The Definition of Morality

First published Wed Apr 17, 2002; substantive revision Mon Mar 14, 2011

The term “morality” can be used either

  1. descriptively to refer to some codes of conduct put forward by a society or,
    1. some other group, such as a religion, or
    2. accepted by an individual for her own behavior or
  2. normatively to refer to a code of conduct that, given specified conditions, would be put forward by all rational persons.

What “morality” is taken to refer to plays a crucial, although often unacknowledged, role in formulating ethical theories. To take “morality” to refer to an actually existing code of conduct put forward by a society results in a denial that there is a universal morality, one that applies to all human beings. This descriptive use of “morality”is the one used by anthropologists when they report on the morality of the societies that they study. Recently, some comparative and evolutionary psychologists (Haidt, Hauser, De Waal) have taken morality, or a close anticipation of it, to be present among groups of non-human animals, primarily other primates but not limited to them. “Morality” has also been taken to refer to any code of conduct that a person or group takes as most important.

Among those who use “morality” normatively, all hold that “morality” refers to a code of conduct that applies to all who can understand it and can govern their behavior by it. In the normative sense, morality should never be overridden, that is, no one should ever violate a moral prohibition or requirement for non-moral considerations. All of those who use “morality” normatively also hold that, under plausible specified conditions, all rational persons would endorse that code. Moral theories differ in their accounts of the essential characteristics of rational persons and in their specifications of the conditions under which all rational persons would endorse a code of conduct as a moral code. These differences result in different kinds of moral theories. Related to these differences, moral theories differ with regard to those to whom morality applies, that is, those whose behavior is subject to moral judgment. Some hold that morality applies only to those rational beings that have those features of human beings that make it rational for all of them to endorse morality, viz., fallibility and vulnerability. Other moral theories claim to put forward an account of morality that provides a guide to all rational beings, even if these beings do not have these human characteristics, e.g., God.

Dictionary definitions of referring terms are usually just descriptions of the important features of the referents of those terms. Insofar as the referents of a term share the features that account for why that term refers to those referents, the term is not regarded as ambiguous. Referring terms are ambiguous when the referents of the term differ from each other in sufficiently important ways. The original descriptive definition of “morality” refers to the most important code of conduct put forward by a society and accepted by the members of that society. When the examination of large diverse societies raised problems for this original descriptive definition, different descriptive definitions were offered in which “morality” refers to the most important code of conduct put forward and accepted by any group, or even by an individual. Apart from containing some prohibitions on harming some others, different moralities can differ from each other quite extensively.

“Morality”when used in a descriptive sense has an essential feature that “morality” in the normative sense does not have, namely, that it refers to codes of conduct that are actually put forward and accepted by some society, group, or individual. If one is not a member of that society or group, and is not that individual, accepting a descriptive definition of “morality” has no implications for how one should behave. If one accepts a moral theory's account of rational persons and the specifications of the conditions under which all rational persons would endorse a code of conduct as a moral code, then one accepts that moral theory's normative definition of “morality. ” Accepting a normative definition of “morality” commits a person to regarding some behavior as immoral, perhaps even behavior that one is tempted to perform. Because accepting a normative definition of “morality” involves this commitment it is not surprising that philosophers seriously disagree about what normative definition to accept.

1. Descriptive Definitions of “morality”

“Morality” is an unusual word. It is not used very much, at least not without some qualification. People do sometimes talk about Christian morality, Nazi morality, or about the morality of the Greeks, but they seldom talk simply about morality all by itself. Consistent with this way of talking, many anthropologists used to claim that morality, like law, applies only within a society. They claimed that “morality” refers to that code of conduct that is put forward by a society. However, even in small homogeneous societies that have no written language, distinctions are sometimes made among morality, etiquette, law, and religion. So, even for these anthropologists “morality” does not often refer to every code of conduct put forward by a society.

Etiquette is sometimes included as a part of morality, but it applies to norms that are considered less serious than the kinds of norms for behavior that are part of morality in the basic sense. Hobbes expresses the standard view when he discusses manners. “By manners I mean not here decency of behavior, as how one man should salute another, or how a man should wash his mouth or pick his teeth before company, and such other points of small morals, but those qualities of mankind that concern their living together in peace and unity.” (Leviathan, Chapter XI, paragraph 1)

Law or a legal system is distinguished from morality or a moral system by having explicit written rules, penalties, and officials who interpret the laws and apply the penalties. Although there is often considerable overlap in the conduct governed by morality and that governed by law, laws are often evaluated on moral grounds. Moral criticism is often used to support a change in the law. Some have even maintained that the interpretation of law must make use of morality (Dworkin).

