Notes to Medieval Mereology

1. Thirteenth- and fourteenth-century logicians take great pains to distinguish these different distributive functions of terms because they believe that this will help them to resolve a number of sophisms (sophismata). Some of these sophisms involve the terms “whole” and “part”. For example, a number of later logicians tackled such sophisms as “The whole Socrates is less than Socrates” (Totus Sortes est minor Sorte) and “The whole Socrates is a part of Socrates” (Totus Sortes est pars Sortis). For an overview of syncategorematic terms and the application of the theory of distributive terms to the resolution of various sophismata, see Kretzmann 1982. On the categorematic and syncategorematic senses of “whole” and their application to mereologically themed questions, see Zupko 2003, 158-61, and Fitzgerald, 2009.

2. One must remember that Aristotle and his medieval students lived in periods of time well before organ transplants were even conceivable. I leave it as an exercise for the reader to think through the implications of modern medical technology on the Aristotelian distinction between substantial and accidental forms. 

3. Some modern interpreters have suggested that the Neoplatonic philosopher Porphyry, and by association, Boethius think that universals are collections of individuals (Cross 2002, and Zachhuber 2000). I have argued elsewhere that this cannot be Porphyry's or Boethius' understanding of universal wholes (Arlig 2005, 75-83). Professor Cross, in private conversation, has recanted his interpretation of Porphyry, although he still suspects that some Neoplatonically influenced thinkers, especially some of the early Greek Church Fathers, did in fact think that the universal is a concrete collection of particulars. Cross may well be right.

4. Here it is especially important to appreciate that my terminology is stipulated. In actual medieval discussions, substantial parts are given any number of names, including most confusingly the label “essential parts”. The genus and differentia, which are parts of the essence of a thing, must be carefully distinguished from what I have called substantial parts. While many medieval philosophers think that one can understand the unity of a definition as something analogous to the unity of a form with its matter, a genus is not literally matter and a differentia is not literally a form. We also need to distinguish both the essential parts of a definition and the substantial parts of a concrete substance from “parts principal in essence” (see Pseudo-Joscelin De generibus §§ 6-7 (2014, 122-3)), which to many modern readers are perhaps the truly essential—i.e. necessary—parts. It is also worth noting that some medieval philosophers distinguish between “quantitative” parts and “qualitative” parts (see, e.g., Albert of Saxony Sophismata 45 and 49, discussed in Fitzgerald, 2009, 61-6). The latter include not only substantial forms but also accidental forms, since they too do not lie side-by-side with one another, but rather one imbues and perfects the other. For example, the form of a statue (which is generally considered to be an accidental form) is in the same place as all the statue's bronze and it completes the being of the statue.

5. Even though no medieval philosopher endorsed the view that a part was the same as the whole, many nevertheless entertained the question “Whether the Whole and the Part are the Same” (Utrum totum et pars sint idem). See, for example, (pseudo) Siger of Brabant Quaestiones in Physicam, q. 19 (1941, 47) and Aquinas Commentaria in libros Physicorum, book 1, lect. 3, n. 3. Interestingly, many of these thinkers (including the two just mentioned) resolve the problem by appealing to the classic Aristotelian distinction between simpliciter and secundum quid predications. That is, if z consists of x and y, x is the same as z with respect to x and y is the same as z with respect to y. The rules of inference governing predications secundum quid and predications simpliciter prevent any untoward conclusions, such as x being the same as y.  

6. Here might be another example of someone who understands the phenomenon of mereological overlap. In a twelfth-century treatise on logic associated with the school of Gilbert of Poitiers, the author claims that while every whole is “other” (aliud) than its part, no part is other than its whole “because none [of the parts] has something substantial which its whole does not have”, whereas “for any whole there is something substantial that belongs to no one of its parts” (Compendium Logicae Porretanum III.10-11 [1983, 38]). In general, however, I have not encountered very many medieval thinkers who seem to allow that parts can overlap. Consider, for instance, Aquinas, who claims that “no part contains in itself a thing divided along with it” (aliam sibi condivisam) (Summa Theologiae III, q. 90, art. 3, contra 2).

7. It has been suggested that Buridan is distinguishing between a strict, philosophical sense of identity and a loose, or vulgar, sense of identity (Pasnau 2011, 697-8). But it could be that, as Buridan sees it, all three of his senses of numerical sameness are principled and true senses of sameness. It should be recalled that in 1277 a list of condemned propositions was circulated at the University of Paris. One of these forbidden propositions was the assertion that “a man through nourishment can become someone else, both numerically and individually” (Hissette 1977, prop. 87). Buridan, like all teachers at the University, at the very least would not want to be seen as endorsing a forbidden proposition. The question is whether he is merely trying to keep up appearances, or does he believe that he has provided a satisfying answer to a tough philosophical problem. One reason to suspect that the latter is true is that it would make his account of personal identity meaningful. If the only legitimate sense of numerical sameness were the “total” sense, then we would have to believe either that we don't persist or that, contrary to experience, we don't change (perhaps, because we are not what we think we are). Neither view is attractive. If, however, being partially the same is a legitimate form of persistence, then we get to preserve both personal identity and the datum that we are mutable. Some modern readers might be disappointed that Buridan did not conclude that there really is only one sense of numerical sameness and that sense is the strict, total sense. (After all, this seems to be the sense that has the best chance of conforming to Leibniz's Laws for identity.) But perhaps the lesson to take away should instead be this: Buridan has shown us that there are legitimate senses of being numerically the same which nevertheless allow that some things will change their parts (and even the particular instances of their forms).

Copyright © 2015 by
Andrew Arlig <>

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