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While “moral naturalism” is sometimes used to refer to any approach to metaethics intended to cohere with naturalism in metaphysics more generally, the label is more usually reserved for naturalistic forms of moral realism according to which there are objective moral facts and properties and these moral facts and properties are natural facts and properties. Views of this kind appeal to many as combining the advantages of naturalism and realism but have seemed to many others to do inadequate justice to central dimensions of our practice with our moral concepts. This entry examines some of these concerns and some ways in which moral naturalists have responded to them. It also profiles central aspects of the more particular views of some leading contemporary advocates of moral naturalism.
- 1. Introduction
- 2. The Open Question Argument
- 3. Internalism
- 4. Contemporary Naturalism
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
There is a broad sense of “moral naturalism” whereby a moral naturalist is someone who believes an adequate philosophical account of morality can be given in terms entirely consistent with a naturalistic position in philosophical inquiry more generally. According to such broad metaphysical naturalism, all facts are natural facts. Natural facts are understood to be facts about the natural world, facts of the sort in which the natural sciences trade. That is certainly vague, something some critics of naturalism are not slow to observe. However the details are filled in, the naturalist seems vulnerable either to a charge of either likely error or emptiness since, on the one hand, much science as presently constituted is all too liable to turn out false while, on the other, any appeal to an ideal completed science is apt to be as thin on content as our present grasp of what such an ideal science might say (Hampton 1998, chapter 1). The naturalist might well however resist the force of this supposed dilemma. J. J. C. Smart's injunction that we take science as our best guide to metaphysical truth (Smart 1996, 6) doesn't require us to treat our current scientific understandings as infallible. It merely invites us to do what good scientific practice itself does in deferring to our present background state of general scientific understanding as the best story we now have about the universe and its furnishings. It is no doubt a flawed, imperfect story still very much in progress, but far more to be trusted than the rival guidance we might seek from theology, say, or the wilder reaches of a more speculative metaphysics as we persist with a philosophical enterprise itself no less fallible and incomplete.
The ambition of moral naturalism in this broad sense is well described by Simon Blackburn (1984, 182):
To ask no more of the world than we already know is there—the ordinary features of things on the basis of which we make decisions about them, like or dislike them, fear them and avoid them, desire them and seek them out. It asks no more than this: a natural world, and patterns of reaction to it.
More recently (Blackburn 1998, 49) he elaborates:
The problem is one of finding room for ethics, or placing ethics within the disenchanted, non-ethical order which we inhabit, and of which we are a part.
Naturalism in this sense is opposed by those who reject a parsimonious naturalistic metaphysics and stand willing to allow a domain of nonnatural or supernatural facts to play an essential role in our understanding of morality. This broad moral naturalism is nonetheless very general and encompasses a highly diverse family of metaethical views, including expressivist, constructivist, error theoretic and relativist understandings. But in a narrower sense “moral naturalism” often picks out a far more specific sort of view that stands in contrast to all these variously “anti-realist” views, in holding that there are objective moral facts and properties and that these facts and properties are natural facts and properties. It is on moral naturalism in this narrower sense that this entry will focus.
Moral naturalism is an attractive view. As a form of realism, it offers to make robust sense of moral objectivity and moral knowledge, allowing for moral utterances to be truth-apt in straightforward ways and for some of them to be true. And as a form of naturalism it is widely seen as preferable to rival forms of moral realism. Moral properties and facts, realistically construed, can often seem unpalatably “queer”, as Mackie famously expressed it (Mackie 1977, chapter 1, section 9): a realist can seem committed to the existence of metaphysically far out entities or properties and embarrassed by the lack of any plausible epistemic story of how we can obtain knowledge of them. The naturalist offers to save realism but eliminate the mystery: the domain of moral value is to be seen as simply a part of the familiar natural world, known about in just the familiar, broadly empirical ways we know about the natural world. While for other views there is a gulf to bridge between the domain of prosaic natural facts and the domain of values, the moral naturalist seeks to collapse this distinction and reveal value to us as straightforwardly part of the domain of natural fact.
Moral naturalism, while attractive, has been dismissed by many in the light of G.E. Moore's Open Question Argument (Moore 1903, 5–21). Moore's thought is as follows. Suppose “N” to abbreviate a term expressing the concept of some natural property N, maximally conducing to human welfare perhaps, and suppose a naturalist proposes to define goodness as N-ness. We swiftly show this to be false by supposing someone were to ask of something acknowledged to be N, whether it was good. This, Moore urges, is an open question. The point is, essentially, that it is not a stupid question in the sort of way, “I acknowledge that Lenman is an unmarried man but is he, I wonder, a bachelor?” is a stupid question: if you need to ask it, you don't understand it. Given what the words concerned mean, the question of whether a given unmarried man is a bachelor is, in Moore's terminology, closed. So goodness and N-ness, unlike bachelorhood and unmarried-man-hood, are not one and the same.
Of course the concepts may be coextensive. It may, for all the Open Question Argument shows, be the case e.g., that a thing is good if and only if it conduces to welfare: utilitarianism of that kind might be a synthetic moral truth. But what the Open Question Argument is supposed to rule out is that “good” and “N” pick out not two distinct but coextensive properties but one and the same property in virtue of semantic equivalence. As Moore emphasizes we should distinguish the question, “What is goodness?” from the question “What things are good?” (1903, 5) The Open Question Argument is supposed to rule out certain answers to the first question, naturalistic answers such as “conduciveness to happiness.” But it is not meant to rule out our answering the second question e.g., “those things which conduce to happiness.”
A lot of fire has been directed at this little argument in the century since Moore published it. A central worry is that he failed to consider a crucial possibility. Consider the biconditional:
x is good iff x is N.
Moore, as we saw, notes that this may express a claim about what goodness is or a claim about what things are good. The former claim he understands as a claim that “good” and “N” are equivalent in meaning and so denote the very same property. He failed however to notice the possibility that they might denote the very same property even though they are not equivalent in meaning. The assumption at work here David Brink calls “the Semantic Test for Properties” according to which two terms pick out the same property only if they mean the same (Brink 1989, chapter 6 and Brink 2001). Brink thinks we can be confident that this assumption is false (and all the more so if we understand sameness of meaning as something epistemically transparent to competent speakers so that epistemic inequivalence implies semantic inequivalence.) One counterexample is by now proverbial:
x is water iff x is H2O.
It seems obvious that “water” doesn't mean the same as “H2O” (and all the more so if we take speakers as authoritative as to what their words mean). For it was a discovery when 18th century chemists figured this fact out. But being water and being H2O are not just a case of a pair of coextensive properties like being a cordate and being a renate. Being water and being H2O are one and the same identical property, the property identity in question being a posteriori, not a priori and certainly not analytic. So if we understand “naturalism” as the claim that moral facts and properties are natural facts and properties, the Open Question Argument does not refute it.
The latter objection has lately itself come under considerable fire. The central difficulty one that has been forcefully urged by Terence Horgan and Mark Timmons (Horgan and Timmons 1991 and 1992; Timmons 1999, chapter 2; cf. Smith 2004, 198–199). We know that water is H2O. We know this because we know that the stuff in the world to which our use of the concept “water” responds, the clear colourless liquid stuff that fills the oceans, etc. is H2O. And when we found out that that stuff was H2O, what we did counted as finding out that water was H2O only because we knew to begin with that that stuff was water. We knew, that is, that something like this is true.
WR: The stuff that directs and regulates our practice with the concept “water” is water.
Not only is this true but it may be argued that it is conceptually true and known a priori to be so. So the question:
QW: Granted that H2O is the stuff that directs and regulates our practice with the concept “water”, is H2O water?
is plausibly closed in Moore's sense. But now compare:
QM: Given that the use of ‘good’ is directed and regulated by natural property N, is whatever has N, good?
