Notes to The Normativity of Meaning and Content

1. The relations between these notions are themselves a matter of debate. We assume that not every truth about a certain matter X that is metaphysically necessary, in the sense of being true in every (accessible) possible world, is essential to X. Along with most participants in the debate, we also take it that that which is conceptually necessary is metaphysically necessary, but not necessarily vice versa. Thus, those who argue that it is a conceptual truth that meaning is normative usually think that this is sufficient to show that meaning is essentially normative. But not everyone agrees. Wedgwood (2009, 424), for instance, argues that the claim that normativity is built into our concept of meaning/content could be true even if the corresponding metaphysical claim was false. See also Gibbard (2012) who argues that while the concept of meaning is normative, the property of meaning is not normative. Gibbard therefore does not accept meaning normativism as discussed in this entry.

2. The neutral claim might also be true without either norms or meaning/content being prior to the other: If something else, X, is such that there is both meaning/content and the norms in question are in force because X is the case. In this case, however, it is arguably X that is essential to meaning/content, and not the norms.

3. Glüer & Wikforss (2009) carves out (part of) the same terrain in a slightly different, purely systematic way, treating CE and CD normativism as mutually exclusive claims implying opposite directions of metaphysical determination. The current, wider use of ‘ME/CE normativity’ allows for the combination of ME/CE and MD/CD normativism and is entirely due to the actual shape of the debate to be outlined in this article.

4. Soames (1997), for instance, distinguishes between determination by relations of necessary consequence and by relations of a priori consequence. He argues that the argument Kripke's skeptic provides against determinate meaning facts suffers from equivocation between these two readings of determination (Soames 1997, 222ff, esp. 232).

5. Such principles can be of different kinds. For instance, they can be more or less holistic. According to a holistic determination principle for linguistic meaning the meanings of all the expressions of a language are determined together and by the whole of what is in SB (cf. Pagin 1997). They can determine a single correct mapping, or effect rankings between different mappings according to some standard of “best fit” (for instance, being most “charitable” (Davidson 1973) or providing the best teleo-biological explanation (Millikan 1990, Neander 1995, Dretske 1986), thus potentially leaving an opening for indeterminacy (i.e. the possibitity of more than one equally good “best” mapping).

6. This is not completely uncontroversial. For a discussion of some related issues, see Gibbard 1994. Wedgwood (2009, 425) voices some doubts. Jackson (2000) argues that non-cognitivism cannot be combined with the claim that belief is subject to constraints of rationality, where ‘rational’ is understood as a normative term. Gibbard (2012) provides a detailed proposal for how an expressivist analysis can be applied to statements about meaning and mental content on the assumption that such statements are normative. For some skepticism about extending expressivism to meaning and content statements, see Hattiangadi forthcoming.

7. Cf. von Wright 1963, 14; Schnädelbach 1990, 83ff. In the German tradition, there is the distinction between Tun-Sollen and Sein-Sollen; see, for instance, Nicolai Hartmann's Ethik (1925). See also G.E. Moore, “The Nature of Moral Philosophy”, in his Philosophical Studies (1922).

8. Cf. Pagin 1987 for more on this.

9. However, ME normativity need not be construed prescriptively. We return to this briefly below.

10. Presumably, the notion of application can be extended to other terms in a suitable way, so as to allow the normativity thesis to apply to all meaningful expressions. Whiting (2008) argues that semantic norms do not govern the act of assertion but the more basic sentential act of producing a sentence. This has the implication that merely voicing a sentence could involve the violation of a semantic norm.

11. Peregrin (2012) defends the claim that (CM) entails normativism on the grounds that the concept of truth is to be analyzed in terms of correct assertability. This goes beyond the simple argument since it presupposes a controversial analysis of the concept of truth. However, notice, even if one accepts the analysis and agrees that the central notion of semantic correctness is that of warranted asertibility, it remains to be shown that the latter notion is to be understood in deontic terms.

12. In this context, it is also sometimes pointed out that anti-normativists do not deny that semantic categorization, like all categorization (such as sorting objects into chairs and non-chairs) can be used to generate normative consequences –– taken together with a suitable norm. For instance, it may be that we ought to speak the truth. This norm, taken together with (CM), implies that S ought to apply ‘green’only to green objects. However, the normative force does then not derive from the categorization itself, but from the categorization in conjunction with the relevant norm (c.f Glüer&Wikforss 2009, 469).

