Notes to Gabriel (-Honoré) Marcel

1. Thus, in approaching his philosophy, one could grasp any number of themes and work from that initial thread to the tapestry of Marcel's thought as a whole. While the following summary orients the various threads of Marcel's thoughts around the theme of “creative fidelity,” it would also be legitimate to read his work organized around the themes of, for example, being and having, primary and secondary reflection or disponibilité.

2. Exigence is sometimes translated as ‘need,’ however, the term has a richer texture in French and, while remaining a ‘need’ of sorts, carries the force of a demand. Therefore, we will retain the French term to emphasize this additional meaning. If exigence is a ‘need,’ ontological exigence, as a need for transcendence, would be something like Levinas's metaphysical desire.

3.Il faut qu'il y ait ou il faudrait qu'il y eût de l'être…

4. Marcel concedes that it may be the case that ontological exigence is never fully satisfied, and cannot be fully satisfied. See Marcel 1973, p.50.

5. See Marcel 1951, 39. The term “transascendnce” is originally that of Marcel's longtime friend Jean Wahl. Although Marcel also expresses some reservations about the term, it seems clear that his “vertical transcendence” has more in common with transascendence than difference.

6. In contrasting Marcel's idea of being with other traditional conceptions, it is worth noting that while (1) he does speak of being in terms of on “Absolute Thou” (i.e., God), at times he also (2) is at pains to avoid a substantialist conception of being. See Marcel's “Reply to Paul Ricoeur” (Marcel 1984, pp.495-498).

7. For a fine analysis of the spirit of abstraction, see Boyd Blundell, “Creative Fidelity: Gabriel Marcel's Influence on Paul Ricoeur,” in Andrzej Wiercinski, ed., Between Suspicion and Sympathy: Paul Ricoeur's Unstable Equilibrium (Toronto: Hermeneutic Press, 2003), 89-102.

8. A fairly concise discussion of the spirit of abstraction can be found in Man Against Mass Society, 153-162.

9 It worth noting here the difference Heidegger sees between two kinds of solicitude (Fürsorge), one that liberates (“leaping ahead”) and one that dominates (“leaping in”) (Martin Heidegger, Being and Time, trans. John Macquarrie and Edward Robinson [San Francisco: Harper San Francisco, 1962], 158-159). The former liberates the other, while the latter subjugates her.

10. See, for example, Marcel 1964, p.8.

11. And therefore the fulfillment of obligations out of duty is mere “constancy” and, lacking presence, cannot rise to the level of “fidelity.”

12. It should be emphasized here that fidelity always implies otherness. It would seem improper to speak of fidelity to oneself in the sense that Marcel uses the term. Cf. Smith 1984, pp.337-449.

13. Boyd Blundell, “Creative Fidelity: Gabriel Marcel's Influence on Paul Ricoeur,” in Andrzej Wiercinski, ed., Between Suspicion and Sympathy: Paul Ricoeur's Unstable Equilibrium (Toronto: Hermeneutic Press, 2003), 89-102.

Copyright © 2010 by
Brian Treanor <btreanor@lmu.edu>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free