This question is by no means closed. We can readily conceive of societies that are pervasively morally wrong-headed, where their use of evaluative concepts is systematically directed and regulated by, we would want to say, the wrong stuff. What they call “good” is not good we insist and we think this disagreement real, not simply a case of conceptual cross-purposes. Indeed a moral dissident who thinks our own society a society of this kind will answer QM with a clear “No”. We may well think her mistaken but, if so, we think her error a substantive ethical one and not a case of conceptual confusion. We learn that H2O is water by learning that H2O is what plays, we might say, the water role. But learning that only enabled us to determine that water was H2O because we knew enough about the water role to begin with. We can then put Horgan and Timmons' point by saying that for a naturalist understanding of goodness to be possible in terms of an a posteriori property identity between goodness and N-ness some such claim as
The stuff that directs and regulates our practice with the concept “good” is good.
must be known a priori to characterize the goodness role as WR does the water role. And it is at this level that the Open Question Argument still carries a lethal bite.
Horgan and Timmons' principal target is the leading contemporary moral naturalist Richard Boyd (Boyd 1988; see further his 2003a and 2003b). But it is clear from Boyd's recent work on metaethics that he would resist the claim that the role that determines the reference of a term like “water” or “good” can be known a priori by conceptual analysis. The kind picked out by such a term can, he there suggests, be “determined by features of the word's use other than those readily accessible to conceptual analysis” (Boyd 2003a, 512). He accepts that the reference of a kind term is indeed determined by what feature of the world turns out to occupy a particular role. But instead of this role being determined by the concepts held by users of the term, it may instead, he proposes, be determined by the ways in which their use of the term contributes to the successes they achieve by it. This may be inscrutable to the users themselves who may either be mistaken about what they are achieving or mistaken about how their use of the term contributes to that success (Boyd 2003a, 539).
More could be said here. The issues involved about that status of conceptual analysis and how they bear on issues of naturalistic reduction are the focus of some of the most interesting and important work in contemporary philosophy. But to explore them further would be beyond the scope of this entry.
Let's turn to two other worries that have been aired about the Open Question Argument. One, whose classic expression is by William Frankena (Frankena 1939), is that it begs the question at issue. “Is such-and-such, which is N, good?” is an open question precisely when a definition of N-ness in terms of goodness is false and that is precisely what Moore is trying to establish. Another, forcefully urged in recent literature by Michael Smith, is that the Open Question Argument seems to prove too much, being just a particular instance of the piece of reasoning embodied in the Paradox of Analysis. The practice of conceptual analysis, this reasoning goes, aspires to provide real philosophical illumination; however if all analytic truths must share the obviousness of the proverbial unmarried male status of bachelors then no purported piece of conceptual analysis could fail to be either false or trivial, a conclusion highly embarrassing to much modern philosophy (Smith 1994, 37–39). But once we allow that analytic truths may be unobvious the appearance of openness in the question whether an N thing is a good thing ceases to look very significant.
Frankena's argument has met with the response that the core premise of the Open Question Argument is not the fact that the questions Moore calls attention to are open but that they seem open to competent users of moral concepts. This is evidence, inconclusive perhaps, but not question-begging, that they are open, that the kind of putative naturalistic equivalents of our ethical concepts Moore considers do indeed fail to capture something essential aspect of our moral concepts (Ball 1988).
Turning to the worry that the argument proves too much, this, like the argument from a posteriori property identities, raises large and vexed issues about conceptual analysis and its role in philosophy. Consider the sort of claim philosophers are given to making that we can illuminate a given concept C1 by regarding it as equivalent to an at least apparently distinct concept C2. Often such a claim is intended to be of real philosophical illumination. C1 is murky, obscure, problematic, and perhaps open to concerns about radical forms of scepticism. C2, the claimant hopes, is not. But C2 is good for all the work we need C1 for. Dropping C1 from our vocabulary in favour of C2 would, it may be suggested, lead to a gain in clarity with no loss in expressive power (cf. Rawls 1971, 95). To illustrate from another part of philosophy, the mind can seem rather strange and mysterious. It's puzzling how a naturalistic metaphysics could accommodate it. And our attributions of psychological concepts seem open to alarming sceptical concerns. How do I know you have a mind except from features of your behaviour a mindless zombie could readily be imagined to mimic? So let's analyse psychological concepts in terms of behavioural dispositions or, getting a bit more sophisticated and up to date, in terms of neural states that occupy certain complex and holistically specified functional roles. Great: now we have something that seems straightforwardly naturalistically respectable. And now we have an understanding of the psychological that allows us to send the other-minds sceptic packing. And everything sensible we ever needed to say with our talk of mind can, at least in principle, be said in terms of behavioural dispositions or functional roles. Or so it has been claimed.
Such an analytic claim may, as Smith argues, be intended straightforwardly to capture the inferential and judgemental dispositions of users of C1 and fail to be obvious without necessarily losing credibility. He writes:
Whereas mastery of a concept requires knowledge-how, knowledge of an analysis of a concept requires us to have knowledge-that about our knowledge-how. (Smith 1994, 38. Cf. Jackson 1998, 130)
And such knowledge-that might take a certain amount of figuring out. Sometimes we may be less than fully deferential to the inferential and judgemental dispositions of the folk. The folk are pretty unsophisticated, extremely numerous and have been around for a very long time exposed to a depressing array of, by naturalistic lights, daft superstitions. Perhaps folk psychological concepts carry a load of baggage from naturalistically disreputable religious understandings of the soul for which naturalistic philosophers will cheerfully supply no echo. Analyses offered with a view to philosophical illumination can be more or less revisionary. Indeed they can be reforming definitions intended to capture not so much what the folk mean as what they jolly well ought to mean. In which case, C2 will not be intended as equivalent to C1 but as identifying a reputable and sensible conceptual job the carrying out of which will serve some of the more respectable purposes served by C1 while happily abandoning the others.
Such attempts to give an account of C1 in terms of C2 are liable to be criticized. And the standard sort of move critics will make is to say, look, there is some really central aspect of what is expressed by C1 that is not captured by C2. In the case of behaviourist and functionalist accounts of the psychological domain, such objections are familiar. Such accounts, it is often charged, can't adequately account for consciousness, for qualia, for what the colour blue looks like or for what it is like to be Thomas Nagel. And the defenders of the account will respond by saying that, yes, they can account for these things, or that they can't but, for whatever reason they don't have to. (Perhaps our talk of them simply embodied confusion.) Even reforming definitions however are vulnerable to such criticisms. If we think talk of consciousness, qualia etc. need not embody confusion, we may think we need psychological concepts that are up to the job of engaging with them.
In the light of all this it may be suggested both what is right and what is unsatisfying about Moore's argument. What is right is that he articulates the thought that naturalistic understandings of moral concepts do indeed omit something central to them. What is unsatisfying is that he hasn't taken the argument far enough by telling us what that something is. Of course it is unlikely Moore would have been very apologetic on his score. As a nonnaturalist, he thought what was omitted was something ineffable that resisted articulate definition.
The foregoing points echo Peter Railton in his 1989 paper “Naturalism and Prescriptivity” where he urges that, despite the evident weaknesses of the Open Question Argument, there is a “significant critical function” Moorean questions can perform in metaethics whereby we may seek to identify some central and important ingredient of the target concept that a proposed analysis or reforming definition fails to capture (Railton 1989, 158). Moore himself fails clearly to identify any such ingredient, merely capturing dramatically our sense that there is one. But the omission has been made good by many of his philosophical successors.
Foremost among these is R. M. Hare. Arguably it is the magnificent Language of Morals and not Principia Ethica that should be viewed as the classic critique of moral naturalism in 20th century philosophy. “Value terms”, Hare wrote (1952, 91),
have a special function, that of commending; and so they plainly cannot be defined in terms of other words which do not perform this function; for if this is done we are deprived of a means of performing this function.
When we call something good, Hare writes, we commend it, where to commend a thing of a certain sort is to guide choice among things of that sort by implicit reference to a standard for such things. To commend a thing is always to commend it in virtue of the nonmoral features it has. Naturalism is the mistake of thinking value terms like “good” straightforwardly denote the features in virtue of which we commend them. That's why naturalism fails, according to Hare, to make adequate sense of moral disagreement. Echoing his classic example, one which anticipates the central objections to naturalism made more recently by Horgan and Timmnons, if Mike the Missionary applies “good” to meek gentle people with a marked distaste for scalp-hunting while Cedric the Cannibal applies it to bold burly people who collect as many scalps as they can, Hare's prescriptivism diagnoses them as in genuine disagreement over the proper standard for commending human beings: the naturalist he alleges, misdiagnoses their exchange as a case of merely apparent disagreement, a case of cross-purposes brought about by their attaching different meanings to the same term (Hare 1952, 148–149).