Religion differs from morality or a moral system in that it includes stories about events in the past, usually about supernatural beings, that are used to explain or justify the behavior that it prohibits or requires. Sometimes there is no distinction made between a moral code and a code of conduct put forward by a religion, and there is often a considerable overlap in the conduct prohibited or required by religion and that prohibited or required by morality. But religions may prohibit or require more than is prohibited or required by guides to behavior that are explicitly labeled as moral guides, and may allow some behavior that is prohibited by morality. Sometimes morality is regarded as the code of conduct that is put forward by religion, but even when this is not the case, morality is thought by many to need some religious explanation and justification. However, just as with law, some religious practices and precepts are criticized on moral grounds, e.g., discrimination on the basis of race, gender, or sexual orientation. Morality is only a guide to conduct, whereas religion is always more than this.

When “morality” is used simply to refer to a code of conduct put forward by any actual group, including a society, whether it is distinguished from etiquette, law, and religion, then it is being used in a descriptive sense. It is also being used in the descriptive sense when it refers to important attitudes of individuals. Just as one can refer to the morality of the Greeks, so one can refer to the morality of a particular person. This descriptive use of “morality” is now becoming more prominent because of the work of psychologists (Haidt) who have been influenced by the views of David Hume, who tried to present a naturalistic account of moral judgments. In the 20th century, R.M. Hare, in his earlier books (The Language of Morals, Freedom and Reason) regarded moral judgments as those judgments that override all nonmoral judgments and that the person would universalize. This account of moral judgments naturally leads to a view of morality as being concerned with behavior that a person regards as most important and as a guide to conduct that he wants everyone to adopt. All guides to behavior that are normally regarded as moralities involve avoiding and preventing harm to others, but all of them involve other matters as well. Hare's view of morality as that which is most important allows that these other features of morality may be more important than avoiding and preventing harm to others. This view of morality as concerning that which is most important allows those features related to religious practices and precepts, or those features related to customs and traditions, e.g., purity and sanctity, to be more important than avoiding and preventing harm.

When “morality” is used in these descriptive senses, moralities can differ from each other quite extensively in their content and in the foundation that members of the society claim their morality to have. A society might have a moral code that regards practices as necessary for purity or sanctity as more important than practices related to whether other persons are harmed. A society may take as morally most important that certain rituals are performed or that certain sexual practices, e.g., homosexuality, are prohibited, than that harms, e.g., pain and disability, are avoided or prevented. Some societies may claim that their morality, which is more concerned with purity and sanctity, is based on the commands of God. This descriptive sense of “morality,” where morality is based on religion, results in some significant conflicts with all normative accounts of morality. In the normative sense of “morality” all rational persons endorse morality independent of their religious beliefs, and as rational persons they are primarily concerned with avoiding and preventing harm. Many religions condemn homosexual behavior as immoral, but those who hold that morality is primarily concerned with avoiding and preventing harm condemn religious discrimination against homosexuals as immoral.

A society might have a morality that takes accepting the traditions and customs of the society, including accepting authority and emphasizing loyalty to the group, as more important than avoiding and preventing harm. In addition to conflicts concerning homosexuality, this account of morality might not allow any behavior that shows loyalty to the preferred group to count as immoral behavior. This account may claim that if one acts out of loyalty to the preferred group, it is morally acceptable to cause significant harm to innocent people not in that group. Acting altruistically, at least with regard to those in the group, is almost equated with acting morally, regardless of its effects on those outside of the group. This kind of account, which makes loyalty almost equivalent to morality, seems to allow some comparative and evolutionary psychologists to regard non-human animals as acting in ways very similar to ways of acting that are regarded as moral. (De Waal).

It is possible for a society to regard morality as being concerned primarily with minimizing the harms, e.g., pain and disability, that all human beings can suffer. Such a society might claim that their morality, in which minimizing the harms that all human beings can suffer is the primary concern, is based on some universal features of human nature or of all rational beings. Although all societies include more than this in their moralities, this feature of morality, unlike purity and sanctity, or accepting authority and emphasizing loyalty, is included in everything that is regarded as a morality in all societies. Because minimizing harm can conflict with accepting authority and emphasizing loyalty, there can be fundamental disagreements within a society about what is the morally right way to behave. A society whose morality contains all three of these features may be criticized by philosophers that accept a normative account of morality if in any situation it allows purity or sanctity to override avoiding or preventing harm. Those who accept a normative account of morality, e.g., Bentham and Mill, which takes the avoiding and preventing harm element of morality to be most important, criticize all actual moralities that give precedence to purity and sanctity when they are in conflict with avoiding and preventing harm.

