &
additive or additive or
multiplicative and multiplicative and
multiplicative or multiplicative or
classical conjunction classical conjunction
top top
classical disjunction classical disjunction
bottom bottom
linear implication linear implication

Follow the instructions on our Displaying Special Characters page if the symbol displayed in the middle column of the following table doesn't look roughly like the graphic displayed in the right column.

2. Introduction

2.1 A bit of history

Linear logic was introduced by Jean-Yves Girard in his seminal work Girard 1987. While the origin of the discovery of this new logic come from a semantical analysis of the models of System F (or polymorphic lambda calculus), one can see the whole system of linear logic as a bold attempt to reconcile the beauty and symmetry of the systems for classical logic with the quest for constructive proofs that had led to intuitionistic logic.

Indeed, one could present a first fragment of linear logic, known as multiplicative additive linear logic (MALL), as the outcome of two simple observations:

  • In the sequent calculus presentation of classical logic, the rules for the connectives “and” and “or”, as well as the Cut rule and the rule for implication may be presented equivalently in an additive form (the context of the premises are the same) or a multiplicative form (the context of the premises are different). These two presentations are equivalent, in classical logic, because of the availability of a few so-called “structural” rules, namely, contraction and weakening.
  • The non-constructive proofs that one can perform in classical logic actually use, in the sequent calculus presentation, one or the other of these structural rules.

So, if we want to eliminate the non-constructive proofs without destroying the symmetry of the sequent calculus, as is done in intuitionistic logic, we can try to eliminate the contraction and weakening rules instead. In doing so, we are left with two different versions of each connective: one additive version for and and or, and one multiplicative version of and and or, which are now no longer equivalent. These new connectives are called & (additive and), ⊕ (additive or), ⊗ (multiplicative and) and ⅋ (multiplicative or).

This duplication of the connectives actually leads to a much clearer understanding of the conflict between classical and intuitionistic logic: the law of excluded middle, for example (A or not-A), is considered an evidence in the classical world, and considered absurd in the intuitionistic one. But in linear logic, this law has two readings, the additive (A ⊕ ¬A) and the multiplicative (A ⅋ ¬A): the additive one is not provable, and corresponds to the intuitionistic reading of disjunction; the multiplicative one is trivially provable and simply corresponds to the tautology (A implies A) that is perfectly acceptable in intuitionistic logic too.

Also, the disjunction property, essential in constructivism, is easily established for the additive disjunction.

We find then inside this richer language a way to represent both the needs of intuitionism and the elegance of classical logic: negation is involutive, sequents are symmetric, connectives are inter-definable, models are simple, and yet for the right encoding of intuitionistic logic into linear logic we can establish a soundness and completeness theorem. Contrast these properties with those of intuitionistic logic, where negation is not involutive, sequents are not symmetric, connectives are all not inter-definable, and Kripke models are quite more involved than boolean algebras.

Notice though that once one has eliminated the contraction and weakening rule, formulas no longer behave as immutable truth values: indeed, when we have a proof of AB and a proof of A in linear logic, by composing them we actually consume them to get a proof of B, so that AB and A are no longer available after the composition. Linear logic formulas behave now more like resources that can only be used once.

To recover the full expressive power of intuitionistic and classical logic, it is then necessary to add to the MALL fragment two dual “modalities” that allow to arbitrarily duplicate (the ! modality) or discard resources (the ? modality): for the formulas !B and ?B, and only for these, we are allowed to use contraction and weakening. This leads to the full propositional linear logic, and to a very nice connection with computer science.

Notice that besides MALL, there are two other widely used fragments of Linear Logic: Multiplicative Linear Logic (MLL), which is MALL without the additive connectives; and Multiplicative Exponential Linear Logic (MELL), which is Linear Logic without the additive connectives.

2.2 Linear logic and computer science

Logic, or at least proof-theory, is focused on formal proof systems: intuitionistic predicate calculus, classical predicate calculus, arithmetics, higher order calculi, and a wealth of similar consistent and structured sets of process-building rules. Intuitionistic and constructive logic began when people saw the possibility of reading ‘AB’ as ‘if you give me an A, I will give you a B’, which is a significant departure from the classical reading ‘B is true whenever A is’.