Others have followed Hare in attempting to diagnose a central feature of moral concepts that naturalism cannot capture. Thus Mackie complains that naturalism fails to do justice to “the categorical quality of moral requirements” (Mackie 1977, 33); Robert Adams that it cannot do justice to what he calls “the critical stance” (Adams 1999, 77 ff.); Jean Hampton that it cannot do justice to what she calls “the authority of reason” (Hampton 1998, especially chapter 3); Connie Rosati that it cannot do justice to the role in moral thought of what she calls “ideals of the person” (Rosati 1995a); Derek Parfit alleges that the naturalist fails to distinguish between normatively significant facts and the fact that they are normatively significant (Parfit 1997; see also McNaughton and Rawling 2003) and Allan Gibbard charges him with, as he memorably puts it, driving what to do out of ethics (Gibbard 2003, 13). Faced with such concerns, naturalists must either urge that their naturalism can after all accommodate them or that it need not.
Right at the heart of many such concerns is a cluster of issues about how naturalism handles the relationship between moral concepts and practical reason. It is the action-guiding character of morality that naturalism is so hard-pressed to handle. Two central issues are confusingly both widely characterized as issues over internalism, a word for which contemporary analytic philosophy has found a rather bewilderingly large range of uses. One such issue concerns the connection between moral judgements and what are sometimes called “motivating reasons” or just “motivation”. The other concerns the connection between moral judgement and normative reasons. Let's take them in turn.
Let's begin then with what is sometimes called (following Darwall 1983, 54) “judgement internalism” or (following Brink 1989, 40) “appraiser internalism”. As it's the only kind of internalism I'll discuss in this section, I'll just call it “internalism” here. What internalism claims is that you can't make a moral judgement and not be motivated to act in accordance with it. This is not to say the motivation need be effective. What Brink calls “strong internalists” (Brink 1989, 41–42) insist on this but that position seems ill-placed to handle the phenomenon of weakness of the will where we all too frequently fail to act as we believe we morally ought. Weak internalists allow that the motivation is defeasible. To get a handle on the idea of a defeasible motivation just think of desire. To desire something is to be to some extent motivated to do it but of course we often fail to do what we desire because we desire something else more, because it is impractical or out of some form of weakness. Weak internalists then think that when you make a moral judgement you are necessarily but defeasibly motivated to act accordingly.
This kind of internalism is very widely repudiated by moral naturalists and it is not hard to see why. For, plausibly, if a moral judgement is just a belief to the effect that some natural fact obtains, I might at least conceivably hold that belief and simply not give a damn. In which case, if naturalism is true, internalism must be false.
And so, many naturalists have urged, it is. The anti-internalist literature is heavily pervaded by a character known as the amoralist. The amoralist is precisely what the internalist says is not possible: a character who makes moral judgements but couldn't care less about them. He features prominently in the two most influential defences of externalism—the denial of internalism—found in the writings of David Brink and Sigrún Svavarsdóttir (Brink 1986; Brink 1989, chapter 3, section 3; Svavarsdóttir 1999, 2006). Both offer up descriptions of people of just this kind urging that they are eminently credible and all too intelligible.
The internalist would perhaps be wise to acknowledge that it certainly looks as if we can imagine that there could be amoralists as the externalist conceives them. In which case one thing the internalist might do is provide an alternative understanding of cases that seem to meet this description. And this is what they do, suggesting that while someone might appear to be making moral judgements they do not care about, such a person is in fact not making genuine moral judgements at all. Rather they are making what R. M. Hare called inverted commas moral judgements (1952, 124–126, 163–165).
Imagine an anthropologist studying a fictitious tribe of people we'll call the Membini who have in their language the word “maalu”. There are lots of things these people consider maalu: running away in battle, sleeping with a member of one's own family, eating donkey flesh and so on. The Membini generally endeavour not to do things that are maalu and treat those who do with censure and hostility. Now imagine that the anthropologist during a lecture saying: “Eating donkey flesh is maalu.” What is she doing? She's plausibly not doing what the tribesmen themselves do when they say this. For when the tribesmen makes a judgement about what is maalu they would seem to be making something at least very like a moral judgement as “maalu” appears to be something at least very like a moral concept. But when the anthropologist says something is “maalu” she isn't giving voice to a moral judgement. Rather she is offering an anthropological insight into the moral world of the Membini, even though she herself is an outsider to that world and the concept “maalu” is of no practical significance to her.
Now consider the seeming amoralist who says things like “Yes I know fine that killing people is wrong but I just don't care.” This, the internalist will urge, should not be understood as expressing a genuine moral judgement. Rather it expresses a sort of anthropological judgment, just like the anthropologist's judgement about eating donkeys. Only the seeming amoralist is making a sort of anthropological judgement about his own society. Just as the anthropologist shows her mastery of the moral concepts of the Membini by observing that e.g., eating donkey flesh is maalu the apparent amoralist may show his mastery of the concept “wrong” by observing that killing people is wrong. But this is not a genuine moral judgment so much as a kind of sociological observation, the difference between these types of judgement being just what internalism would lead us to expect. For the tribesmen what is maalu is of more than sociological concern: whether things are maalu is, for the tribesmen, something that guides them in their behaviour. Judgments about maalu-ness are for them motivationally significant in a way that they are not for the anthropologist.
The externalist may respond in turn that the amoralist is not properly understood as just making inverted commas moral judgements. For not only can we imagine an amoralist who makes but is indifferent to the sorts of moral judgements other members of his culture make, we can also imagine an amoralist making idiosyncratic, maverick moral judgements (Svavarsdóttir 1999, 189). And these judgements cannot plausibly be read as simply sociological judgments about the moral standards of others.
But, the internalist may respond, why ever not? Suppose our anthropologist says something novel and surprising about what is maalu. Does that mean she can no longer be using the concept in her usual anthropologist's way? It does not and there are two possible explanations of what is going on here. The first, very simply, is just that she has made a mistaken sociological judgement. The second explanation is subtler. What the anthropologist is doing when she determines what is or is not maalu is interpreting the tribesmen's moral code. She is doing so as an outsider but that does not mean she must always and across the board defer to the Membini themselves in so doing. (Just as an atheist Bible scholar might reject interpretations of Scripture favoured by believers.) A certain amount of originality and idiosyncrasy on the part of the anthropologist might be explained in either of these ways.
Now however suppose the anthropologist makes what appears to be a judgement about what is maalu that is not just idiosyncratic but wildly idiosyncratic, so idiosyncratic that it cannot at all credibly be supposed to be either a misunderstanding or a novel interpretative judgement about what the Membini's code commits them to. Suppose indeed that she denies her judgement is of this sort. “I think,“ she says, “that it is maalu to wear white socks. This is not an interpretative judgement about the Membini who love white clothes and have never heard of socks. I think this judgement is true but I stress it is of no practical significance to me and has no impact on my motivations.”
At this point, internalists urge, it seems very plausible to say just that we have lost any grip on what on earth she is talking about. “Maalu”, in her mouth now seems to be just a nonsense word (Lenman 1999, 445). It's easy to make this diagnosis here because after all “maalu” really is something close to a nonsense word, a word I've made up. The diagnosis of simple unintelligibility may come less naturally in the case of the amoralist, maverick or otherwise, because “right” and “wrong” are such familiar concepts that it's hard to hear them as plain nonsense; but if the amoralist isn't to be understood as speaking of “right” and “wrong” in inverted commas and if “right” and “wrong” are not concepts that guide his action it seems quite unclear that he can mean anything by them at all.
This would accord with a rich recent discussion of internalism by Allan Gibbard. Gibbard argues that externalism about evaluative concepts opens a conceptual space for our practical thought and our thought about what satisfies those concepts to become disconnected in what seem absurd ways and that were they do so we would lose any sense of the significance of those concepts. If you and I agree about what to do, how to live, how to deliberate, what to pursue, what to shun, whom to reward, whom to punish, whom to love, whom to hate, but disagree completely about the proper application of words like “good”, “right” “ought”, while taking these words to have no bearing on what to do, it may seem that these words, in our mouths, have become something close to empty noise (Gibbard 2003, chapters 1 and 7).
