Notes to Morality and Evolutionary Biology

1. “Moral Thinking: Biology Invades a Field Philosophers Thought Was Safely Theirs,” The Economist, February 21, 2008. [Available online]

2. It is important not to be misled by this terminology. Morality in the empirical sense obviously involves beliefs and social codes about what ought to be done, and so in that sense morality in the empirical sense might also be said to be ‘normative’: it involves beliefs and codes with normative content. But insofar as we investigate these beliefs or codes simply as empirical phenomena to be explained causally, they are just like any other empirical phenomena; we do not, for example, take on any normative commitments ourselves in investigating the causal genesis of people's various normative beliefs or social codes, any more than we do in investigating the causal genesis of their cosmological beliefs. By contrast, if we speak of what is required by morality, using ‘morality’ in the normative sense, we are asking a normative question ourselves.

3. It is even possible that our non-moral cognitive capacities are themselves largely evolutionary by-products of other evolved structures. See Gould (1997a) and Fodor (2000, chap. 5). Gould (1997b) cites religion as an illustration of how by-products of adaptations (or “spandrels”) might in principle give rise to universal human social phenomena. Our knowledge of our own mortality, he suggests, is a psychological spandrel—an “ineluctable consequence of consciousness evolved for other reasons.” If Freud is correct in viewing religion as stemming largely from a fear of death, then the universal phenomenon of religion in human cultures would trace back ultimately to a spandrel rather than being susceptible to an adaptationist explanation. Similarly, despite their universality, human moral capacities and tendencies might in principle trace back to spandrels of consciousness, though again this isn't the most common view.

4. This results from the fact that while females are genetically normal, males develop from unfertilized eggs, fatherless and haploid, containing only one set of chromosomes bequeathed by the mother. Consider, then, two sisters: each receives half of her mother's genes, and so they have a 50% chance of sharing any given gene passed down from their mother; but the situation is different with respect to genes passed down from their father: since he is haploid, all his sperm are identical, which means that the sisters have 100% chance of sharing any gene that came from their father. On the whole, then, they have a 75% chance of sharing a given gene, rather than the usual 50% chance, which is their chance of sharing a given gene with their own offspring (Dawkins 1989, 174-75). The account in the text is oversimplified, since typically not all sisters in a hive are full sisters: queens collect and use sperm from more than one male, making some sisters only half-sisters. Also, it is unclear exactly how much of a role haplodiploidy actually plays in the evolution of such cooperative structures, since not all insects that have it display such sociality and some mammals without it, such as naked mole rats, do (Holldobler and Wilson 2008). Still, the case serves as an illustration of a plausible evolutionary explanation for such behavior.

5. E.O. Wilson (1998, 68), for example, advances the deflationary hypothesis that moral and theological reflection are pursuits “underwritten by genetic algorithms” (or, in the lingo of evolutionary psychologists, they are pursuits employing evolved, domain-specific psychological modules). At the same time, however, he assumes that his own pursuit of biological science and his quasi-philosophical reflection on biology, morality and religion are not: they are relevantly autonomous, and so are not themselves to be explained away in terms of evolutionary instincts and rationalizations.

6. For evidence that feelings of disgust can directly influence moral judgment, see Wheatley and Haidt (2005).

7. Another way to put the point is that there is no obvious boundary to be drawn between the type of reflection and reasoning people have engaged in for millennia in their more sophisticated moral thinking and the kind of reflection and reasoning people like Wilson (1998) and others are engaging in when they argue for deflationary views of moral thought. So if we are to respect Wilson's biological and philosophical arguments as autonomous and potentially illuminating, then we have little reason to downgrade our moral arguments to the status of hand-wringing in an evolutionary straightjacket.

8. See also Rosati (1995) and (2003) on contemporary uses of an “open question argument” against certain forms of ethical naturalism, including appeals to evolutionary history to justify behavior.

9. It remains possible to argue, as Rachels does, that the potentially relevant differences, e.g., in rationality or in the related capacity for moral agency, are exaggerated. While this is a substantive debate of great importance to normative ethics, however, the role of evolutionary theory here is even more indirect: what seems to matter directly are the actual properties of human beings and of other animals; how they came to have those properties is not in itself plausibly relevant to their moral status, but is at most relevant insofar as it may indirectly shed some light on the nature of those properties.

10. In fact, even many anti-realists will reject this argument against realism. An expressivist, for example, may hold that we arrive at our moral judgments, which express our attitudes or commitments to certain norms, largely through autonomous moral reflection, i.e., with significant independence from specific evolutionary influences. If so, then he (no less than the realist) will reject the initial premise of the argument, that “our system of evaluative judgments is thoroughly saturated with evolutionary influence.” As an expressivist, he will reject realism, but not for the reasons Street gives.

11. Even if the claim of pervasive evolutionary influence on the contents of moral beliefs were granted, a naturalistic realist might independently challenge the claim that such beliefs would be unreliable. David Copp (2008), for example, has argued that on the conception of moral truths implied by his society-centered moral naturalism, it is plausible to suppose that a moral psychology shaped by natural selection would yield moral beliefs that track moral truths reasonably well. On such a view, moral truths are grounded in moral standards having to do with codes that would enable societies to meet their basic needs (continued existence, stable cooperation among members, internal harmony and peaceful relations with other societies). Given the account of the evolution of human moral psychology sketched in section 2.3, involving the evolution of a capacity for normative guidance in connection with promoting social stability and cooperation, and further contributions of cultural evolution toward the development of moral codes fostering those same goals, many of our moral beliefs would naturally be shaped by such codes and so would have to do with conditions for social stability and cooperation. Since on the proposed naturalistic view this is just what moral truths are about, there would thus be a tendency for our moral beliefs to have been shaped in ways that do tend to track moral truths, especially combined with continued cultural developments for correcting beliefs or attitudes that fail to contribute to these social goals. (On the other side, see Joyce 2006, 190-209, for worries about such attempts to defend moral realism along naturalist lines.)

Copyright © 2008 by
William FitzPatrick <>

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