13. Here are the three main entries from Merriam-Webster: 1) true or accurate, agreeing with facts, 2) having no errors or mistakes, 3) proper or appropriate in a particular situation.

14. Moreover, to the extent that there is a disanalogy, wouldn’t it be due to the (constitutive) nature of the relation between meaning and correctness conditions? In which case one might wonder whether the source of the normativity isn’t precisely the constitutivity of the relation, rather than meaning itself –– as you would get the same type of practical consequences whenever there is a relation like that, independently of what the relata are.

15. This discussion is also inspired by passages in the Wittgensteinian discussion of a pure sense-datum language in Philosophical Investigations, paragraphs 243–271. Here, Wittgenstein argues that such a language is not possible because there would be no distinction between what seems right to the speaker and what is right.

16. An alternative reading of the notion of use in accordance with meaning is ‘transtemporal’, and turns on the idea that there has to be consistency over time. For instance, McGinn suggests that incorrect use amounts to ‘using the same expression with a different meaning from that originally intended’ (1984: 60). One might try to motivate the requirement on consistency over time by appealing to considerations having to do with the determination of meaning; if so, the resulting ME normativity derives from MD normativity. For a criticism of this transtemporal construal see Boghossian 1989b and Whiting 2013.

17. This suggests a wide scope reading of the deontic operator. It should be noted, though, that since Millar replaces ‘ought’ with ‘is committed’, on his construal of ME normativity the relevant normative consequences are not prescriptive.

18. For example, although Gibbard (2012) construes meaning statements as having a prescriptive content he denies that this has any metaphysical implications for the nature of meaning. The slogan he defends, he writes, is “the concept of meaning is normative, whereas the property of meaning is natural”(ibid. 25). For a discussion see Wikforss (forthcoming-a).

19. Hattiangadi (2007: 194–195) also suggests that the proposal of Lance & O'Leary Hawthorne leads to a regress if construed as the thesis that the prescriptive meaning sentences serve to determine meaning.

20. According to some, this is the conclusion Kripke himself draws when presenting his skeptical solution to the skeptical paradox (Wilson 2006: 161–163). Kripke suggests that we should reject the search for meaning facts and consider the conditions under which meaning statements are properly assertible (Kripke 1982: 69–79). However, as noted above, the anti-realist theory of meaning entails substantial metaphysical claims about meaning, and this theory is no less in conflict with the skeptical conclusion that there are no meaning facts than is the classical realist theory (Boghossian 1989a: 522–527, Wright 1984: 769–770).

21. One reason the prescriptive construal has played a central role derives from the assumed connection between normativism and anti-naturalism. It is the allegedly prescriptive character of meaning that is said to pose an insurmountable obstacle to naturalist accounts of meaning (see section 4 below). However, to the extent that normativism poses a challenge to naturalist accounts of meaning, it might also be that the axiological construal of ME normativism poses such a challenge.

22. Assume that meaning is ME normative, i.e. that an expression e's having meaning M entails a set of normative consequences N, and that for each Mi, there is precisely one distinctive set Ni such that, necessarily, ei has Mi iff Ni. Does this mean that MD normativism is true? Not necessarily; in this case, there is an equivalence relation between Mi and Ni, which of course is a determination relation, but for all we know so far, it may be of the merely mathematical kind. To get MD normativism, the claim that determination by norms is metaphysically ‘responsible for’, or constitutive of, meaning needs to be added: It is because of the norms that expressions have meaning, not vice versa. Mathematical determination can be two-ways but metaphysical determination is one way only.

23. Jackman argues that the Davidsonian principle of charity is a normative principle of meaning and content determination. Whether Davidson espoused normativism about meaning/content is a matter of dispute, however (see section 2.2.2 below).

24. Another question about determination by normative facts arises from the commonly held view that normative facts themselves supervene upon non-normative facts. This might suggest that ultimately there is no real metaphysical difference between what we might call normative and non-normative determination. Greenberg 2005 suggests, by giving examples, that there nevertheless is a distinction between levels of metaphysical determination that are truly “constitutive” of a phenomenon and those that are not. But even though a distinction between what is essential and what is (merely) necessary (in the ‘metaphysical’ sense of true in all (accessible) possible worlds) seems plausible at one and the same level of determination, it is less clear that there is a corresponding distinction operating between levels. The level at which we give an account of a phenomenon might depend not so much on whether there is an underlying level of determination but, among other things, on whether there is reduction from one level to the next, as well as on the kind of account we are interested in. Moreover, it would seem to be a metaphysically interesting fact distinctive of a class of phenomena that there is a level of determination in their metaphysical ancestry that involves normative facts.

