Notes to George Herbert Mead

1. There are those who find the notion of emergence useless as a category or marker, for it appears to be in the eye of the beholder. However, Mead's qualitative or experiential pluralism, which he shares with Dewey and James, would view this criticism as failing to address genuine novelty and the “objective reality of perspectives.” See below for a discussion the latter.

2. “The sympathetic identification with the individual in distress, however, calls out in us the incipient reactions of warding off, of defense, which the distress arouses in the sufferer, and these reactions become dominant in response of the one who assists. He places himself in the service of the other. We speak of this attitude as that of unselfishness or self-effacement of the charitable individual. But even this attitude of devotion to the interest of the other is not that of obligation, though it is likely to be so considered in an ethical doctrine which makes morality synonymous with self-sacrifice. The earliest appearance of the feel of obligation is found in the appraisal of the relief to the distressed person in terms of the donor's effort and expenditure (SW, 400)” (emphasis added). Mead, “Philanthropy from the Point of View of Ethics,” in Intelligent Philanthropy, edited by Ellsworth Faris, Ferris Laune, and Arthur J. Todd, Chicago, University of Chicago Press, 1930, 133-148. Page reference is to the reprinted edition in Selected Writings [SW]. See also, Mitchell Aboulafia, “Mead on Cosmopolitanism, Sympathy, and War,” in Pragmatism, Nation, Race: Community in the Age of Empire, edited by Eduardo Mendieta, Indiana University Press, forthcoming.

3. For criticisms on the limitations of Mead's position with regard to the “I” and reflection, see Mitchell Aboulafia, The Mediating Self: Mead, Sartre, and Self-Determination (New Haven: Yale University Press, 1986).

Copyright © 2012 by
Mitchell Aboulafia <>

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