Notes to Logic and Ontology

1. I am exaggerating, of course, since words like “are” have to be fixed as well, as in “All men are mortal, all mortals are doomed, thus all men are doomed.”

2. For much more on all these issues related to the philosophy of logic I would recommend (Engel 1991), an introduction to the philosophy of logic. It covers many more topics than we can touch on here. However, it does not specifically deal with the relationship between logic and ontology. A classic, but opinionated, introduction to the philosophy of logic is (Quine 1970). Other introductory texts in the philosophy of logic include (Haack 1978) and (Reid 1995).

3. This, of course, assumes that the canonical notation involves variables. This doesn't have to be so, but is so for many formal systems, including the one that usually comes up in this context: first order logic.

4. Whether “There are Fs” contains a quantifier is not so clear since none of the words in this sentence are strictly speaking quantifier phrases, except possibly “Fs” which could be a plural quantifier. That this is often seen as a paradigmatic case of a quantified statement is often based on the confusion that “there is” is a quantifier in “There is a number between 6 and 8”. Strictly speaking “a number” is the quantifier, though, and “there is” seems to be the improperly named ‘existential construction’, discussed, for example, in (Barwise and Cooper 1981).

Copyright © 2011 by
Thomas Hofweber <>

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