The externalist, then, thinks it is possible for there to be an amoralist—someone who has moral beliefs but is indifferent to them. But the internalist, we saw, can perhaps explain cases of apparent amoralism as cases, not of genuine moral judgment, but of inverted commas moral judgments, anthropological judgements about the morality of one's social group. Even some idiosyncratic moral judgements, it was suggested, might be explained in this way. But if we do not see someone's moral judgments either as in any way motivating them or as inverted commas judgments about the morality of their group there may seem, internalists will urge, a real problem making sense of them at all.
An internalist might make a further suggestion about why we should regard apparent amoralists as making only inverted commas moral judgements. The making of inverted commas moral judgements is clearly parasitical on the making of genuine moral judgements but not vice versa (Hare 1952, 170–172; Dreier 1990; Blackburn 1995; Lenman 1999). That is why we cannot imagine a world in which the only kind of moral judgements ever made are inverted commas moral judgments. For an inverted commas moral judgement is a judgement about the genuine moral judgements other people are making. It follows that if other people are not making genuine moral judgements, there is nothing for inverted commas moral judgements to be about. And, tellingly, universal amoralism does not, unlike individual amoralism, even seem to be readily conceivable (Lenman 1999). And this is exactly what the internalist's account of the matter would lead us to expect. For according to the internalist all we can in fact imagine when we may think we are imagining an amoralist, is someone making inverted commas moral judgements, not someone making genuine moral judgements. But anyone making inverted commas moral judgements is always, as it were, looking over their shoulder towards those of us engaged in real thing.
The internalist claims that in the mouth of the amoralist a moral utterance fails to mean quite what it does when it is used by you or me. What is missing is some action-guiding motivation-entailing dimension of meaning that naturalism seems ill-suited to capture. This is disputed by externalists like Brink and Svavarsdóttir by denying that there any such dimension to capture. However a more subtle alternative view (Copp 2001, cf. Barker 2000) might deny that any such dimension was part of the “standard core meaning” (Copp 2001, 18) of moral terms but admit its presence as something implicated, not entailed, by moral utterances. Because this dimension is merely implicated, the amoralist's “Killing people is wrong but I couldn't care less”, which cancels the implicature, may be somehow surprising and inappropriate but it may nonetheless express a thought that makes sense and is not incoherent. This move might promise to account for much of the intuitive appeal of internalism while remaining fundamentally naturalistic. That would leave in place worries about the intelligibility of possible disconnection between thought about what is right etc. and thought about what to do. These however might be thought to recede as the naturalist puts flesh on his account of moral properties. Thus, on Copp's own view, the truth conditions of moral concepts are determined, roughly, by facts about which moral standards are such that their currency would best conduce to meeting society's needs (Copp 2001, 28–29 recapitulating Copp 1995). Certainly you and I might conceivably disagree about that while nonetheless coinciding in all our motivations. At which point the issue is going to turn on whether that sort of disagreement is really properly to be considered moral disagreement at all.
Moral judgement internalism makes morality action guiding by urging a necessary connection between moral judgements and motivation. Internalism about reasons is the claim that there is a necessary connection between moral facts and normative reasons for action. This would be a problem for any moral naturalist who thought there was no necessary connection between any natural fact and reasons for action. But that is a stronger claim than most naturalists would accept. For naturalists about morality are typically naturalists about the normative domain more generally and so typically espouse naturalistic understandings of reasons for action.
The most familiar such understandings are instrumentalist understandings that view claims about reasons for action as claims about what would conduce to the satisfaction of an agent's desires and preferences. While less popular among philosophers than economists, such understandings have their naturalistic friends, Peter Railton for example characterizing them as offering “the clearest idea we have of what it is, at a minimum, to have a reason for action” (Railton 2003, 47, cf. 6). On a view like this there is a clear connection between some natural facts and reasons for action: facts about such reasons are natural facts. But they aren't the right sort of natural facts. Suppose for example facts about moral rightness are the sort of natural facts Railton has argued that they are: facts about “what would be rationally approved of were the interests of all potentially affected individuals counted equally under circumstances of full and vivid information” (2003, 22). Or, as Brink believes, facts about which actions maximize human welfare (Brink 1989, chapter 8). Then taking any interest in these facts may come to look rationally optional, contingent on being creatures with the right kind of other-regarding desires.
Naturalists such as Brink and Railton are fairly relaxed about this. They hold that strictly speaking taking any interest in morality is indeed rationally optional. You need to be a creature of the right sort. However, they urge, that should not unduly alarm us. Most human beings are creatures of the right sort. Given the pervasiveness of a concern “with whether our conduct is justifiable from a general rather than a merely personal standpoint”, urges Railton, most of us have a good instrumental reason to interest ourselves in morality (2003, 31). And Brink is optimistic that morality is justifiable even for an egoistic conception of rationality given the strong interdependence of our interests (1989, 242–244).
Brink thus thinks even an egoist can have reason to be moral but the justification we offer him is an external one. It's not a conceptual truth about morality that we have such a reason. Internalism about reasons is, he thinks, false. He defends this by again appealing to the amoralist (Brink 1989, chapter 3, section 8). Here the issue is not the conceivability of the amoralist but rather the coherence of a challenge a philosophically minded amoralist might make in demanding that we give him a reason to be moral. If internalism about reasons is true, Brink argues, such a challenge is incoherent. We can indeed answer this challenge, he thinks; but we should take it seriously and not dismiss it by conceptual fiat.
After these rather general considerations, I will briefly, in the final part of this entry, look at some of the leading figures in contemporary metaethics who defend versions of naturalism.
One important school of thought here is represented by philosophers whose work is inspired by that of Aristotle. This view has its roots in the writings of G. E. M. Anscombe, P. T. Geach and the early Philippa Foot among others. Its contemporary representatives include the later Foot, Rosalind Hursthouse, Martha Nussbaum and Judith Jarvis Thomson. As this list makes clear, this is very much the official metaethical theory of the main current in contemporary virtue ethics.
A big problem here, it is widely supposed, is the biology. Aristotelian ethics is pervasively informed by an essentialist, teleological conception of the nature of a species that makes very questionable sense in the context of modern science. And the prospects for grounding ethics in modern post-Darwinian biology are more or less uncontroversially forlorn: evolutionary biology has very little (at least of a positive nature) to tell us about metaethics except insofar as it might be taken to add plausibility to the kind of broad naturalism described at the outset. Nussbaum has sought to respond to claims of this sort ably canvassed in the work of Bernard Williams (Nussbaum 1995). Williams reads Aristotle as understanding questions about human nature as “external” scientific questions to be addressed independently of any ethical considerations. This, Nussbaum charges, is a mistake: an external understanding of human nature would indeed tell us little about ethics. Aristotle's understanding of biology and indeed science generally is what she calls “internal” and as such pervasively informed by substantive ethical understandings. But to understand ethical facts as grounded in facts about human nature where the facts about human nature are understood in a way that is already pervasively and substantively moralized no longer looks much like a form of naturalism and appears quite consistent with a variety of competing metaethical views such as constructivism, expressivism or intuitionism.
Neo-Aristotelian naturalism is articulated at length and along mutually similar lines in two recent monographs, Foot's Natural Goodness and Hursthouse's On Virtue Ethics. I will focus on Hursthouse whose account is the clearer and more detailed of the two. Ethical naturalism, according to Hursthouse, views evaluation as an activity continuous with a kind of ethology focused on the evaluation of living things as specimens of their kind. In the case of plants, to say an individual is a good member of whatever its species may be is to evaluate how well its parts and operations contribute in ways characteristic of that species to the two ends of survival and reproduction. With at least some animals a third end becomes salient—freedom from pain and pleasure and enjoyment of sorts characteristic to the species in question. And with social animals a fourth dimension comes into play: the good functioning of the group (Hursthouse 1999, chapter 9). Evaluation of this kind allows us to say, following Foot, that a free-riding wolf or a dancing bee who finds a source of nectar but does not alert other bees to it are defective (96, citing “Does Moral Subjectivism Rest on a Mistake?” in Foot 2002). Defectiveness in this context is a straightforwardly factual matter. Given the normal characteristics of their species, male cheetahs who help their heavily pregnant mates to hunt for food are to be classed as defective as are male polar bears who nurture their young (Hursthouse 1999, 220–221).