Computer science, on the other hand, focuses on computational mechanisms: function application, exception handling, method invocation in object oriented languages, variable assignment and similar sets of process-building rules. Except that the mechanisms of these processes have to be made explicit: a function of type AB gives a formal account of how to transform an A into a B.

At a given moment these two sciences met. People realized that the set of implication-only intuitionistic deductions was a core functional language called simply-typed lambda-calculus: the programming language was a logic, the logic a programming language. This memorable meeting was called the ‘Curry-Howard isomorphism’ (Howard 1980).

Linear logic begins with a further twist in the reading of ‘AB’: read now ‘give me as many A as I might need and I will give you one B’. The notion of copy which is so central to the idea of computation is now wired into the logic.

This new viewpoint opens up new possibilities, including:

  • new formulas expressing refined operational properties like ‘give me A once and I will give you B’. Applications here range from knowledge representation in AI, refined logic programming where the ability of linear logic to represent states is put to use, analysis of classical logic and computational interpretations thereof, namely exception mechanisms in programming languages, by means of embeddings in linear logic, refined temporal logics, linearity analysis.
  • new rules expressing constraints on the use of copies resulting in a fragment of linear logic for polytime computations to mention only the most spectacular application.
  • new ways of representing proofs

3. Proof Systems

The core propositional connectives of linear logic are divided into additive and multiplicative connectives. The classical conjunction and its identity, ∧ and ⊤, split into the additive & (with) and ⊤ (top) and the multiplicative ⊗ (tensor) and 1 (one). Similarly, the classical disjunction and its identity, ∨ and ⊥, split into the additive ⊕ (oplus) and 0 (zero) and the multiplicative ⅋ (par) and ⊥ (bottom). Negation is generally treated in one of two ways in presentations a linear logic. Negation can be viewed as a primitive propositional connective with no restrictions on its occurrences within formulas. Since deMorgan dualities exist between negation and all propositional connectives, exponentials, and quantifiers, it is also possible to treat negation as a special system that only occurs applied to atomic formulas. Implications are also commonly introduced into linear logic via definitions: the linear implication BC can be defined as ¬BC, while the intuitionistic implication BC can be defined as !BC. The operators ! and ? are variously called modals or exponentials. The term “exponential” is particularly appropriate since, following the usual relationship between exponentiation, addition, and multiplication, linear logic supports the equivalences !(B & C) ≡ (!B!C) and ?(BC) ≡ (?B?C), as well as the 0-ary versions of these equivalences, namely, (!⊤ ≡ 1) and (?0 ≡ ⊥). Here, we use the binary equivalence BC to mean that the formula (BC) & (CB) is derivable in linear logic.

3.1 Sequent calculus

A two-sided sequent calculus for linear logic is presented in the figure below. Notice here that negation is treated as if it were any other logic connective: that is, its occurrences in formulas are not restricted and there are introduction rules on the left and right for negation.

Two sided sequent calculus for linear logic
Two sided sequent calculus for linear logic

Here, the left and right side of sequents are multiset of formulas: thus, the order of formulas in these contexts does not matter but their multiplicity does matter. Notice that the rules of weakening and contraction are available only for formulas marked with the exponential ! on the left or ? on the right of the sequent. The usual proviso for the ∀-right and ∃-left introduction rules are assumed: in particular, the variable y must not be free in the formulas of the sequent conclusion of those inference rules. Quantification here is assumed to be first-order: higher-order versions of linear logic can be written along standard lines.

The cut rule can be eliminated and completeness is still maintained. Dually, the init rule can also be eliminated as well except for the occurrences of init involving atomic formulas.

3.2 Focused proofs

An important normal form theorem for the structure of cut-free proofs was provided by Andreoli (1992). He classified a non-atomic formula as asynchronous if its top-level logical connective is ⊤, &, ⊥, ⅋, ?, or ∀ or synchronous if its top-level logical connective is 0, ⊕, 1, ⊗, !, or ∃.

When viewing proof search as a computational model, we can see formulas in a sequent as being “agents” that may act independently or in concert with others in its environment: the action of the agent is determined by reading the introduction rule for it bottom-up. If an asynchronous formula occurs on the right of a sequent, it can evolve without affecting provability and without interacting with its context, i.e., the corresponding introduction rule is invertible. For example, the agent (BC) becomes (by applying the ⅋-right introduction rule) the two agents B and C (now working in parallel). Similarly, the agent (B & C) yields (by applying the &-right introduction rule) two different identical worlds (sequents) except that B is in one of these worlds and C is in the other.