Some psychologists (Haidt) take morality to include all three of these features and hold that different members of a society can and do take different features of morality as most important. Most societies have moralities that contain all three of the above features; most societies also claim that morality has all three of the above foundations, religion, tradition, and rational human nature. But, in the original descriptive sense of “morality,” beyond some concern with avoiding and preventing harm to some others, there may be no common content, nor may there be any common justification that those who accept the morality claim for it. The only other features that all of the original descriptive moralities have in common is that they are put forward by a group, usually a society and they provide a guide for the behavior of the people in that group or society. In this descriptive sense of “morality,” morality might allow slavery or might allow some people with one skin color to behave in ways that those with a different skin color are not allowed to behave. In this descriptive sense of “morality,” morality may not even incorporate impartiality with regard to all moral agents, those people whose behavior is legitimately subject to moral judgments, nor may it be universalizable in any significant way.

Although most philosophers do not use “morality” in any of these descriptive senses, some philosophers do. Ethical relativists deny that there is any universal normative morality and claim that the actual moralities of societies are the only moralities there are. (Westermarck) Ethical relativists hold that only when the term “morality.” is used in this descriptive sense is there something that “morality” actually refers to, namely, a code of conduct put forward by a society. They claim that it is a mistake to take “morality.” to refer to a universal code of conduct that, under some plausible conditions, would be endorsed by all rational persons. Although ethical relativists admit that many speakers of English use “morality” to refer to such a universal code of conduct, they claim such persons are mistaken in thinking that there is anything that is the referent of the word “morality” taken in that sense. The harm caused by Christian missionaries who used morality as a basis for trying to change the sexual practices of the societies to which they came may have been one of the reasons why many anthropologists endorsed ethical relativism. It is interesting that one basis for criticizing the behavior of Christian missionaries is that it caused harm to the people in those societies, which is a basis that would be endorsed by those that use “morality”in the normative sense.

When “morality” refers to the codes of conduct of different societies, morality is a code of conduct that is put forward by a society and that most members of that society use as their guide. In this descriptive sense, although avoiding and preventing harm is common to all, “morality” can refer to codes of conduct of different societies with widely differing content, and still be used unambiguously. This is the same way that “law” is used unambiguously even though different societies have laws with widely differing content. However, there are now other descriptive senses of “morality.” In the sense most closely related to the original descriptive sense, “morality” refers to a guide to behavior put forward by some group other than a society, for example, a religious group. When the guide to conduct put forward by a religious group conflicts with the guide to conduct put forward by a society, it is not clear whether to say that there are conflicting moralities, conflicting elements within morality, or that the code of the religious group conflicts with morality. Members of the society that are also members of a religious group may regard both guides as elements of morality and differ with respect to which of the conflicting elements of the moral guide they consider most important. There are likely to be significant moral disputes between those who consider different elements as more important.

In small homogeneous societies people do not belong to groups that put forward guides to behavior that conflict with the guide put forward by their society. A society is homogeneous if there is only one guide to behavior that is accepted by all members of the society and that is the code of conduct that is put forward by the society. For such societies there is no ambiguity about which guide “morality” refers to. However, in those large societies where people often belong to groups that put forward guides to behavior that conflict with the guide put forward by their society, members of the society do not always accept the guide put forward by their society. If they accept the conflicting guide of some other group to which they belong, often a religious group, rather than the guide put forward by their society, in cases of conflict they will regard those who follow the guide put forward by their society as acting immorally.

The original descriptive sense of “morality,” parallel to the descriptive senses of “etiquette” and “law,” has two formal features: that morality is a code of conduct that is put forward by a society and that members of that society accept it as a guide for their behavior. This reveals an ambiguity that was not recognized because of the concentration on small homogeneous societies. Does “morality” refer only to those guides to conduct put forward by a society, or does it refer to guides to conduct put forward by other groups as well? If the code of conduct a society puts forward is not accepted as a guide to behavior by the members of that society, which of these two features should be taken as essential? The recognition that people in a society do not always accept the code of conduct their society puts forward presents problems for the original descriptive sense of “morality.” The code of conduct a society puts forward and the code of conduct that members of that society use as a guide to behavior may differ.

The definition of “morality” as referring to the code of conduct accepted by the members of a society causes some problems because in many large societies, not all members of the society accept the same code of conduct. For the same reason adopting a somewhat more general definition of “morality” as the code of conduct accepted by the members of a group also causes problems because it is not only possible, but also it is often the case, that not all members of any group accept the same code. A natural response to these problems is to switch attention from groups to individuals. If what is important is what code of conduct people accept, and members of a group do not always accept the same code of conduct, then why be concerned with groups at all?