25. It is not immediately clear that (MD) could be strengthened into a bi-conditional, at least if such a bi-conditional is supposed to provide an analysis of ‘e means M’; for this, we would need to ensure that R is of the right kind, for instance, that it is a semantic, not a pragmatic rule, and that its being in force determines M, and not some other, or no, meaning. It might not be possible to do this in an informative way, however; for some arguments to this effect, see Pagin (1987, 88–139).

26. Moreover, even if the relation in question is conventional, it does not follow that it is normative in the sense that interests a particular kind of meaning normativist. According to David Lewis’s influential account of convention, for instance, a convention is a regularity in the behavior of a community which is arbitrary but perpetuates itself because it serves “some sort of common purpose. Past conformity breeds future conformity because it gives one a reason to go on conforming” (Lewis 1975, 4). This requires a degree of common knowledge, but –– prima facie at least –– it does not imply, for instance, that any prescription to conform is in force in the community.

27. To illustrate: According to Davidson, meaning supervenes upon non-semantic, non-normative dispositions to hold (uninterpreted) sentences true. This is a form of non-reductive naturalism. The principle by which meaning so supervenes is the principle of charity. Prima facie, there is nothing incoherent about interpreting this, or any other principle with the same function, as in some sense normative.

28. For a thorough investigation of the concept of being in force regarding norms or rules, cf. Pagin 1987, 12ff.

29. Cf. Jarvis 2012 for a proposal regarding content determining normativity along such lines.

30. Steglich-Petersen (2013b) suggests that for belief formation to be guided by, for instance, the truth rule the existence of a causal mechanism by means of which relevant differences in output beliefs are effected is sufficient. An analogous suggestion could be made for guidance by meaning determining rules or norms. Glüer & Wikforss (forthcoming) argue that, as long as we are concerned with an intuitive conception of rule-following or rule-guidedness, the possibility of deviant causal chains makes it highly improbable that any true sufficiency claim will be forth-coming along these lines.

31. According to Ginsborg, a primitively normative attitude is an intentional attitude, a judgment even –– thus preventing her account of meaning (and content) determination from being fully reductive in the naturalistic sense (2011a, 252). But it is a judgment only minimally different from a brute, “natural” reaction, a judgment “not in the first instance to be identified with the acceptance of some proposition as true” (Ginsborg 2011b, 177). Its content need not consist in more than an awareness of primitive appropriateness in the form of ‘this is appropriate to that’ (cf. ibid., 169f; 2012, 137).

32. Primitive normativity thus is a notion not only needed in an account of meaning determination, but in any account of rule-following in general. According to Ginsborg, “it is only if we endorse the pretheoretical intuitions on which I am relying [intuitions regarding the primitive appropriateness of certain responses, but not others] that we can make sense of there being justification in terms of rules in the first place” (2012, 249). Ginsborg’s thought then seems to be that we are entitled to our intuitive judgments of primitive normativity precisely because there would be no rule-following whatsoever unless these judgements were warranted (cf. 2012, 240f; 249). On the assumption that meaningful use of expressions indeed is a case of rule-following, an assumption quite clearly implicit in Ginsborg’s writings, this would of course also hold for intuitive judgments of appropriateness regarding the use of these expressions. Moreover, Ginsborg seems to hold not only that the primitively normative attitudes required by meaning amount to warranted judgments, but to judgments corresponding to objective normative reality: “on the position I shall defend”, she writes, “ expressions have meaning only in virtue of there being ways in which they ought to be applied” (2012, 132, emph. added).

33. At times, it looks as if Ginsborg wants to locate the difference exclusively in the anti-extension: the anti-extension of the primitive notion of correctness contains a “broader class of responses” than that of the semantic notion of correctness. An example she gives is that of reacting by sneezing: If we understand her correctly, it would be primitively, but not semantically incorrect to react to the question ‘What is 68 + 57?’ by sneezing (cf. Ginsborg 2011b, 169, fn. 17, cf. also 2011a, 243).

34. Boghossian (2003: 39) withdraws his earlier claim that meaning is essentially normative, suggesting that the “the linguistic version of the normativity thesis, in contrast with its mentalistic version, has no plausibility whatever…”. But see Boghossian (2008) where he argues that there is a sense in which meaning is normative (as noted in section 2.2.1 above).