On the other hand, if we view a synchronous formula as an agent whose evolution is determined by the corresponding right-introduction rule, then it is possible for a provable sequent to evolve to a non-provable sequent (for example, by applying the ⊕ right-introduction rule). Also, the instances of such inference rules depend on details of the context of the formula. For example, the success of the 1-right introduction rule requires that the surrounding context must be empty and the success of the ⊗-right introduction rule can depends on how the agent's surround context is divided into two different sequents. Thus, the evolution of such agents depend on “synchronizing” with other parts of the context.

Now consider a one-sided sequent calculus presentation of linear logic where the only introduction rules are right-introduction rules. Given the above classification of connectives, it is possible to show that proof search can be structured into the following phases without loss of completeness. The asynchronous phase occurs if there is an asynchronous formula present in the sequent. In this phase, right-introduction rules are applied in any order until there are no further asynchronous formulas. In the synchronous phase some synchronous formula is selected and becomes the “focus” of this phase: that is, right-introduction rules are applied to it and to any synchronous subformula that it might generate.

The following figure illustrates the focusing proof system linear logic. Notice that the two phases are represented by different arrows: the up-arrow denotes the asynchronous phase and the down-arrow denotes the synchronous phase. Atoms are given polarity and in the figure below, A stands for positive atoms and the negation of A stands for negative atoms. In this proof system, Ψ denotes a set of formulas and Δ and L denote multisets of formulas. Since L appears only in rules involve the up-arrow, it is also possible for L to denote a list: that is, it is possible to impose an arbitrary order on the formulas to the right of the up-arrow since the introduction of asynchronous formulas can be done in any order. Proofs built by these inference rules are called focused proofs. The result in Andreoli 1992 is that focused proofs are complete for linear logic.

Focused proof system
Focused proof systems have also been designed for classical and intuitionistic logics (Danos et al. 1997; Laurent et al. 2005; Liang & Miller 2009).

3.3 Proof nets

Proofs presented using sequent calculus contain a lot of detail that sometimes is uninteresting: consider for example how many uninterestingly different ways there are to form a proof of ⊢ Γ, (A1A2), …, (An-1An) from a derivation of ⊢ Γ, A1, A2, …, An. This unpleasant fact derives from the sequential nature of proofs in sequent calculus: if we want to apply a set S of n rules to different parts of a sequent, we cannot apply them in one step, even if they do not interfere with each other! We must sequentialize them, i.e., choose a linear order on S and apply the rules in n steps, according to this order. This sequential nature of the sequent calculus is a major obstacle when doing proofs of cut-elimination, for example, where one needs to take into account also all the non-interesting derivations.

A natural question arises: “is there a representation of proofs that abstracts from such uninteresting details?”. A similar question is answered positively in the case of intuitionistic sequent calculus by means of what is known as natural deduction, that has, via the Curry-Howard correspondence, a strong connection with the computational device known as lambda calculus.

For linear logic, this succinct representation of proofs is given by proof nets, graph-like structures that enjoy particularly good properties for the MLL fragment of the logic. The first step towards this representation is to convert all the sequent calculus system, using the involutivity of negation, into a one-sided system, where sequents are of the form ⊢ Γ. As a consequence, the number of rules is halved, as we keep only the left column of the system shown above, but we keep the same expressive power, as provability stays the same.

To each asymmetric sequent calculus proof of in MLL, one can inductively associate a proof net with the same conclusions as follows:

  • To a proof reduced to the axiom rule, we associate an axiom link
    Axiom net
  • For a proof obtained by applying the cut rule to two proofs P1 and P2, we first inductively build the proof nets associated to P1 and P2, and then we combine them using a cut link
    Cut net construction
  • For a proof obtained by applying the tensor rule to two proofs P1 and P2, we first inductively build the proof nets associated to P1 and P2, and then we combine them using a tensor link
    Tensor net construction
  • For a proof obtained by applying the par rule to a proof P1, we first inductively build the proof net associated to P1, and then we add a “par link”
    Par net construction

All this can be properly formalized using hypergraphs (formulas are nodes and “links” are oriented hyperedges with hypotheses and conclusions), and we can formally define as a proof net a hypergraph inductively built out of a sequent calculus derivation of MLL. Notice that there are quite a lot of hypergraphs that are not proof nets.

