Notes to Naturalism

1. It should be noted that philosophers concerned with religion tend to be less enthusiastic about “naturalism”. See the essays in Craig and Moreland 2000.

2. Philosophers who understand “naturalism” in a generous sense include John McDowell (1996), David Chalmers (1996), and Jennifer Hornsby (1997).

3. For the purposes of what follows, we shall understand “physical” negatively, as referring to entities that are found outside the mental and other special realms, as well as within. On this understanding, to adopt a physicalist view of the mental, say, is simply to hold that mental entities are metaphysically constituted by items that can also be found in stones, rivers and other non-special things (Montero and Papineau 2005). While other definitions of “physical” are possible, nothing much hangs on the choice of a definition; as long as there is empirical reason to accept the completeness of “physics”, however “physics” is defined, the arguments for and against “physicalism” will be work the same way (Spurrett and Papineau 1999). One virtue of the negative definition adopted here is that it makes it clear that we are not looking to science to define “physical”, and so that we avoid “Hempel’s Dilemma” that neither current nor ideal science seems well-suited to this definitional job (Hempel 1969). From the perspective we have adopted, the role of science is to tell us whether or not the “physical” realm is complete, not to define “physical”.

4. “The flood of projects over the last two decades that attempt to fit mental causation or mental ontology into a ‘naturalistic picture of the world’ strike me as having more in common with political or religious ideology than with a philosophy that maintains perspective on the difference between what is known and what is speculated. Materialism is not established, or even deeply supported, by science” (Burge 1993a).

5. According to the historian F.M. Turner (1974) “the contemporary significance of this law [conservation of energy] was immense and probably more destructive to a supernatural interpretation of nature than was evolution by natural selection”. We would like to thank Daan Wegener for information about this issue.

6. For considerations in favour of viewing the relata of causation in this way in the context of the mental causation debate, see Honderich (1982), Robb and Heil (2014: Section 5), Yalowitz (2015: Section 6).

7. There may also be room for physicalists to query whether the above examples of “downwards” causation are really cases of physical effects without physical causes. A generic cause is not necessarily a physically irreducible cause. The temperature in a gas is generic relative to specific particle movements, but still type identifiable with mean kinetic energy. Similarly, a desire might be generic relative to specific neuronal arrangements, yet still reducible to some generic brain state. This suggests that the real significance of the proportionality approach may not be to allow non-reduced special causes, but rather to show that physically generic special causes need not always be eclipsed by their more specific physical realizers (see Papineau 2013).

8. Leibniz’s “pre-established harmony” similarly evades the causal closure argument for physicalism by denying that mental states have physical effects. But where standard “epiphenomenalism” at least allows that conscious states are caused by brain states, Leibniz held that the physical and conscious realms are causally quite independent.

9. The 2013 PhilPapers survey “What do Philosophers Believe?” found that 56.5% of the philosophers surveyed “accept or lean towards” physicalism about the mind, as against 27.1% who “accept or lean towards” non-physicalism, and 16.4% who are “others” (

10. It is striking that scarcely any philosophers who deny a physicalist view of consciousness are prepared to reject the causal closure of the physical and embrace interactive dualism. But see Lowe (2000, 2003).

11. On similar grounds, general principles of theory choice would also seem to count against both pre-established harmony and the sometimes-defended “overdeterminationist” view (Mellor 1995) that the physical effects of mental states are always strongly overdetermined by both a sui generis mental cause and a physical cause.

12. True, some seventeenth-century critics argued that Descartes’ radical separation of mind and matter precluded any possibility of causal interaction. But this objection hinged on specific assumption about the nature of causation, and as a result seems not to have been of lasting historical significance.

13. Note how an analogous difficulty can be pressed against the epiphenomenalist view of conscious states: how can a supposedly non-natural realm of conscious facts make any difference to what we say and do in the physical world? (see Chalmers 1996: Chapter 5).

14. It might seem confusing that this Putnamian view is here classified as “non-naturalist”. What could be more naturalist than the view that mathematics is warranted because of its role in scientific theories? But recall the distinction between methodological and ontological naturalism. Putnam’s view is certainly methodologically naturalist, but ontologically he is committed to facts that are non-natural in the sense that they transcend the spatiotemporal realm.

15. None of these influential articles about philosophical intuitions so much as mentions the analytic-synthetic distinction: Weinberg, Nichols and Stich 2001; Goldman 2007; Nagel 2007; nor does Pust 2014.

16. This gives us a sense in which non-logical analyticities are “made true” by the meanings of their non-logical terms—they reduce to logic because of those meanings—and moreover in which they can be known to be true via a “grasp of those meanings”—at least to the extent that this grasp can show that they are equivalent to logical truths. However, while logic comes out as trivially analytic by our definition, this does not imply that logical truths are in any sense “made true” by the meanings of their logical terms, nor that they can be known to be true via a grasp of such meanings. This entry will take logical knowledge as given, but take no view on its explanation.

17. Moreover, Jackson argues that any identification of a folk kind with a fundamental kind must involve a demonstration that the fundamental kind fills the relevant folk conceptual role (this assumption is crucial to the currently popular “two-dimensional” argument for mind-body dualism, as in Jackson 1993; Chalmers 1996). However, some of Jackson’s arguments for this claim are puzzling. He says that we could only have found out that temperature = mean kinetic energy, say, via a demonstration that mean kinetic energy plays the same causal role as temperature (Jackson 2003: 254–5). That is plausible enough. But there is no obvious reason why our knowledge of this causal role should come from analysis of the folk concept of temperature. The derivation would work just as well if this were inductive knowledge derived from a posteriori observation of temperatures.

18. “\(\exists!\Phi(T(\Phi))\)” abbreviates “\(\exists\Phi(T(\Phi) \mathop\& \forall\Psi(T(\Psi) \rightarrow (\Psi = \Phi)))\)”.

19. Of course the aural or visual perception of sentences is likely to play some role in the individual acquisition of cultural knowledge. But it is arguable that this role should be viewed as causal rather than justificatory, and thus as consistent with the a priori status of the knowledge (see Burge 1993b).

20. There might seem to be an obvious difference between the scientific and philosophical thought experiments, indeed one that argues that the latter trade in the analytic structure of concepts. Galileo’s intuition may have been correct, but it was still clearly answerable to direct observational tests which might in principle have falsified it: will a body indeed still fall at the same speed when it is tied to another? But there seems nothing similar in philosophical cases like Gettier thought experiments: we already know what we will judge when we meet any actual true justified believers whose beliefs are true by luck—the thought experiment itself shows us that we will judge that they aren’t knowers. This apparent unfalsifiability of the philosophical intuition might seem to show that it isn’t synthetic but analytic. However this is not conclusive. An alternative diagnosis of the apparent unfalsifiability would be that everyday methods offer no alternative direct route to judgements of knowledge save that behind the original intuition; this is consistent with the intuition being synthetic and so subject to independent theoretical assessment (see Papineau 2014: section V).

Copyright © 2015 by
David Papineau <>

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