This consideration may support the descriptive sense of “morality” referred to earlier according to which morality is that guide to behavior that is regarded by an individual as overriding and that he wants to be universally adopted. Understood in this way “morality” refers to a guide to behavior accepted by an individual rather than that put forward by a society or any other group. But “morality” does not refer to just any guide to behavior accepted by an individual; it is that guide to behavior that the individual accepts as his overriding guide, and wants everyone in his group to accept as their overriding guide as well. This sense of “morality” is a descriptive sense, because a person can refer to some other individual's morality without endorsing it. In this sense, morality has less limitation on content than the original descriptive sense. Whatever guide to behavior an individual regards as overriding and wants to be accepted by everyone in his group is that individual's morality; but if he is rational it will include prohibitions on causing harm.

When people explicitly talk about the morality of a group other than their own or of a person other than themselves, it is usually clear that they are using “morality” in a descriptive sense. However, when a person simply claims that morality prohibits or requires a given action, then the term “morality” is genuinely ambiguous. It is not clear whether it refers to (1) a guide to behavior that is put forward by a society, either one's own or some other society; (2) a guide that is put forward by a group, either one to which the person belongs or another; or (3) a guide that a person, perhaps himself, regards as overriding and wants adopted by everyone in his group, or (4) is a universal guide that all rational persons would put forward for governing the behavior of all moral agents. When a person uses “morality” to refer to a guide to conduct put forward by a group, unless it is his own group, it is usually only being used in its descriptive sense. No one referring to morality in the descriptive sense of “morality” need be endorsing it. When “morality” refers to a guide to conduct accepted by an individual, unless that individual is himself, it is usually being used in its descriptive sense. However, if the individual is referring to his own morality, he is usually using it normatively, that is, he is claiming that all rational persons would put it forward. Only (4) is always used normatively but a person might hold that the morality referred to in (1), (2), or (3) is also the morality referred to in (4).

Following Aristotle, “ethics” is sometimes taken as referring to a more general guide to behavior that an individual adopts as his own guide to life, as long as it is a guide that one views as a proper guide for others. When a general guide to behavior endorses self-interest as primary this is usually because acting in one's self interest is taken as fostering the interests of all. However, Sidgwick, (Methods of Ethics) regarded moral rules as any rational rules of conduct, and because he held that it is rational to take one's self-interest as primary, even if others are seriously harmed, he held that “ethical egoism” was an ethical theory. He may have been the primary source of the current philosophical practice that includes ethical egoism, acting in one's own self-interest even when this requires harming innocent people, as an ethical theory. Because all moralities in the descriptive sense include a prohibition on harming others, ethical egoism is not a morality in the descriptive sense. Because all moralities in the normative sense not only include prohibitions on harming others but also are such that all rational persons would endorse that morality, ethical egoism is not a morality in the normative sense. To regard a guide to conduct that takes one's own self-interest as sanctioning harming innocent others as a moral guide, is possible only if one equates moral rules with rational rules of conduct as Sidgwick does.

In descriptive sense of “morality,” morality cannot be a guide to behavior that a person does not want others, even those in his own society, to adopt. However, there is a sense of “morality” such that it does refer to a code of conduct adopted by an individual for his own use, but which he does not require to be adopted by anyone else. This can occur when an individual adopts for himself a very demanding guide that he thinks may be too difficult for most to follow. However, this guide is correctly referred to as a morality only when the individual would be willing for others to adopt that code of conduct, but does not require that they do so. He may judge people who do not adopt his code of conduct as not being as morally good as he is, but does not judge them to be immoral if they do not adopt it.

2. Normative Definitions of “morality”

When “morality” is used in its universal normative sense, it need not have either of the two formal features that are essential to moralities referred to by the original descriptive sense: that it be a code of conduct that is put forward by a society and that it be accepted as a guide to behavior by the members of that society. Indeed, it is possible that “morality” in the normative sense has never been put forward by any particular society, by any group at all, or even by any individual that holds that moral rules should never be violated for non-moral reasons. “Morality” is thus an ambiguous word; the two essential formal features cited above, which are present in everything that is referred to by the original descriptive sense may not be present when “morality” is used in its normative sense. The only feature that the descriptive and normative senses of “morality” have in common is that they refer to guides to behavior that involve, at least in part, avoiding and preventing harm to some others.

Those who claim that there is a universal code of conduct that all rational persons, under plausible specified conditions, would put forward for governing the behavior of all moral agents need not hold that every society has a code of conduct that has features sufficient to even be classified as a morality. They can admit that the guides to behavior of some societies lack so many of the essential features of “morality” in the normative sense that it is incorrect to say that these societies even have a morality in a descriptive sense. They can also admit that many, perhaps all, societies have defective moralities, i.e., that although their guides to behavior have enough of the features of normative morality to be classified as descriptive moralities, they would not be endorsed in their entirety by all rational persons.

