Notes to Margaret Lucas Cavendish

1. This is Cavendish's Philosophical Letters. For Cavendish's own reflections on the matter, see Cavendish 1664, 506–7, and preface, fifth page; Cavendish 1668a, 12–13, 21; Cavendish 1663, 442–3. For more on the interaction between Cavendish and her contemporaries, see O'Neill 1998, 22–3; and 2002, 641–652.

2. Cavendish 1664, 320-1. See also Cavendish 1668a, 197, 215, 221; Cavendish 1664, 12, 192, 238, 529; and Cavendish 1668b, 1–3.

3. Cavendish 1664, 451-2. Of course, the same argument is in Descartes' Principles of Philosophy, Part II, section 16.

4. Cavendish 1668a, 209. See also Cavendish 1664, 162–3, 186–7, and Cavendish 1668b, 47.

5. Cudworth 1678, 858. See also pp. 156, 157, 648, 857, and 858; and Hutton 1997b, 96–9.

6. See Cavendish 1664, 350-1, 382, 404; and Cavendish 1663, 403–5, 436.

7. See also Cavendish 1655, 96, 106.

8. Cavendish 1664, 185–6. See also pp. 197, 225–6.

9. Cavendish 1668b, 2. See also Cavendish 1668a, 148; Cavendish 1664, 77, 402, 421; and Cavendish 1663, 86.

10. Nicholas Jolley has argued that the doctrine of thinking matter is lurking throughout Locke's corpus, and that one of Leibniz's central concerns in New Essays on Human Understanding is to expose and then undermine it. See Jolley 1984, 18–25.

11. See Lucretius, 33, 37, 95–6; Gassendi 1641, 238–9; Spinoza 1662, 87–8; and Searle 1986, chapter 1. It is not clear if Cavendish read any works of Lucretius or if she just read paraphrases of them. There were two translations of De Rerum Natura written in the 1650s, one by Lucy Hutchinson, and she and Cavendish were acquaintances. It is possible that Cavendish had access to Hutchinson's translation. Cavendish might also have read paraphrases of Lucretius' work in Thomas Stanley's three-volume History of Philosophy (London: Humphrey Moseley and Thomas Dring, 1655, 1666, 1660). The influence of Lucretius is present throughout Poems and Fancies. See Cavendish 1653; and Broad 2002, 44–5.

12. Cavendish 1668a, 89. See also Cavendish 1664, 215.

13. Cavendish 1664, 225. See also Cavendish 1664, 320, 137, 162, 220; and Cavendish 1668b, 240.

14. Cavendish 1664, 242. See also Hutton 1997a, 426–7, Detlefsen 2007, 162.

15. A common view in the Early Modern period was that bodies behave in an orderly manner because they obey laws of nature. See for example Descartes 1644, I:37–40; and Boyle 1668a, 70.

16. Cavendish 1663, “Another Epistle to the Reader,” ii. See also Cavendish 1663, 293–4; Cavendish 1664, 108, 151, 378, 417, 514–5; and Lucretius, 170–1.

17. Cavendish 1668b, 7. See also Cavendish 1664, 531. Cavendish might have come across this view in her reading of Henry More's Antidote Against Atheism.  See James, 1999, 222–3; and More 1653, 51–2.

18. See also Leibniz 1698, 504. He writes that “it is consistent neither with the order nor with the beauty or the reason of things that there should be something vital or immanently active only in a small part of matter, when it would imply greater perfection if it were in all.”  He adds that laws of nature are not anything over and above creatures, but instead are written into them (500–502). See also Leibniz 1686, 331–5.

19. Cavendish 1668a, 15, 191–2. See also Michaelian 2009, 33–4. Note that Cavendish does not think that all bodies are knowledgeable and perceptive to the same degree. For example, she writes, “the Sun, the Stars, Earth, Fire, Water, Plants, Animals, Minerals; although they have all sense and knowledg [sic], yet they have not all sense and knowledg [sic] alike, because sense and knowledg [sic] moves not alike in every kind or sort of Creatures...” (Cavendish 1664, 153). See also Cavendish 1664, 184, 236, 287, 516–7; Cavendish 1663, 113–4, 274–5; Cavendish 1668b, 82, 163–4; and Cavendish 1668a, 218–9. See also Leibniz, Monadology, sections 21, 23–4.