Given such examples, a critic may urge, it's hard to see how we are here concerned here with evaluation except in a highly deflationary sense that has little bearing on ethics, as opposed simply to a kind of classification. But Hursthouse insists to the contrary. A good human being is a human being endowed with characteristics that conduce in characteristically human ways to the four ends of survival, reproduction, characteristic enjoyment and freedom from pain and the good functioning of the group. And, at the level of character, those characteristics are just the virtues. But humans are peculiar as a highly salient characteristic feature of human beings is rationality. This makes the evaluation of human conduct a very different ball game than with cheetahs or polar bears. Being rational we can elect to assign some feature of our characteristic behaviour no or negative normative weight. There nonetheless remains a distinctive and characteristically human way of carrying on: the rational way, which we characteristically regard as good and take ourselves to have reason to pursue (Hursthouse, esp. 221–222).
Once this is said, it might be objected, we've more or less left the naturalism behind. We don't need anything remotely like ethology to tell us that we should favour ethical views supported by good reasons to those not so supported nor do we need to be any sort of naturalists to believe it. And we might legitimately follow Williams in asking if we're concerned with what is distinctively and characteristically human why make such a big deal about rationality. Why not the making of fire, having sexual intercourse without regard to season, despoiling the environment and upsetting the balance of nature or killing things for fun (Williams 1972, 73)? There's a natural and obvious answer to this, which appeals to widely, shared human commonalities of value. Perhaps we can bring this too under the heading of the characteristically human but those humans who may not share these values might fairly retort, So what? Aren't they free, for all this quasi-ethological picture tells us, to assign normative weights in their own ways? The hallmark distinctive of naturalism, Hursthouse would respond, is the regulatory role of the four ends (Hursthouse 1999, 224–226). But these too seem to be decidedly up for grabs when she acknowledges that nothing in particular need follow from her view about the ethical status of, say, celibates and homosexuals who don't concern themselves with reproductive activity (Hursthouse 1999, 215). Or when she argues apropos of vegetarianism that we “act as we should when we refuse to eat meat”, a form of abstention that seems to draw its rationale from a form of ethical concern whose scope extends far beyond the human social group. Here she tells us that eating meat is intemperate and that it counts as intemperate because it is greedy and self-indulgent (Hursthouse 1999, 227-228). But why, our objector may persist, should we say of someone lean and healthy who eats both meat and other foods in great moderation that they are greedy? Or of someone who takes characteristically human enjoyment from the eating a simple meal of meat and potatoes that they are self-indulgent? Very plausibly we should not unless we take it that the welfare of nonhuman animals is an end with its own normative significance. Hursthouse does seek to show that appeal to the role of the four ends can do real constraining work by urging that it can plausibly delivers the conclusion that impersonal benevolence as favoured in the work of utilitarians such as Peter Singer is a virtue because it is apt to come into conflict with two of the four ends, the continuance of the species and the good functioning of the social group (Hursthouse 1999, 224–226). But it's unclear that this example cuts much dialectical ice. Absent a much richer diet of illustrations, a reader friendly to Singer's position might simply take its force as pushing the other way, as evidence that the set of ends Hursthouse privileges is just too narrow.
Finally I turn to Judith Jarvis Thomson. Thomson follows Geach in her rejection of the view (which she associates in particular with Moore) that “goodness” names a property of good things, which are accordingly susceptible to more or less unrestricted ranking by the “betterness” relation. “Good”, Geach insists, is an attributive, not a predicative adjective (Geach 1956). To illustrate briefly: “brown” is predicative as “Hector is a brown mouse” analyses straightforwardly as “Hector is a mouse and he is brown”; “enormous” is attributive as “Hector is an enormous mouse” does not analyse as “Hector is a mouse and he is enormous.” An enormous mouse may still be quite a tiny mammal. Thomson departs from Geach in preferring to say that goodness is always goodness in a way (Thomson 1996, 128–130; 1997, 275–276; 2001, 17–19). But the way need not always be understood as relativization to a particular substantive as we see from examples such as “good for use in making cheesecake” or “good for Alfred” (Thomson 1997, 278). Because all goodness is goodness in a way, it is a nonsense to see all cases of it as connected by a straightforward ranking relation. St Francis was good in one way. Chocolate is good in another. But it would just be silly to ask which is better (Thomson 2001, 17–19).
We can distinguish, she urges, various important sub-classes among ways of being good, the useful (as in “good for” governing a verb), the skilful (“good at”), the enjoyable, the beneficial (as in “good for” governing a noun) and the morally good (Thomson 1996, 131–133). All are matters of straightforward natural fact. Being good for use in φ-ing is a matter of being such as to facilitate φ-ing in a way conducive to the wants people typically φ in order to satisfy. Being good at φ-ing is a matter of being capable of φ-ing in the way that people who want to φ typically want to φ (Thomson 1996, 134–137). Enjoyment she acknowledges is a little tricky: some people enjoy what is not good (example: Koolaid ) so a role must be given to expertise, which can be hard to characterize (Thomson 1996, 138–140). The beneficial can also be complicated. It is easy enough with, say, carpets. What is good for a carpet is what conduces to it being in the condition people who want carpets typically want their carpets to be in (Thomson 1996, 141). In the case of plants and lower animals what is good for them is what conduces to health and health is whatever conduces to their being in a condition conducing to doing what they were designed by nature to do (Thomson 2001, 56–57). What is good for a person is the trickiest case. It's not straightforwardly what conduces to health, as something may be good for something for reasons that have little to do with health (example: going to law school [Thomson 2001, 55]). Nor is it a matter of conducing to what one most wants (example: I might most want to smoke 60 cigarettes a day [Thomson 2001, 54]). So she thinks the truth is some form of compromise between the want story and the health story (Thomson 2001, 55–56).
Moral goodness is explained in terms of virtue and vice concepts. Virtue concepts such as justice and generosity specify ways of being morally good, vice concepts ways of being morally bad. Virtues are “second-order” ways of being good in that they are explicated in ways that make reference to the first-order ways (Thomson 1996, 144-147; 1997, 279–281; 2001, 59–67). In general, Thomson suggests, a virtue is a trait such that, whatever else is true of those among whom we live, it is better if they have it (Thomson 1997, 282). What we are morally required to do is just what we would be vicious in some way were we to fail to do (Thomson 1996, 150–152, 1997, 286–287). “Ought”, her account continues, has two senses: an expectation sense (“The train ought to arrive at 3”) and an advice sense (“You ought to drink some hot lemonade”) (Thomson 2001, 44). In the advice sense you ought to φ if your not φ-ing would be vicious in some way. If neither φ-ing nor refraining from φ-ing would be vicious in any way then you ought to φ if φ-ing would answer to your interests (Thomson 1996, 147-150, 2001, 67–70). Goodness connects to reason insofar as for you to have a reason to φ it suffices that your φ-ing would be good in some way (Thomson 2001, 34–37). And goodness connects to wanting insofar as Thomson endorses Anscombe's claim that you cannot want something without believing that it would be good in some way (Thomson 2001, 40 citing Anscombe 2000, 70–72).
This is a beautifully elegant and straightforward account that makes a valiant attempt to represent moral claims, and indeed evaluative and normative claims more generally, as straightforward matters of natural fact. The main critical concerns that might be raised are liable to echo points already aired. Thus my earlier remarks about the role of biology might make us suspicious of Thomson's explication of health and so of the beneficial in terms of nature's designs. And then there is the character who is adept at understanding and applying moral concepts as she characterizes them but who couldn't care less about them. He's a bad person on her story. He's vicious. He has reason to change. He acknowledges all these starightforwardly facts and sincerely avows his belief in them, a belief to which he accords no practical significance at all. Those who are impressed by the arguments for internalism noted earlier will of course be troubled by such a possibility.