Now if you look at the proof net built from the derivations of ⊢ Γ, (A1A2), …, (An−1An) obtained from ⊢ Γ, A1, A2, …, An, you will see that all trace of the order of application of the rules has disappeared. In a sense, the proof nets are an equivalence class of sequent calculus derivations with respect to the derivation order of rules whose application commute.

Suppose that somebody now comes to you with a huge hypergraph built with axiom, cut, par and tensor links, pretending that it is actually a concise representation of the proof of some long standing open mathematical problem. How can you verify that it is actually a representation of a proof, and not just a random structure?

Performing this correctness check is a challenge that amounts to rebuilding a sequential construction history for your structure, corresponding to a derivation in sequent calculus, and seems at first a very complex problem: the first correctness criterion for MLL proof nets, called the “long trip criterion”, and present in Girard's original paper, is exponential, as well as the ACC (Acyclic connected) criterion of Danos and Regnier found later on. Nevertheless, there exists a much more efficient criterion, known as Contractibility, due to Danos and Regnier, that has more recently been reformulated as the following elegant graph parsing criterion by Guerrini, Martini and Masini: a hypergraph is a proof net if and only if it reduces to the singleton node “net” via the following graph reduction rules

Graph Parsing for MLL proof net recognition

Performing this check naively can take quadratic time (each application of a rule may require an entire lookup of the graph to find the redex, and we need to perform as many steps as there are hyperlinks in the graph), but a result due to Guerrini shows how to actually perform this check in almost linear time. Many other correctness criteria are known, some of which also linear, like the one by Murawski and Ong derived from a criterion for Intuitionistic MLL.

On proof nets, one can perform cut elimination in a particularly clean way: due to their parallel nature, cuts can be eliminated locally via two simplification rules:

  • Axiom move:
    Axiom move
  • Multiplicative move:
    Multiplicative move

These are actually computation rules over proof nets, and the correctness criteria allow to verify easily that any such rule preserves correctness, and as a consequence the reductum of a proof net still comes from a sequent calculus proof of the same sequent.

Hence, cut elimination in MLL proof nets can be performed in linear time, and gives a simple, elegant cut-elimination result for all of MLL.

The proof nets approach can be extended to larger subsets of linear logic, but then it is less clear how to obtain the same elegant results as for MLL: the original system proposed in Girard 1987 works for MELL, for example, by associating to the four exponential rules the following hypergraph constructions:

  • Contraction
    Contraction construction
  • Weakening
    Weakening construction
  • Dereliction
    Dereliction construction
  • Promotion, that introduces the notion of “box”, a sequentialisation mark around a piece of a proof net materialised in the pictures of the graphs by the rectangle drawn around the proof net of conclusions A and ?Γ.
    Promotion construction

While these constructions, and the associated graph reductions bear striking similarity with lambda calculus with explicit substitutions, as first remarked by Di Cosmo & Kesner (1997), they are too similar to the corresponding sequent calculus rules: the parallelization effect so elegant for MLL does not properly carry on here, and the graph reduction rules involve boxes and are not local.

To recover a satisfactory system, many proposals have been made, starting from the one by Danos & Regnier (1993) but we want to mention here the very elegant approach by Guerrini, Martini and Masini (Guerrini et al. 2003), that neatly shows the connection between two level proof systems for modal logic, proper proof nets for MELL, and optimal reduction in the lambda calculus.

Extending proof nets to include a treatment of the additive connectives has various technical presentations, none of which appears canonical and satisfactory. Their treatment in proof-net-like proof systems is currently a topic of active research. A recent paper by Heijltjes and Houston (2014) has shown that there can be no satisfactory notion of proof nets for MLL with units (under current complexity assumptions).

4. Semantics

Approaching the semantics of linear logic is usually done along two different paths. First, there are various semantic structures available to characterize “truth” in a model. Such approaches can be used to establish soundness and completeness for (some fragments of) linear logic. A more novel semantic approach to linear logic involves giving semantics to proof object directly. We describe briefly these two approaches and provide some links to the literature.

