Notes to Madeleine de Scudéry

1. France's leading dramatist, Pierre Corneille (1606–84) was especially noted for his tragedy Le Cid (1637).

2. Jean-Louis Guez de Balzac (1597–1654) was a French author known for his letters and literary dialogues, often criticized for their libertine sentiments.

3. A founder of the Académie française, Valentin Conrart (1603–75) was a French author known especially for his memoirs.

4. A poet and critic, Jean Chapelain (1595–1674) defended the value of the neo-Aristotelian unities of time, place, and action in literary works.

5. A classical scholar with strong interests in philology, Gilles Ménage (1613–92) authored a pioneering history of women philosophers: Historia mulierium philosopharum (1690).

6. Anne Marie Louise d'Orléans, duchesse de Montpensier (1627–93) was the cousin of Louis XIV and a partisan of the Fronde (1648–53), a coalition of aristocrats and parliamentarians opposed to royal absolutism. Hostess of a prominent salon, Montpensier wrote novels, literary portraits, and memoirs.

7. Marie de Rabutin-Chantal, marquise de Sévigné (1626–96) achieved literary renown through her letters to her daughter, Madame de Grignan, a militant Cartesian.

8. Marie-Madeleine Pioche de La Vergne, comtesse de Lafayette (1634–93) acquired literary fame through her novels, especially Le Princesse de Clèves (1678).

9. The niece of René Descartes, Catherine Descartes (1637–1706) was noted for her poetry, often devoted to the defense of her uncle's theories.

10. A member of the Académie française, Isaac de Benserade (1613–91) was a dramatist, poet, and translator. Also a member of the Académie, Vincent Voiture (1597–1648) composed poetry that often commented on the debates in Parisian salon society. The dispute over the relative merits of their two sonnets involved differing interpretations of the neo-Aristotelian unities in literature.

11. In Heptameron, Marguerite of Navarre (1492–1549) presents a series of tales centered on the problems of romantic love, infidelity, and forgiveness. In his essay “Of Friendship,” Michel Eyquem de Montaigne (1533–92) rejects classical theories of multiple types of friendship and, following Cicero, insists that authentic friendship is of a rare and unitive nature. A disciple of Montaigne, Pierre Charron (1541–1603) offers a different analysis of friendship in On Wisdom (1601), which argues that friendship legitimately admits of different kinds and degrees, tied to the multiplicity of social relationships established by the moral agent.

12. A partisan of the Jansenists, Madeleine de Souvré, marquise de Sablé (1599–1678) hosted a salon noted for its production of maxim-collections.

13. Françoise d'Aubigné (1635–1719) married the poet Paul Scarron in 1651 and soon became a participant in the literary salons of Paris. Governess of the illegitimate children of Louis XIV, the widow Scarron was elevated to the title of marquise de Maintenon in 1678; she married the widowed king in 1685 in a secret, morganatic marriage. Founder of the celebrated school for women at Saint-Cyr, Maintenon composed numerous discourses and literary dialogues tied to the work of education.

14. An historian and pamphleteer, Paul Pellisson (1623–93) was imprisoned by Louis XIV for his stout defense of the disgraced finance minister, Nicolas Fouquet. A close friend of Scudéry, Pellisson appears under several pseudonyms in Scudéry's novels.

15. A poet and historian, Jean-François Sarasin (1614-54) was especially known for his mock epics.

16. A mathematician and essayist, Antoine Gombaud, chevalier de Méré (1607–84) stressed the moral value of honnêteté [reasonableness, fairness, restraint] as an antidote to the religious and political fanaticism that had plunged France into recurrent civil wars.

17. Scudery's account of glory in her prize-winning essay closely follows the theories of the prize's founder and benefactor: Jean-Louis Guez de Balzac. Following Balzac, Scudéry's essay argues that glory is conditional on the approval and acclaim of others. This does not appear to reflect Scudéry's actual convictions. In her dialogue Of Glory [CN, pp.553–93] Scudéry argues that glory does not depend on public reputation; it is a trait of moral virtue, even the most hidden.

18. The seventeenth-century term précieuse referred to a female member of Paris salons who stressed refinement in language and comportment. In her novels' emphasis on Platonic love and polite manners, Mademoiselle de Scudéry was considered a paragon of preciosity. The term soon acquired a negative connotation. The précieuse was a salonnière whose euphemisms and overly refined politeness made her the object of satire.

19. Jacques-Bénigne Bossuet (1627–1704) was the bishop of Meaux and the preeminent preacher at the court of Louis XIV. In works such as Politics Drawn from Holy Scripture (1679), Bossuet defends a providentialist philosophy of history, closely tied to the divine right of kings. The archbishop of Cambrai, François de Salignac de la Mothe-Fénelon (1651-1715) was a prominent essayist, poet, and preacher. In works such as Telemachus (1694), Fénelon criticizes the abuses of power by monarchial authority. The longstanding political tension between Bossuet and Fénelon burst into theological controversy in the 1690s when the two prelates opposed each other during the Quietist controversy. This dispute concerned the orthodoxy of those who supported a spirituality of abandonment to God [Quietism], which certain ecclesiastics, led by Bossuet, condemned as destructive of free will and of the struggle to acquire the moral virtues.

Copyright © 2011 by
John Conley <JConley1@loyola.edu>

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