“Cornell Realism” is a term applied to a view developed in the last twenty years or so in writings primarily by Richard Boyd, Nicholas Sturgeon (who both teach at Cornell) and David Brink (who was taught there). Some aspects of Boyd and Brink's view have been discussed already above. One way into understanding the broader Cornell Realist view is by recalling a distinction made by Richard Brandt in a discussion of moral naturalism written in 1959. Brandt (1959, 155) distinguishes between naturalism and what he calls “contextualism” as follows:
The contexualist … holds that, in principle, the questions of ethics can be answered by the methods of the empirical sciences. But in his case there is an important proviso. That is, the contexualist asserts that the questions of ethics can be answered by the methods of science if we can assume some ethical premises as given, as reasonable assumptions, not needing to be questioned for the purposes of the problem at hand. The naturalist theory does not include any such proviso: It holds that the methods of science can support ethical statements without the assumption of any ethical premises.
From the perspective of Cornell Realism it is important to see that this contrast breaks down. It breaks down in the context of a perspective heavily inspired by contemporary trends in the philosophy of science that endorses and emphasizes epistemological coherentism and confirmational holism. Ethical claims cannot be tested empirically in isolation from other ethical claims but confirmational holism teaches us that this is normal in empirical science. Thus Sturgeon defines “the autonomy of ethics” as the claim that we can never infer any ethical conclusion from any set of entirely nonethical premises (Sturgeon 2002, 190). Ethical naturalists have, he notes, and Brandt clearly bears him out, been thought committed to denying this. But that is just a mistake. Once we are clear about confirmational holism, we can see “that our thought about the natural world is heavily populated by areas that are autonomous with respect to the evidence we bring to bear on them” (Sturgeon 2002, 201). And Boyd argues that, in ethical inquiry, the role of heavily theory-laden intuition and culturally transmitted presuppositions need not debunk, just as in science it need not debunk. Indeed, in science, such things can be seen as favouring realism—we can argue that heavily theory-dependent revisions of scientific knowledge can only contribute to scientific progress if the theories in question are approximately true enough not to lead us astray. Analogously, if there are grounds to believe moral reasoning starts out approximately true, we can legitimately view the presupposition-heavy method of reflective equilibrium as one of discovery and not merely construction (Boyd 1988).
What, asks Boyd, is to play the role in ethics that observation plays in science? And the answer, he announces, is simply observation. He favours a substantive ethical view he labels “homeostatic consequentialism” which identifies goodness with a cluster of properties, conducive to the satisfaction of human needs, tending to occur together and with a tendency to promote each other (or to be promoted by the same sorts of things). If this theory is right, goodness is a natural property and as amenable to observation as any other. Of course the observations are theory-laden but so what? All observations are. The issue about the approximate truth of our background moral beliefs really just boils down to the issue of whether our beliefs about our needs and capacities have been up to scratch and it is plausible that they have (Boyd 1988, 206–207). But this may seem tendentious. If this substantive moral theory is right, goodness is just the eminently observable natural property it highlights. But the far more vexed theoretical judgements that presumably load Boydian moral observations include claims to the effect that the theory is right, not merely much more empirically straightforward claims about the how most effectively to satisfy those human needs to which the theory accords moral significance.
A moral anti-realist might well be imagined willing to grant to the Cornell realists that moral observation is theory-laden but insist that when we think of moral observation surely we want to distinguish the worldly input to that observation from the contribution of our moral sensibility (cf. Blackburn 1998, 4–8). And then the anti-realist's thought will be that the moral dimension of what we observe is wholly due to the latter. (Compare Hume 2000, 301 on wilful murder). At the level of phenomenology the friends of theory-ladenness will, rightly or wrongly, acknowledge no possibility of such a disentangling but at the level of naturalised epistemology they will grant that there can be. The question then becomes one of whether the best explanations of our moral judgements and beliefs invoke the supposedly natural moral properties and facts those beliefs are claimed to take for their objects or whether instead they speak merely of prosaically nonmoral natural properties gilded perhaps by our internal sentiments. Hence the central importance of the debate on moral explanations.
That there is never a worldly moral input to moral observation is precisely what is claimed by Gilbert Harman in a classic discussion of this issue that initiates the large contemporary literature (Harman 1977, chapter 1). In his central example we observe a group of children burning a cat alive for the hell of it. Here Harman is happy to say, given his belief in theory-ladenness, that you just see that these kids are doing something wrong. But the role of observation in science, he thinks, is very different from its role in ethics. In science we explain the observations we make and the beliefs we form as a result by appealing to the physical facts that cause those observations. But we can explain our moral reactions (which he will let you call “observations”) and our moral beliefs without needing to appeal to any moral facts. All that we need to appeal to are the nonmoral facts observed and some other nonmoral facts about the psychology of the person making the moral observation or holding the moral belief—in particular to their moral sensibility.
Thus consider in the first place, as Harman invites us to, a physicist who is trying to test a scientific theory and observes a vapour trail in a cloud chamber. Observation is theory laden, so while what you or I will see is just an unintelligible streak what the physicist will see is a proton. This observation may count as evidence for something, perhaps for some theory the physicist is trying to test. But in order for it to do so we must suppose that there really was in fact a proton there and that that fact explains his observation. And of course we do, in such cases, commonly suppose this.
But in the moral case where we observe the youths burning the cat and judge that they are wrong there is no explanatory work for the moral facts to do. Any moral facts are indeed, he contends, irrelevant to explaining our observing, responding and judging as we do. If I observe the youths and judge that they are doing something wrong we need, to explain this, to talk about the non-moral facts of the situation—that some children are burning a cat, etc.—and to talk about the non-moral facts concerned with my moral sensibility—that I am a cat-lover: that I dislike cruelty etc. And these kinds of natural non-moral facts are all we need invoke to explain my judgement.
This discussion of Harman's is the target of Sturgeon's classic paper “Moral Explanations”. His discussion is beautifully illustrative of the central Cornell Realist emphasis on confirmational holism. Sturgeon thinks there are lots of examples of perfectly acceptable moral explanations of natural facts. He offers these (Sturgeon 1988, 243–244).
1. Hitler. Hitler was morally depraved, a moral fact. And that Hitler was morally depraved explains why Hitler did the things he did- why he started a world war, etc.
2. Passed Midshipman Woodworth. In 1846 one Passed Midshipman Woodworth was put in charge of a rescue operation in the High Sierra of the Western United States. The operation was not a success and the historian Bernard DeVoto offers what Sturgeon thinks a plausible partial explanation of this: Passed Midshipman Woodworth was “just no damned good”, a moral fact.
3. Slavery. Serious and widespread opposition to slavery arose in the 18th and 19th centuries in Europe and North America. But why then and why there? Because at that time and in those places, Sturgeon proposes, slavery was particularly bad compared to at other times and places, once again a moral fact.
None of these is an example of a moral explanation of a belief or observation but all three examples can be made to produce examples of this kind too. Thus, for example, we believe Hitler was morally depraved, suggests Sturgeon, because he was. But doesn't all this miss Harman's point? Can't we explain all these things without appealing to anything except the natural facts and the facts about our own and other people's moral sensibilities?
No, says Sturgeon. If we come to read Harman already convinced that moral anti-realism is true we will agree with him that moral facts explain nothing. For we will think there are no such facts. But that is hardly to say that Harman's argument has independent force as an argument for moral anti-realism. If we were puzzled whether moral realism was true, we could not find in Harman a non-question-begging line of argument against moral realism. Harman's scepticism about moral explanation is, Sturgeon urges, a symptom of his scepticism about moral facts generally (Sturgeon 1988, 237–238, 254). It is not an independently forceful argument for such scepticism. To see this, he suggests, we should think about what explanatory irrelevance involves.
Harman thinks the wrongness of what the children do irrelevant to explaining your response. What does this mean? Well if we say that fact A is irrelevant to the explanation of fact B we mean that B would still have been true and could have been explained just as well even if A had been false. In the cat-burning case, that means that you would still have thought that what the children did was wrong even if it had not been wrong. But, suggests Sturgeon, this can be read in two ways, one friendly to Harman, the other not (Sturgeon 1988, 246–247).
Reading A: Had what the children did not been wrong would you still have thought it was? Well imagine a world where the nonmoral facts are all just as they are in Harman's story—the children find a cat and set it on fire for fun and you see this and you have a moral sensibility that disapproves of such things. Only imagine that what they do is not wrong. Would you still react by thinking what they did was wrong? Yes. So on reading A it looks as if the wrongness of the act is explanatorily irrelevant.