4.1 Semantics of provability

One approach to attempting a sound and complete semantics for fragments of linear logic associates to a formula the set of all contexts that can be used to prove that formula. Of course, such a collection may need to be more abstract and to be given various closure properties. The phase semantics of Girard (1987) provides one such semantics: some uses of such semantics have been made in computer science to provide counterexamples and as a tool that can help establish that a given concurrent systems cannot evolve into another with certain properties (Fages et al. 2001). Similarly, Kripke-style semantics have been provided in Allwein & Dunn 1993 and Hodas & Miller 1994. Quantales, certain kind of partially ordered algebraic structures, have also been used to provide early semantic models for parts of linear logic (Yetter 1990).

4.2 Semantics of proofs

In the formulas-as-types analogy which is so popular and fruitful in theoretical computer science, a logical system is put in correspondence with a typed computational device (like typed lambda calculus), by associating to each proof of a formula a program having as type that very formula. For example, a proof of the tautology AA corresponds to the program fun (x:A).x : AA, the identity function on objects of type A. This is why, in constructive logical systems, and in linear logic, so much importance is attached to proofs, to the point that building and studying models of proofs gets so much more attention than building and studying models of provability: we are not satisfied to know that a formula is provable, we really want to know the computational content of its proof.

Many models of linear logic proofs have been proposed; we consider that, to date, the simplest and most intuitive construction is those based on the so-called “relational semantics”, where formulas are interpreted as multisets, sequents as tuples of multisets and proofs as relations over the interpretation of sequents. If one wants to give a purely set-theoretic semantics, without resorting to multisets, it is possible to do it by means of coherence spaces, sets equipped with a special coherence relation, as originally shown by in Girard 1987. There are interesting category theoretical models of linear logic, such as the *-autonomous categories (Barr 1991) and hypercoherences (Ehrhard 1993).

Another approach to semantics of proofs is given by Girard's Geometry of Interaction, that allows to obtain a fully algebraic characterization of proofs: to each proof net, one can associate a partial permutation matrix σ corresponding to the cut links, and a proper matrix M corresponding to the pure net whose entries contain expressions built out of the so-called dynamic algebra, that describe the possible paths inside the pure net. It is then possible to fully describe the proof net via the execution formula

EX(σ,M) = (1−σ2) ( ∑i MM) ) (1−σ2)

which, in the MLL case, is an invariant of the normalization process. Some nice connection to results coming from data-flow theory has been shown in some early work of Abramsky & Jagadeesan (1994).

The area of semantics that has developed around so-called game semantics deserves special attention. The strong connection between games and linear logic was pointed out quite early by A. Blass (1992). In fact, there are two different traditions to connecting logic to games. In the tradition of dialog games dating back to Lorenzen, one player attempts to prove a formula while a second attempts to refute it. It is possible to provide MALL with such a dialog game that is completely symmetric for both the prover and the refuter (Delande et al. 2010). In another tradition, formulas are interpreted as games, logical connectives as game constructors, and proofs as strategies that describe how a player reacts to opponent moves. By imposing different restrictions on the rules of the game, one can actually provide a precise semantics (technically, a fully abstract model) for various features of actual programming languages, whence the huge interest in this area over the past years. See, for example, Abramsky & Jagadeesan 1994, Abramsky & Melliès 1999, and Hyland & Ong 2000.

5. Complexity

An extensive research work has been dedicated to the study of the complexity and decidability issues for several fragments of propositional linear logic. It is known that

  • MLL provability is NP-complete (Kanovich 1992)
  • MALL provability is PSPACE-complete (Lincoln et al. 1992)
  • LL provability is undecidable (Lincoln 1995)
  • the question of decidability is still open concerning MELL: given that Petri net reachability can be encoded into MELL (Gunter & Gehlot 1989), deciding the latter must be at least EXPSPACE-hard.

Surprisingly, for those that may forget that the novelty in linear logic lies in the way formulas are managed without structural rules, these results stay the same even if we focus on the fragments of the logics where only the constants, and no propositional variables, are allowed (Kanovich 1994, Lincoln & Winkler 1994). Indeed, it is possible to encode arbitrary formulas into constant-only formulas preserving provability.

A good overview of complexity results surrounding linear logic can be found in Lincoln 1995.

6. Computer science impact

When intuitionistic logic was first proposed early in the last century, it was presented as a challenge to the way traditional mathematicians were suppose to do business. Uses of the excluded middle and of proof-by-contradiction were considered suspect and problematic, particularly in the presence of infinity. As intuitionistic logic concerns were developed into constructive mathematics, new constructive approaches have arisen to topics such as topology, algebra, and analysis. Given that linear logic encompasses dynamics of proof (algorithm) and resources, its primary impacts has been not in traditional mathematics but in computer science. Before overviewing the nature of that impact, we outline the various ways in which logic more generally is used in computer science.