20. Cavendish 1663, 194. See also Cavendish 1663, 140; and Cavendish 1664, 302.

21. See Cavendish 1664, 362, 367, 415; Cavendish 1655, 160–1, 176; Cavendish 1668b, 176–7; Cavendish 1663, 140, 196; and Cavendish 1653, 84–5. In an almost Kantian vein, Cavendish writes, “To give us Sense, and Reason too,/ Yet know not what we're made to do./ Whether to Atomes turne, or Heaven up hye,/ Or into new Formes change, and never dye./ Or else to Matter Prime to fall againe,/ From thence to take new Formes, and so remaine./ Nature gives no such knowledge to Man-kind,/ But strong Desires to torment the Mind.../ O Nature! Nature! Cruell to Man-kind,/ Gives Knowledge none, but Misery to find” (“A Dialogue Betwixt Man, and Nature,” in Cavendish 1653, 58).

22. Cavendish 1664, 362. See also pp. 272, 367.

23. Cavendish 1664, 526. See also p. 107. Note that here Cavendish is writing with an eye to Kenelm Digby. She interacted with Digby at meetings of the Cavendish Circle and read much of his work. His most consuming worry as a philosopher was that if complete mechanistic explanations could not be offered for phenomena like gravitational attraction or the powers of bodies to make us have sensations that do not resemble those bodies, then the materialist philosopher would be able to argue that in the same way that these somehow happen, bodies somehow think. See Digby, 1644, preface, iii, v. See also Cunning 2010.

24. Cavendish 1655, 161. See also Hume 1748, section 1, 87–90; and Locke 1689, “Introduction,” 43–48.

25. Cavendish 1664, 97. This view is not so unusual in the Seventeenth Century. For example, it appears to be one of the things that is motivating Descartes' (apparent) view that the cause of the movement of a body is never another body but always God. See Hatfield 1979, 113–140.

26. Ibid.  See also Detlefsen 2007, 166–7.

27. There are instances of disorder in the behavior of bodies, which Cavendish explains in terms of the freedom of (intelligent and perceptive) bodies to respond as they please to the solicitations of the bodies that surround them. See Detlefsen 2007, 180–7.

28. Cavendish 1668a, 145–6. See also White 2009, Section 3.

29. See also Michaelian 2009, 39–41. For Cavendish, the “sensitive” corporeal motions of a body track the surface features of the object that we are perceiving, and the “rational” motions produce a speculative image of the features of the object that we do not sense. When a body senses the features of a body, Cavendish will say that the body is “patterning.”  When a body is speculating or is otherwise unconstrained in the images that it produces, it is “figuring.”  See Cavendish 1664, 64, 513; and Michaelian 2009, 39–50. Note finally that in some cases Cavendish uses the term ‘pattern’ to describe the self-moving activity of a body by which it adjusts to the bodies in its environment, after it “patterns” or perceives them. See for example Cavendish 1664, 104.

30. Bodies have knowledge of their surroundings, according to Cavendish, but also self-knowledge (Cavendish 1668a, 161, 165), and so that is how a perceived body would be able to have an image of itself to be able to present to another.

31. Cavendish rejects the view that so-called secondary qualities exist only “in ourselves” (Cavendish 1668a, 147). One of her many reasons is that the central arguments against this view – the arguments from perceptual relativity – show only that it is difficult for us to know whose perceptions of an object are correct. She is also suspicious of the view that the world would be so dark and uninspiring, and she worries about how and why a mind would have perceptions of qualities like color and taste if those qualities were not actually outside of us.

32. Cavendish 1664, 201, 139, 141, 186; Cavendish 1668a, 17. See also Detlefsen 2009, 429–30; Schiebinger 1991, 8; and Detlefsen 2007, 162.

33. See also Cavendish 1664, 107, 139–142, 221, 230–1, 322, 462, 503–5.

34. Cavendish 1664 164; Cavendish 1668a, 212, 71. See also Detlefsen 2009, 430–1; and James 1999, 230.

35. Relevant also is Cavendish's experience in England when power was not in the hands of a single individual. See James 2003, x-xvii and xxiv-xxv.

36. See also Boyle 2006, 261–266. Boyle's view appears to be very extreme. She notes that Cavendish thinks that we are interested in self-preservation but argues (263–264) that on Cavendish's view what in fact motivates human behavior is our interest in our legacy and that it is our desire for fame (and the increased likelihood that our legacy will live on) that drives us to enter a commonwealth. Boyle does cite passages in which Cavendish speaks of our strong interest in fame, and also a passage in which she remarks that some people would prefer to live in the memory of others than to be alive but unkown (Cavendish 1655, 2; Boyle 2006, 264), but these are certainly consistent with the view that much of our behavior is driven by an interest in security and survival.

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David Cunning <david-cunning@uiowa.edu>

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