Reading B. This is Sturgeon's favoured reading. Had what the children did not been wrong would you still have thought it was? Well, says Sturgeon, burning cats for fun is wrong. So if we are to imagine that what the children do is not wrong we will have to imagine them doing something else. For the moral facts supervene upon the nonmoral facts and if we want to imagine the moral facts different we must imagine the other facts different as well (Sturgeon 1988, 250–251). So what Sturgeon tells us to imagine is that the children are doing something different, not vastly different, just different enough for it not to be wrong. Perhaps for example they are burning an old toy cat. If you saw this, you would not react by thinking they were doing something wrong. Hence, the fact that they are doing something wrong does make a difference to your reaction. Were they not doing something wrong you would have reacted differently. The moral facts are relevant to explaining the natural facts.
But why prefer reading B? Because, Sturgeon suggests, an analogous choice presents itself in the case of scientific explanation and we prefer reading B in that case (Sturgeon 1988, 251–252). Consider Harman's example of scientific explanation. The physicist believes there is a proton there because there is a proton there. We think the proton makes a difference. Had there not been a proton the physicist would not have believed there was.
But in thinking the presence of a proton to be a good explanation for the physicist's belief we made an assumption. We assumed that the background physical theory, which the physicist believes, the theory according to which a vapour trail in a cloud chamber is evidence of a proton, is roughly right.
But we don't need to make this assumption. So we have
Reading A. Had the proton not been there would the physicist still have thought it was? Well imagine it is not there but what the physicist sees is exactly the same. He sees a cloud in a vapour trail. But that does not mean a proton is present- because the physicist has his physics wrong. Will he still believe there is a proton there? Yes. Because that is what his wrong physics tells him to believe given the evidence.
And reading B. Had the proton not been there would the physicist still have thought it was? Well our physics tells us that if no proton had been there he would not have seen what he saw. So to imagine there being no proton there, we will have to imagine that what he sees, his evidence, is different. So imagine that it is, imagine it different enough to no longer be indicative of the presence of a proton. In that case, says Sturgeon, he will very likely not think there is a proton there. So there being a proton there makes a difference to what he thinks. Were there no proton there he would think something else.
In the physics case Harman wants reading B. In the ethics case Harman wants reading A. And that, contends Sturgeon, is a double standard. It is generally true, he says, that in deciding whether to accept an explanation we rely on the beliefs we already have about the world. So in deciding that the physicist's belief that there is a proton there is explained by the presence of a proton we rely on our beliefs about physics. It is not an interesting argument for scepticism about science that that explanation would not look very good if our physics was all wrong. But likewise in deciding that our belief that what the children do is wrong is explained by its being wrong we rely on our beliefs about ethics. And it is not an interesting argument for scepticism about ethics that that explanation would not look very good if our ethics was all wrong.
So, Sturgeon urges, Harman has begged the question. For it is only because he favours reading A in the ethical case that he has succeeded in raising a problem about moral explanation. And if that problem can only be raised by presupposing moral scepticism, it cannot be an independent argument for moral scepticism.
Harman also has urged against Sturgeon that appeal to moral explanations is idle: all the explanatory work is done by reference to the nonmoral supervenience base of the supposed moral properties and facts (Harman 1986, 63–64). But it isn't enough just to assert this without argument. Higher-order properties and facts are widely invoked in all kinds of causal-explanatory contexts where we don't simply dismiss them as epiphenomenal causal irrelevancies. Almost no one is sceptical about the explanatory relevance of geological or biological properties and facts. So anti-realists like Harman must offer grounds to suppose there is a clear disanalogy between the moral case and other cases where higher-order supervening properties and facts are granted causal explanatory weight (Sturgeon 1986a, 74–76).
Certainly anti-realists have sought to do this. I'll close this section by briefly noting two ways. One is to argue that moral facts and properties will not plausibly feature in the best causal explanations of observed events in the world because of what Brian Leiter calls the “Problem of Explanatory Narrowness”. Leiter urges that the range of things that stand to be at all credibly explained by moral properties and facts is decidedly narrow and that that fact serves to degrade the credentials of moral explanations given his acceptance of Paul Thagard's claim that consilience—how much a theory explains—is a central factor governing proper theory choice in explanatory contexts (Leiter 2001; Thagard 1978).
A second alleged disanalogy focuses on the character of the supervenience relation itself, urging that the case of moral supervenience is peculiar. In other, nonmoral, cases, some have claimed, the supervening facts are necessitated logically by the lower-order facts supervened upon together with the concepts by which the supervenient facts are identified. The extensions of our moral concepts however are not determined by the subvening facts together with the concepts themselves. Someone might in principle differ with us over the correct application of these concepts without failing to understand or share them and where all parties are fully informed about the subvening facts. And that can leave the facts of supervenience itself looking, from a naturalistic standpoint, unappealingly and peculiarly mysterious and sui generis (Horgan and Timmons 1992a; cf. Gibbard 2003, 212–215). As above in section 2.1, everything here depends on what position we take more widely on highly contested issues of conceptual analysis and naturalistic reduction.
The literature on the latter issues is heavily informed by the work of Frank Jackson who has also developed a distinctive and deeply interesting version of moral naturalism. Jackson, unlike the Cornell Realists, cheerfully espouses a strong form of reductionism. According to Jackson, the extensions of our moral concepts however are determined by the subvening facts together with the concepts themselves.
Jackson believes that ethical properties are natural properties or, as he prefers to say in this context, descriptive properties. His argument for this appeals to the supervenience of the moral on the descriptive. This is the claim that no two completely specified situations that differ in their ethical properties can be exactly alike in their descriptive properties. It's safest to focus on situations that are very completely specified so we'll just say that no two possible worlds that differ in their ethical properties can be exactly alike in their descriptive properties. Now, for any ethical way E a world might be, there is a set of possible worlds, w1, w2, … that are that way. Let D1, D2, … be complete descriptions in strictly descriptive terms of how these worlds are. Now let D be the disjunction “D1 or D2 or …” E entails D of course, given that w1, w2, etc. are all the worlds where E. And there are no worlds exactly like any of D1, D2, … where not E, because supervenience says no worlds exactly like each other descriptively can differ ethically (Jackson 1998, 122–123).
It could be objected that this just shows ethical properties to be necessarily coextensive with descriptive properties. But Jackson does not believe there are any necessarily coextensive but distinct properties. If two properties not only coincide in the actual worlds but could not fail to coincide we have, he contends, not two properties but one. In the ethical case moreover he thinks this especially plausible for two reasons. Our practice with ethical terms can plausibly be described from an external perspective in purely descriptive terms. And any supposed extra descriptive dimension would seem idle. It's because an act is murderous that we judge it wrong, not because it is murderous plus X where X is some extra nondescriptive property. It is difficult, Jackson says, “to see how the further properties could be of any ethical significance” (Jackson 1998, 127). This might well, as David McNaughton and Piers Rawling have urged, open him to the Parfitian charge, mentioned above, of failing to distinguish between normatively significant properties and the property of being normatively significance (McNaughton and Rawling 2003). Jackson in turn might meet this charge by urging that the distinction we require is between the descriptive property that occupies a certain descriptively specified role and the higher order property of occupying that role. The issue is too complex and delicate to pursue further here.Jackson doesn't just argue that ethical properties are descriptive properties. He also has an account of which descriptive properties ethical properties are (Jackson 1998, 129–134, 140–143). It goes as follows.
Let's to begin with, take some platitudinous thoughts about morality and write them down in a dirty great big sentence.
FM1. Wrong actions ought to be discouraged and shunned; right actions ought to be promoted and encouraged; virtuous people are disposed to perform rights actions and not to perform wrong actions; vicious people are disposed to perform wrong actions and not to perform right actions; right actions are right because they have certain natural properties on which rightness supervenes; similarly for wrong actions; and so on: blahdeblah.
Now let's transform this as follows:
FM2. Actions with property w stand in relation o to being discouraged and shunned; actions with property r stand in relation o to being promoted and encouraged; people with property v1 are disposed to perform actions with r and not to perform actions with w; people with property v2 are disposed to perform actions with w and not to perform actions with r; actions with r have r because they have certain natural properties on which r supervenes; similarly for actions with w; and so on: blahdeblah.