Logic plays different roles in the specification of computations. We can identify the following broad different approaches and note which roles have felt influences from linear logic.

In the computation-as-model approach, computations are encoded as mathematical structures and consist of such items as nodes, transitions, and states. Logic is used in an external sense to make statements about those structures. That is, computations are used as models for logical expressions. Intensional operators, such as the modals of temporal and dynamic logics or the triples of Hoare logic, are often employed to express propositions about the change in state. This use of logic to represent and reason about computation is probably the oldest and most broadly successful use of logic for representing computation. This role for logic has felt little influence from linear logic.

In the computation-as-deduction approach, pieces of logic's syntax (such as formulas, terms, types, and proofs) are used directly as elements of the specified computation. In this more rarefied setting, there are two rather different approaches to how computation is modeled, called the proof normalization approach and the proof search approach.

We outline below the significant impacts that linear logic has had on both of these different settings.

6.1 Proof normalization

The proof normalization approach views the state of a computation as a proof term and the process of computing as normalization (known alternatively as β-reduction or cut-elimination). Functional programming can be explained using proof-normalization as its theoretical basis (Martin-Löf 1982) and has been used to justify the design of new functional programming languages, e.g., Abramsky 1993. Linear logic provides this approach to computational specification with new types, new declarative means for statically understand how resources may be used in a computation, and provided an appealing means for formalizing the duality between a function and the environment that supplies it with arguments.

Another area where linear logic has been a powerful theoretical instrument is that of optimal reduction. The problem of building efficient (optimal) interpreters for the Lambda Calculus, that stayed open for quiet a long time after its original definition by J.J. Lévy, was solved for the first time in Lamping 1990, via a sophisticated sharing graph implementation involving a quite impressive amount of rules. Using ideas and intuition from linear logic, many authors reconstructed Lamping's solution, simplifying it and leading to a rich theory connected to that of the Geometry of Interaction. A good reference for those interested is the book “The optimal implementation of functional programming languages” by Asperti and Guerrini.

The refinement of intuitionistic logic provided by linear logic and the dualities of linear logic provided a setting in which one could view a function and its environment as similar entities that interact dually. For example, a function with the type α ⊸ β can be modeled as a process that consumes a value of type α from its environment and transforms it into a value of type β. In linear logic, this implication is equivalent to its contrapositive form: the type ¬β ⊸ ¬α can be lead to interpreting the same function as a process that transforms a demand for a value of type β into a demand for a value of type α (notice that this does not happen with functions of intuitionistic type since, for example, input argument may be vacuous) [Curien 2003]. The recent successes of using game semantics to model functional computation are similarly related to dual treatment of function and environment (Abramsky and Jagadeesan 1994, Hyland & Ong 2000).

Finally, we mention that in the area of encoding computation as proof normalization, linear logic has been used to provide a type-based description of polytime recursive functions. For example, M. Hofmann (2003) introduced a λ-calculus with modal and linear types that extended the function algebra of Bellantoni & Cook 1992 to higher types. Types based on linear logic have also been used within functional programs: see Guzman & Hudak 1990 and Wadler 1991.

6.2 Proof search

The proof search approach views the state of a computation as a sequent (a structured collection of formulas) and the process of computing as the process of searching for a proof of a sequent: the changes that take place in sequents capture the dynamics of computation. Logic programming can be explained using proof search as its theoretical basis, and linear logic provides this approach to computational specification with new combinators for building logic programs, new means to capture rich dynamics, and new declarative approaches to specify concurrent computations. (See Miller 2004 for an overview of linear logic programming languages.)

The completeness of focusing proof system can be used to provide a declarative explanation of part of the operational semantics of logic programming within linear logic. Consider, for example, the subset L of formulas of linear logic that are built from only the connectives ⊤, &, ⊸, ⇒, and ∀. (Notice that if one adds ⊥ to this list, it is possible to encode all connectives of linear logic.) It is possible to see that cut-free proof search in L can be defined into to phases. Given a sequent Ψ; Δ → G, where Γ is a set of formulas (assumed to have an implicit ! applied to its formulas), Δ is multiset of formulas, and G is a single formula (all from L), then proof search proceeds as follows.