Those who hold that that there is a universal code of conduct that all rational persons, under plausible specified conditions, would put forward for governing the behavior of all moral agents do not claim that any actual society has or has ever had such a guide to conduct. However, “Natural law” theories of morality claim that any rational person in any society, even one that has a defective morality, can know the general kinds of actions that morality prohibits, requires, discourages, encourages, and allows. In the theological version of natural law theories, such as that put forwards by Aquinas, this is because God implanted this knowledge in the reason of all persons. In the secular version of natural law theories, such as that put forward by Hobbes, natural reason is sufficient to allow all rational persons to know what morality prohibits, requires, etc. Natural law theorists also claim that morality applies to all of rational persons, not only those now living, but also those who lived in the past. These are not empirical claims about morality; they are claims about what is essential to morality, or about what is meant by “morality” when it is used normatively.

Other moral theories do not hold quite so strong a view about the universality of knowledge of morality, but many hold that morality is known to all who can be legitimately judged by it. Baier, Rawls and contractarians deny that there can be an esoteric morality, one that judges people even though they cannot know what morality prohibits, requires, etc. For all of the above, morality is a public system, that is, it is a system that is known to all those to whom it applies and it is not irrational for any of those to whom it applies to follow it. Moral judgments of blame thus differ from legal or religious judgments of blame in that they are not made about persons who are legitimately ignorant of what they are required to do. Act consequentialism seem to hold that everyone should know that they are morally required to act so as to bring about the best consequences, but even they do not think judgments of moral blame are appropriate if a person is legitimately ignorant of what action will bring about the best consequences (Singer). Parallel views seem to be held by rule consequentialists (Hooker).

On all accounts of morality, it is a code of conduct. However, on ethical or group relativist accounts or on individualistic accounts, apart from avoiding and preventing harm, morality has no special content or features that distinguishes it from nonmoral codes of conduct, such as law or religion. Just as a legal code of conduct can have almost any content, as long as it is capable of guiding behavior, and a religious code of conduct has no limits on content, all of the relativist and individualist accounts of morality, have almost no limit on the content of a moral code. However, for those such as Hobbes, (Leviathan and De Cive) who hold that morality is a code of conduct that all rational persons would put forward for governing the behavior of all moral agents, it has a fairly definite content. Kant, in accordance with the German word “moral” that is used to translate the English word “morality,” regards morality as prohibiting harming oneself as well as prohibiting harming others. Hobbes, Bentham, Mill, and most other non-religiously influenced philosophers in the Anglo-American tradition limit morality to behavior that, directly or indirectly, affects others.

Among those philosophers who use “morality” to refer to a universal guide that all rational persons who are fallible and vulnerable would put forward for governing the behavior of all moral agents, the differences in content are less significant than their similarities. For all of these philosophers, such as Kurt Baier, Philippa Foot, and Geoffrey Warnock, morality prohibits actions such as killing, causing pain, deceiving, and breaking promises. For some, morality also requires charitable actions, but failure to act charitably on every possible occasion does not require justification in the same way that any act of killing, causing pain, deceiving, and breaking promises requires justification. Both Kant and Mill distinguish between duties of perfect obligation and duties of imperfect obligation and regard not harming as the former kind of duty and helping as the latter kind of duty. For Gert, morality encourages charitable action, but does not require it; it is always morally good to be charitable, but it is not immoral not to be charitable.

“Morality” in the normative sense is sometimes taken to prohibit unnatural sexual activity. However, such a prohibition need not be included in an account of morality as a universal guide that all fallible and vulnerable rational persons would put forward for governing the behavior of all moral agents because it is not irrational to favor unnatural sexual activity. The concept of rationality that supports this normative sense of “morality” is that it is irrational to harm oneself unless someone will avoid harm or gain a compensating benefit. All accounts of morality based on this concept of rationality agree with Hobbes that morality is concerned with promoting people living together in peace and harmony, which includes obeying the rules prohibiting causing harm to others. Although the prohibitions against those actions that cause harm or significantly increase the risk of harm are not absolute, in order to avoid acting immorally, justification is always needed when violating these prohibitions. This distinguishes violations of moral rules from all other kinds of actions. Kant seems to hold that it is never justified to violate some of these prohibitions, e.g., the prohibition against lying, but Kant's concept of rationality is significantly different from the concept of rationality described above. Those who hold that the principle of utility provides the foundation of the moral rules, such as Mill, hold that it is justified to violate these rules only when the overall direct and indirect consequences would be better.