What we just did was to take all and only the moral terms in FM1, get rid of them, and uniformly replace them with variables. FM2, unlike FM1, doesn't contain any moral terms. But that fact is not yet very interesting as FM2 isn't really a meaningful sentence. But we can turn it into one by simply doing this:
FM3. There exists a property w and a property r and a property v1 and a property v2 and a relation o (and whatever further properties and relations are designated by the variables in “blahdeblah”) such that: actions with w stand in o to being discouraged and shunned; actions with property r stand in o to being promoted and encouraged; people with v1 are disposed to perform actions with r and not to perform actions with w; people with v2 are disposed to perform actions with w and not to perform actions with r; actions with r have r because they have certain natural properties on which r supervenes; similarly for actions with w; and so on: blahdeblah.
(Sentences like this that result from performing this sort of manoeuvre are called Ramsey sentences.) Now notice something about FM3. Unlike FM2, it is a meaningful if not very pretty sentence. But unlike FM1 it is a sentence you would be able to understand without possessing any moral concepts. All you need to do is understand all the nonmoral, descriptive concepts in FM3 and follow its rather complicated structure.
What FM3 says is that there are a bunch of things w, r, v1 etc. that together play the complex roles FM3 specifies in the complex structure FM3 describes. This isn't yet quite what's wanted. What we want is a sentence that says there's exactly one bunch of such things. Logicians have a standard trick for doing this. This calls for a decidedly complicated sentence that goes like this:
FM4. There exists a property w and a property r and a property v1 and a property v2 and a relation o (etc.) such that: actions with w stand in o to being discouraged and shunned; actions with property r stand in o to being promoted and encouraged; people with v1 are disposed to perform actions with r and not to perform actions with w; people with v2 are disposed to perform actions with w and not to perform actions with r; actions with r have r because they have certain natural properties on which r supervenes; similarly for actions with w; and so on: blahdeblah;
for all w* and all r* and all v1* and all v2* and all o* (etc.): actions with w* stand in o* to being discouraged and shunned; actions with property r* stand in o* to being promoted and encouraged; people with v1* are disposed to perform actions with r and not to perform actions with w*; people with v2* are disposed to perform actions with w and not to perform actions with r*; actions with r* have r* because they have certain natural properties on which r supervenes; similarly for actions with w*; and so on: blahdeblah; IF AND ONLY IF w* = w and r* = r and v1* = v1* and v2* = v2 and o* = o (etc.).
Now suppose FM4 is true. Now we can do something neat: we can define ethical terms in pristinely natural terms. Here's how. Let's take “right”. “Right” is what we replaced with the variable “r”. So we can just say:
RIGHT. Rightness is the property r such that: There exists a property w and a property v1 and a property v2 and a relation o (etc.) such that: actions with w stand in o to being discouraged and shunned; actions with property r stand in o to being promoted and encouraged; people with v1 are disposed to perform actions with r and not to perform actions with w; people with v2 are disposed to perform actions with w and not to perform actions with r; actions with r have r because they have certain natural properties on which r supervenes; similarly for actions with w; and so on: blahdeblah; AND … (Uniqueness clause as for FM4).
This is neat because it allows us to offer reductive definitions of moral concepts in spite of their highly holistic character. Very plausibly it would be forlorn to try to offer reductive definitions of these concepts one by one. But is FM4 true? Well it depends how much structure we offer. It depends that is, on how rich and determinate in content whatever replaces “blahdeblah” is. And how rich is it? Well we may in the first instance think of the “platitudinous thoughts” we put into it as giving the content of what Jackson calls “folk morality” (Jackson 1998, 130):
The network of moral opinions, intuitions, principles and concepts whose mastery is part and parcel of having a sense of what is right and wrong and of being able to engage in meaningful debate about what ought to be done.
The trouble is that folk morality is pervasively contested. There's a lot of agreement to be sure: we'd all be talking past each other were there not (Jackson 1998, 132). But what's left when you leave the contested stuff out plausibly won't furnish enough determinate content to make the uniqueness clause we added at FM3 come out true. So what Jackson proposes is that, instead of taking the input to this analytic procedure to be folk morality in its current state, we should take it to be what he calls “mature folk morality” where by “mature folk morality” is meant what folk morality will have evolved into when critical reflection has done all it can to sharpen it up.
We can then see how it may be possible to offer definitions in descriptive terms of moral concepts as picking out the properties that occupy the various roles in the network of such roles specified by a suitable ramsification of mature folk morality. And the properties that occupy these roles will be descriptive properties, Jackson believes, in the light of the argument aired above.
Smith has suggested that this kind of network analysis of moral concepts is liable to a permutation problem (Smith 1994, 54–56). To see what this means consider this:
PERMUTED-FM1: Right actions ought not to be discouraged and shunned. Wrong actions ought not to be promoted and encouraged. Vicious people are disposed to perform wrong actions and not to perform right actions. Virtuous people are disposed to perform right actions and not to perform wrong actions. Wrong actions are wrong because they have certain natural properties on which wrongness supervenes. Similarly for right actions.
From PERMUTED-FM1 we can derive the following Ramsey sentence.
PERMUTED-FM3. There exists a property w and a property r and a property v1 and a property v2 and a relation o such that: actions with w stand in o to being discouraged and shunned; actions with property r stand in o to being promoted and encouraged; people with v1 are disposed to perform actions with r and not to perform actions with w; people with v2 are disposed to perform actions with w and not to perform actions with r; actions with r have r because they have certain natural properties on which r supervenes; similarly for actions with w.
Whoops. Isn't that awfully similar to FM3? So, thus far, the structure gives us no reason why “r”, say, should pick out rightnessness and not wrongness. Certain symmetries seem to exist in the structure of our moral concepts such that we can permute the place of the concepts in the structure in ways that allow for fatal underdetermination. If we seek to define “right” as what plays the “r” role in this structure, the structure we have so far is inadequate to determine that rightness does this. Indeed it is consistent with its being wrongness that does this. For PERMUTED-FM1 is no less plausibly platitudinous than FM1 itself.
The structure so far of PERMUTED-FM1 is indeed inadequate for this. However it is hard to see how the symmetry could fail to break down as we add more platitudes (filling in the “blahdeblah” part our permutations omitted). Take the plausibly platitudinous:
Virtuous people characteristically like to be surrounded by other virtuous people. So they hope and desire that as many as possible of their family, friends, neighbours and fellow citizens are as virtuous as possible.
Permuting as before yields:
Vicious people characteristically like to be surrounded by other vicious people. So they hope and desire that as many as possible of their family, friends, neighbours and fellow citizens are as vicious as possible.
That of course is no platitude. Vicious people, unless they are also very stupid, do not want to live among vicious people. They want to live among virtuous people upon whom they can free ride by exploiting their goodness.
Certainly Jackson's view as expounded in his 1998 does not appear vulnerable to a permutation problem of this sort. The platitudes over which Jackson's version ramsifies include such substantive moral claims as that it is wrong to betray friendship (Jackson 1998, 132). Which of course permutes to the clearly ineligible: it is right to betray friendship.
Stephen Yablo raises a more worrying difficulty (Yablo 2000). Jackson seeks to describe a reductive analysis of ethical terms that understands them as picking out the properties that play a certain role in the conceptual network determined by mature folk morality. The trouble is that this looks unpromising as a reductive analysis as there is a term in it that appears decidedly evaluative in character, “mature”. “Mature” after all had better not just apply to any old terminal point our ethical development may happen to take us but only a terminus we could arrive at by good reasonable ethical discussion and argument. One possible answer in the spirit of the wider theory might be to say that “mature” picks out whatever plays the “mature” role in mature folk morality. But that seems circular. After all maturity in current folk morality is plausibly pretty contested. There are many ways morality could develop to a more settled state and we are liable to differ about which of them we count as maturation and which we would describe less favourably. So if I say mature folk morality is mature by the descriptive standard specified by the best candidates for mature folk morality a central question seems to be getting begged. Or, as we might say, echoing Moore, left open. 
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Aristotle, General Topics: ethics | cognitivism vs. non-cognitivism, moral | constructivism: in political philosophy | functionalism | Hume, David: moral philosophy | Moore, George Edward | moral epistemology | moral motivation | moral non-naturalism | moral realism | moral relativism | moral skepticism | naturalism | naturalism: in legal philosophy | supervenience