  1. If G is non-atomic, then only a right introduction can be used to conclude this sequent. Given this set of connectives, the right rules are invertible and this goal-reduction phase corresponds exactly to the asynchronous phase of focused proofs.
  2. If G is atomic, then proof search proceeds by deciding on a single formula from a left-hand context.
  3. Once a formula is chosen for the focus, all left-introduction rules are applied to only that formula and any positive subformulas that arise. This backchaining phase corresponds to the asynchronous phase of focused proof construction.

Formally, these various phases can be described using the following single inference rules. Notice that a new sequent arrow is introduced: this arrow is labeled with the formula that is the result of a left-introduction rule. Notice that the rule for left-introduction of ⊸ requires splitting the bounded context Δ12 into two parts (when reading the rule bottom up). There are, of course, 2n such splittings if that context has n ≥ 0 distinct formulas.

Focused proof system for a logic programming language

Linear logic restricted to L can be viewed as a linear logic programming language. As a consequence, it can serve as a specification language for computational systems, a role that is also occupied by, say, Petri nets, process calculi, λ-calculus, etc. Given that linear logic has a proof theory and various kinds of semantics, broad avenues of reasoning about computations specified in L are provided by the meta-theory of linear logic.

Given that the sequent calculus for linear logic uses multisets of formulas, proof search can directly encode multiset rewriting. Since many computations can naturally be seen as multiset rewriting, it has been possible to make numerous connections between linear logic and Petri nets (Gunter & Gehlot 1989), process calculi (Andreoli & Pareschi 1991, Kobayashi et al. 1999, Miller 1996), and security protocols (Cervesato et al. 1999, Miller 2003).

7. Variations

7.1 Different treatments of modality

The exponentials ! and ? in linear logic are less carved in the marble than the other connectives. Indeed, if one uses traditional sequent calculus presentations, the exponentials are not “canonical”: if you introduce another copy of exponentials, say !′ and ?′, with the same rules as the original ones, there is no way to prove that ! is equivalent to !′, and ? to ?′, while for the other connectives this is easily established. Various applications of “non-canonical” exponentials can be found in (Danos et. al., 1993; Nigam & Miller, 2009). Martini and Masini 1995 describe a “2-sequent” proof system in which the exponentials are canonical.

In this respect, the ! and ? resemble the box and diamond connectives found in modal logic, and it is then possible and interesting to study variations for the logical rules of these connectives. For example, elementary linear logic (ELL) is obtained by replacing the ! and ? introduction by a single rule introducing ! and ? at the same time. As a consequence, ELL can encode all and only the functions over integers that normalize in time bounded by an elementary function.

Other variations are light linear logic (Girard 1998), soft linear logic (Lafont 2004), and many others (see for example Baillot & Terui 2004).

7.2 Non-commutative linear logic

While linear logic rejects the universal application of the two structural rules of weakening and contraction, it allows the unrestricted use of the structural rule called exchange. A sequent calculus that does not universally employ the exchange rule has sequents whose left and right contexts are lists: the order of formulas within context becomes an expressive element of the logic. In this case, the multiplicative disjunction and conjunction can become non-commutative.

One of the first logics that rejects all three structural rules of the sequent calculus was given in Lambek 1958. While this logic contains two implications, it does not contain a negation nor exponentials. Various recent papers have proposed extending linear logic to include non-commutative features and, at present, no proposal seems canonical. For a sampling of non-commutative linear logics, see Yetter 1990, Abrusci 1991, Retoré 1997, Abrusci & Ruet 1999, and Guglielmi & Strassburger 2001.

7.3 Treatment of unbounded behavior

The core of linear logic is MALL: much of what is novel about linear logic can be found in MALL. Since it is decidable, one must extend it to allow for modeling unbounded behaviors. Two different modeling approaches have appeared in the literature. The first is the addition of the exponential ! and ?, as has been described above. A second approach involves the addition of the least and greatest fixed point operators directly to MALL. In order to properly characterize fixed points as being either the least or the greatest, it is necessary for the inference rules for fixed points to be “higher-order” in the sense that they involve invariants. Such an extension to MALL (also with first-order quantification and term equality) has been developed by Baelde (Baelde & Miller, 2007; Baelde 2012).

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