The Natural Law tradition holds that all rational persons know what kinds of actions morality prohibits, requires, discourages, encourages, and allows. They also hold that reason endorses acting morally. Even religious thinkers in this tradition, such as Aquinas, hold that morality is known to all those whose behavior is subject to moral judgment, even if they do not know of the revelations of Christianity. Aquinas holds that knowing what morality prohibits and requires does not involve knowing why morality prohibits and requires what it does. Similarly, Hobbes, who is in the secular natural law tradition, says, “the writers of moral philosophy, though they acknowledge the same virtues and vices,” complains that they do not see, “wherein consisted their goodness, nor that they come to be praised as the means of peaceable, sociable, comfortable living, place them in the mediocrity of the passions.” (Leviathan, Chapter 15, paragraph 40) The differences among those natural law philosophers who hold that there is a universal morality are primarily about the foundation of morality, not about its content. Although natural law theorists may accept a somewhat broader concept of rationality than that described above, all accept that it is irrational to harm oneself only when there are no compensating benefits for anyone. This enables all of them to hold that it is never irrational to act morally, even though there is some disagreement about whether it is always irrational to act immorally. Kant who hold this latter position is not in the Natural Law tradition.

Neither Kant nor Mill regarded themselves as inventing or creating a new morality. Rather both of them, like Hobbes, regarded themselves as providing a justification for the morality that is commonly accepted. Mill explicitly says:

The intuitive, no less than what may be termed the inductive school of ethics, insists on the necessity of general laws. They both accept that the morality of an individual action is not a question of direct perception, but of the application of a law to an individual case. They recognize also, to a great extent, the same moral laws; but differ as to their evidence, and the source from which they derive their authority. (Utilitarianism, Chapter 1, paragraph 3)

According to Mill, Utilitarianism provides the foundation for morality. It explains and justifies the moral rules that are accepted by all. Kant also regards himself as performing a similar task, explaining and justifying a universal moral consciousness.

Some contemporary act consequentialists (Singer) claim that morality requires doing that act that would result in the best overall consequences, even though, given that the consequences of all acts continue forever, no human being can possibly know what act would result in the best overall consequences over time. For these consequentialists, as well as for Kant, morality applies to omniscient beings as well as to fallible, vulnerable human beings. Some rule consequentialists (Hooker) claim that morality requires following that rule that would result in the best overall consequences if everyone followed or accepted it, and so, at least implicitly, hold that morality applies only to fallible and vulnerable beings. Different consequentialists, both act and rule consequentialists, differ in their views about what consequences count as best, so that consequentialism does not provide a single guide to conduct for all moral agents. This is a significant flaw to those who claim that being subject to moral judgment is incompatioble with unavoidable ignorance of what general kinds of actions morality prohibits, requires, discourages, encourages, and allows.

Some act consequentialists claim that morality does not have as an essential feature that being subject to moral judgment requires knowing all of the general kinds of actions morality prohibits, etc. They claim that the right action is that which leads to the best consequences, regardless of whether anyone can know which action that is. This view has significant similarities to a view about vagueness that holds that there is a definite number of hairs, less than which makes a man bald, even no one can ever know what that number is. It may be true that we sometimes use the phrase “ right action” to refer to an action that has the best consequences at a time, even if no one could have known that the action would have those consequences. However, in the ordinary use of the phrase “morally right action” it never refers to an action that has consequences that no human being at the time of acting could have possibly known.

Most consequentialists hold that there is a correct answer to the question about what counts as the best consequences. However, they may not realize the importance of the fact that until that correct answer is universally acknowledged, many moral agents do not know the kinds of actions morality prohibits, requires, discourages, encourages, and allows. Further, on some act consequentialist views no human being can ever know what action would have the best consequences. On these views, consequentialism provides a guide to conduct only in a theoretical sense, but it is not meant as a practical guide to conduct. Consequentialists that acknowledge that human beings often make mistakes and have biases that distort their judgments do not favor all persons doing that action that they consider to have the best consequences.

My definition of what I take to be the universal normative sense of “morality,” requires a normative sense of “rationality,” such that no moral agent would ever advise anyone for whom he is concerned, including himself, to act irrationally. The concept of rationality described earlier satisfies this condition because no moral agent would ever advise anyone for whom he cares, including himself, to act in any way that harms himself with no compensating benefit to anyone. A moral system that all rational persons, in this sense of rational, would put forward to be used by all moral agents in guiding their conduct is what I call a public system. I use the phrase, “public system” to refer to a guide to conduct such that (1) all persons to whom it applies, all those whose behavior is to be guided and judged by that system, know what behavior the system prohibits, requires, discourages, encourages, and allows; and (2) it is not irrational for any of these persons to accept being guided and judged by that system. What this means is that insofar as a person is legitimately ignorant of what he is morally prohibited or required to do, he is not subject to moral judgment. This is one way in which morality in the normative sense differs from law. Law is not a public system for sometimes “ignorance of the law provides no excuse.” Even if a person is legitimately ignorant of what he is legally prohibited or required to do, he may still be subject to legal judgment.