35. Again, it is not immediately clear that (C) could be strengthened into a bi-conditional, at least if such a bi-conditional is supposed to provide an analysis of M has content p. Such an analysis would have to specify the rule or norm in question without using the concept of content. It is not clear, for instance, that the rules of rational reasoning – which many think are promising candidates here – themselves can be specified without using the concept of content.

36. Alex Byrne calls this the “pleonastic sense of ‘concept’” (Byrne 2005). Note the contrast with the meaning of linguistic expressions that this notion of concept induces: On this notion of concept, the connection between a concept and ‘its meaning’ or ‘its content’ is not arbitrary, or even contingent; quite the contrary, a concept would naturally seem to be a meaning or a content; the meaning or content of the corresponding linguistic expression. There is here, thus, no route to normativism via arbitrariness; rather, the idea of norms governing the ‘use’ of concepts seems to derive from the idea of essential relations, such as inferential relations, between contents.

37. In the case of belief there is also the general question of whether beliefs are voluntary in the first place (Alston 1988, Shah & Velleman 2005, Williams 1973, McHugh 2013; 2014). If not, the idea that belief is intrinsically prescriptive stands in prima facie conflict with the principle that ‘ought’ implies ‘can’. In this respect both (NB1) and (NB2) are, prima facie, more problematic than (ME1), since the application of expressions is something that is clearly within the voluntary control of S.

38. Another proposal is that the norm of belief is made conditional on S considering whether p: “If S considers whether p, then S ought to believe p iff p is true” (Wedgwood 2002: 273). This proposal is criticized in Bykvist & Hattianagadi 2007: 281. For a response, see Wedgwood (2014).

39. For a general discussion of this idea, and its Aristotelian background, see Korsgaard 1996. See also Rödl 2003 for an application to intentional states.

40. Another option would be to regard the norms in question as merely axiological. Thus, it could be claimed that it is essential to belief, and constitutive of content, that true, or knowledgeable, or rational belief is intrinsically valuable (Karlander 2008). If this is meant to be a conceptual a priori truth, it certainly is controversial, however.

41. Since the appeal to teleological norms involves the idea that the norms constitutive of a telos determine mental content it constitutes a form of CD normativism (see section 3.2).

42. So is (NB2), of course, and the same questions concerning guidance can be raised with respect to it.

43. For criticisms of the so-called “no-guidance argument”, cf. Steglich-Petersen 2010; 2013a. For responses, see Glüer & Wikforss 2010; 2015b.

44. It has also been argued that the problem concerning guidance is solved if (NB1) is supplemented with the subjective norms of rationality: (NB1) guides, but via these further norms (Boghossian 2003: 39, Gibbard 2005: 343, Shah 2003: 471, Wedgwood 2002: 282). See section 3.2 below. For a critical discussion of the appeal to subjective norms in defense of belief normativism see Glüer & Wikforss (2014).

45. Note, also, that the argument presupposes that conceptual necessity implies metaphysical necessity. Otherwise it might be asked why the alleged conceptual links between the concepts of content and belief should entail that what is essential to belief is also essential to content.

46. For a related argument for the normativity of content see Greenberg (2007).

47. Cf. Willamson 2000, 238ff.

48. Therefore, he argues, there is nothing problematic about the prima facie weird consequence of objective epistemic normativity that every non-normative fact whatsoever analytically entails a normative fact: You objectively ought to believe that p iff p. See also Gibbard (2012, 82-84) for a discussion of the relation between the subjective ought and the objective ought.

49. There is controversy about the extent to which these integrate with one another, controversy, that is, about the question as to whether epistemic value is just one value among others determining the rationality of actions and beliefs alike. Gibbard (2005), for instance, holds that it is, while writers such as Owens (2003) and Shah &Velleman (2005) insist that the rationality of belief is solely determined by epistemic value.

50. It is instructive to compare the contemporary debate between naturalists and normativists about meaning, content, the propositional attitudes, or the intentional in general with that between psychologists and (neo-Kantian) normativists regarding the ‘laws’ of logic around the turn of the previous century. It is recorded in quite some detail in Husserl's Prolegomena (1913). Husserl here came to adopt a third position according to which these laws are neither prescriptions nor psychological laws, but what he called “ideal”. He greatly influenced Frege in this.

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Kathrin Glüer <kathrin.gluer@philosophy.su.se>
Åsa Wikforss <asa.wikforss@philosophy.su.se>

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