The ideal situation for a legal system is also that it is a public system, but in any large society that is not the case, and sometimes people are held legally responsible for following rules about which they are legitimately ignorant, and even when it is irrational for them to follow those rules. Games are closer to being public systems and most adults playing a game know its rules, or they know that there are judges whose interpretation determines what behavior the game prohibits, requires, etc. Although a game is often a public system, it applies only to those playing the game. If a person does not care enough about the game to abide by the rules, she can usually quit. Morality is the one public system that no rational person can quit. This is the point that Kant, without completely realizing it, captured by saying that morality is categorical. Morality applies to people simply by virtue of their being rational persons who know what morality prohibits, requires, etc. and can guide their behavior accordingly.

The normative sense of “morality” refers to a universal guide to behavior that, in plausible specified conditions, all rational persons would put forward for governing the behavior of all moral agents. Thus it is important to know what is meant by “rational person.” In this context, “ rational person ” refers to a person insofar as he is acting rationally in the sense described previously. Such a person must have sufficient knowledge and intelligence to understand what kinds of actions morality prohibits, requires, discourages, encourages, and allows, and also must have sufficient volitional ability to use morality as a guide for their behavior. Such rational persons seek to avoid any harm to themselves unless they believe that their action will result in someone, themselves or others, avoiding a comparable harm or gaining a compensating good. People lacking these characteristics are not subject to moral judgment. If they lack them only temporarily, and are not responsible for the lack, they might be excused from moral judgments in those cases. All such rational persons are moral agents.

The following two conditions are the plausible specified conditions under which all rational persons would put forward a universal guide for governing the behavior of all moral agents. The first condition is that they are seeking agreement with all other rational persons or moral agents. The second condition is that they use only those beliefs that are shared by all rational persons such as that they are fallible and vulnerable and that all those to whom morality applies are also fallible and vulnerable. The second condition rules out both religious beliefs and scientific beliefs for there are no religious beliefs or scientific beliefs that all rational persons share. This condition is plausible because no universal guide to behavior that applies to all rational persons can be based on beliefs that some of these rational persons do not share.

The following definition of morality is the guide to behavior that all rational persons under these two plausible specified conditions would put forward to apply to all moral agents. It incorporates all of the essential features of morality as a guide to behavior that all rational persons would put forward for governing the behavior of all moral agents. “Morality is an informal public system applying to all rational persons, governing behavior that affects others, and has the lessening of evil or harm as its goal.” (Gert) In order to show that this definition incorporates all of the essential features of morality, I shall explain how the various parts of the definition incorporate these features.

Defining morality as a public system incorporates the essential feature that everyone who is subject to moral judgment knows what kinds of actions morality prohibits, requires, discourages, encourages, and allows. The definition of “public system” also guarantees that it is never irrational to act morally. That morality applies to all rational persons makes clear that the sense of “morality” being defined is that guide to conduct that applies to all rational persons. It would take considerably more space than is appropriate here to show that defining morality as a public system that applies to all rational persons also results in morality being a universal guide to behavior that all rational persons would put forward for governing the behavior of all moral agents. I should make clear that the claim that all rational persons would put forward this system only follows if they satisfy the two plausible conditions specified previously.(Gert)

To say that morality is an informal system means that it has no authoritative judges and no decision procedure that provides a unique guide to action in all moral situations. When it is important that disagreements be settled, societies use political and legal systems to supplement morality. These formal systems have the means to provide unique guides, but they do not provide the uniquely correct moral guide to the action that should be performed. That morality is a public system does not mean that everyone always agrees on all of their moral judgments, but only that all disagreements occur within a framework of agreement. Basketball can be a public system even if referees can, within limits, disagree in their judgments in calling fouls; but all players know that what the referees call a foul determines what is a foul. For an informal public system such as morality, fully informed moral agents can, within limits, disagree in their moral judgments. When this disagreement is recognized, those who understand that morality is an informal public system admit that how one should act is morally unresolvable, and if some resolution is required, the political or legal system can be used to resolve it.

An important example of such a moral problem is whether fetuses are impartially protected by morality and so whether or under what conditions, abortions are allowed. There is continuing disagreement among fully informed moral agents about this moral question, even though the legal and political system in the United States has provided fairly clear guidelines about the conditions under which abortion is legally allowed. Despite this important and controversial issue, morality, like all informal public systems, presupposes agreement on how to act in most moral situations, e.g., all agree that killing or seriously harming any moral agent requires strong justification in order to be morally allowed. No one thinks it is morally justified to cheat, deceive, injure, or kill a moral agent simply in order to gain sufficient money to take a fantastic vacation. Many violations of moral rules are such that no rational person would be willing for all moral agents to know that violating the moral rule in these circumstances is morally allowed. However, moral matters are often thought to be controversial because these everyday decisions, about which there is no controversy, are rarely discussed. The amount of agreement concerning what rules are moral rules, and on when it is justified to violate one of these rules, explains why morality can be a public system even though it is an informal system.

The claim that morality only governs behavior that affects others is somewhat controversial. Some have claimed that morality also governs behavior that affects only the agent herself, such as taking recreational drugs, masturbation, and not developing one's talents. Kant may provide an account of this expanded concept of morality, which is more closely tied to its religious origin. However, it is doubtful that all rational persons would put forward a universal guide to behavior that governs behavior that does not affect them at all. Indeed, when the concept of morality is completely distinguished from religion, moral rules do seem to be limited to behavior that directly or indirectly causes harm to others. Some behavior that seems to affect only oneself, e.g., taking recreational drugs, may have a significant indirect harmful effect on others by supporting the illegal and harmful activity of those gangs that benefit from the sale of those drugs.

Confusion about the content of morality arises because morality is not always distinguished from religion. Regarding self-affecting behavior as governed by morality is supported by the idea that we are created by God and are obliged to obey his commands, and so may be a holdover from the time when morality was not clearly distinguished from religion. This religious holdover might also affect the claim that some sexual practices such as homosexuality are immoral; but those who distinguish morality from religion do not regard homosexuality, per se, as a moral matter. Many secular American colleges and universities prohibit discrimination against homosexuals, and it is quite common for these college and university officials, as well as other public officials, to condemn anti-gay behavior as immoral just as they condemn racist behavior as immoral. The recent decision to rescind the “don't ask, don't tell” policy for military service shows that, apart from various religions, it is no longer standard to condemn homosexual behavior as immoral.

The final characteristic of morality — that it has the lessening of evil or harm as its goal — is also somewhat controversial. The Utilitarians talk about producing the greatest good as the goal of morality. However they include the lessening of harm as essential to producing the greatest good and almost all of their examples involve the avoiding or preventing of harm. The paradigm cases of moral precepts involve rules that prohibit causing harm directly or indirectly, such as rules prohibiting killing, causing pain, deceiving, and breaking promises. Even those precepts that require or encourage positive action, such as helping the needy, are almost always related to preventing or relieving harms. An examination of the paradigm examples of those moral precepts that are moral rules makes it clear that all of them are prohibitions of those kinds of actions that directly or indirectly cause harm to others; an examination of the paradigm examples of those moral precepts that are moral ideals makes it clear that all of them involve the prevention or lessening of harms. It would be possible to include these paradigm examples of moral precepts, e.g., do not kill, do not lie, and help the needy, in the normative definition of morality, but it not necessary to do so, because the proposed definition is sufficient to guarantee that these paradigm moral precepts will be part of morality. It should be clear that all rational persons would include these paradigm moral precepts in the moral code that they would put forward to guide the behavior of all moral agents.

Referring terms are ambiguous when the referents of a term differ from each other in sufficiently important ways. The original descriptive definition of “morality” refers to an actual code of conduct put forward by a society and accepted by the members of that society. When the examination of large diverse societies raised problems for this original descriptive definition, different descriptive definitions were offered in which “morality” refers to a code of conduct put forward by any group, or even by any individual. Apart from containing some prohibitions on harming some others, different moralities can differ from each other quite extensively. Unlike the descriptive definitions of morality discussed earlier, which may have minimal implications for how a person should behave, the proposed normative definition of “morality” provides an explicit guide for how a person should behave. The proposed normative definition of “morality” is controversial but it does have some features that should be widely accepted. The definition allows as meaningful the commonly asked question, “Why should I be moral?” It is also compatible with the commonly held view that it is not always irrational to be immoral, however it guarantees that it is never irrational to be moral. This definition also explains why we want others to act morally and why others want us to act morally. It thus does what definitions of referring terms are supposed to do: it clarifies this term's relationship to other terms with which it is related, and helps to explain why we use the word in the way that we do.

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Bernard Gert

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