Notes to Newton's Philosophy

1. Whewell was responding to Samuel Taylor Coleridge's plea that the members of the British Association stop calling themselves “natural philosophers,” for the scope of their research had narrowed considerably in recent years. For details, see Snyder 2011: 1–7. The first time that “scientist” was used in print was a year later, when Whewell—in an anonymous review—discussed the outcome of the British Association meeting in his review of Mary Somerville's book, On the Connexion of the Physical Sciences—Whewell 1834: 59. The word ‘science,’ which derives from the Latin term ‘scientia’ (meaning, roughly, knowledge), has been in continuous use in numerous contexts since the fourteenth century, but it did not obtain its modern meaning until the mid-to-late nineteenth century. Thus the new meaning of ‘science,’ referring to the natural sciences specifically, arose roughly at the time that the word ‘scientist’ was coined (the Oxford English Dictionary has the new meaning of ‘science’ first appearing in 1867).

2. Two recent studies of the discipline of natural philosophy are French and Cunningham 1996 and Grant 2007. For an influential interpretation of Newton's work in natural philosophy, see Stein 2002; see also Domski 2010, Ducheyne 2012, and Janiak 2008.

3. This approach to understanding Newton's work remains controversial among both philosophers and historians of science: for instance, see the strong criticisms of the approach in Cohen and Smith 2002: 1–4, 19, and see also Rutherford's remarks (2006: 12–14).

4. For recent accounts, see Domski 2012, which contains details of Newton's connections to figures such as Descartes, Spinoza, Wolff and Kant. For a broader perspective on Newton's influence on the eighteenth century, see Snobelen 2009. Cohen 1956 provides a classic account of the fate of the Newtonian method in America, focusing on Benjamin Franklin's work on electricity.

5. Surprisingly, Kant declared that Rousseau was “the Newton of the mind”—for discussion, see Neiman 1997.

6. A proposition expressing a matter of fact cannot be known to be true without appeal to experience because, unlike in the case of “relations of ideas,” the negation of the proposition is not contradictory. For discussion of Hume's relation to Newton, with citations to the voluminous literature on that topic, see De Pierris 2012, and cf. Schliesser 2007, for a different approach.

7. Newton would have been familiar with the discussion of substances in Descartes, Principles of Philosophy, part I: §§51–53, and with the discussion in the second replies (AT VII: 161) Newton owned the 1656 Elzevier (Amsterdam) volume Renati Des-Cartes Opera Philosophica Editio Tertia , which contained the Meditations and all the objections and replies.

8. See Hooke to Oldenburg, 15 Feb. 1671/2, Newton 1959–, vol. 1: 113. In recounting Newton's theory, Hooke does mention the points about refrangibility and heterogeneity, but he thinks that Newton's “first proposition” is “that light is a body” and that differently colored rays of light are in fact “several sorts of bodies.” I take this to represent Hooke's interpretation of how Newton can account for the data with the theory that light consists of particles. As Newton knew, Hooke had already articulated his own theory of colors and of light's nature as a wave in Observations IX and X in his Micrographia (Hooke 1665).

9. See Huygens 1888–1950, vol. 10: 602. Ignatius Pardies, another of Newton's interlocutors, similarly found it difficult to differentiate the claim about the corporeal nature of light from Newton's ideas concerning refrangibility and heterogeneity. See his two letters to the Royal Society concerning Newton's work, both of which are reprinted in Newton 1978; cf. the discussion of Pardies in Sabra 1981: 264–7. Like Newton, Pardies was especially interested in the Cartesian theory of motion—see Pardies 1670, which Newton had in his personal library (Harrison 1978: 210)—and this may have influenced his views in optics.

10. In his library, Newton had a 1656 Amsterdam edition of Descartes' Principles, along with a 1664 London edition of the Meditations (Harrison 1978). On Newton's relation to Descartes and to Cartesianism, see the classic treatment in the chapter “Newton and Descartes” in Koyré 1965, and cf. Stein 2002.

11. The text first appeared, in a transcription of the original Latin and an English translation, in Newton 1962, edited by the Halls. In the Halls' judgment, the text is juvenile and probably originates in the period from 1664 to 1668. In an influential interpretation, Betty Jo Teeter Dobbs contends, in contrast, that the work is mature and was written in late 1684 or early 1685, while Newton was preparing the first edition of the Principia—see Dobbs 1991: 141–6, where she also reviews various alternative opinions on the matter. In a recent essay, Ruffner (2012) raises important doubts concerning earlier interpretations, concluding that the text must have been written before Halley's famous visit to Newton in 1684.

12. Stein presents this interpretation of Newton's Principia in his classic essay, Stein 1970, which was originally a lecture given in 1967.

13. For details of More's views, see the classic paper Gabbey 1982; for details on the Cartesian context, see the discussion in Reid 2008; and, for further discussion of the Descartes-More correspondence and its possible influence on Newton, see Janiak 2010.

14. This may mean that for Newton, two substances can be co-located: for discussion, see two recent papers by Hylarie Kochiras: Kochiras 2009 and 2011.

15. In the Scholium, he notes explicitly that absolute space is not perceptible (Newton 1999: 414), and in corollary five to the laws of motion (Newton 1999: 423), he indicates that a system of bodies—for instance, on a ship's deck—will have the same motions among themselves whether the whole system is moving uniformly or is at rest. Hence he was perfectly aware that true motion is difficult to detect if it is absolute motion.

16. Even in Newton's home university, Cambridge, and alma mater, Trinity College, his works and ideas did not displace those of the Cartesians within the standard curriculum until roughly 1700; indeed, Cartesianism was so popular that the Vice-Chancellor of Cambridge University, Edmund Boldero, decreed in November 1688 that undergraduates could no longer base their disputations on Descartes, but had to use Aristotle instead—see Gascoigne 1985: 54–5 and 143–45.

17. Although astronomers for centuries had thought that the planetary orbits must be circular, for various important reasons, in the early seventeenth century Kepler had argued that they are in fact elliptical (although this is consistent with the idea, which became important in later contexts, that the orbits are nearly circular). This innovation proved to be crucial for later work in celestial mechanics. Ellipses are figures in which a straight line from the center to any arbitrary point on the surface does not describe a single radius that is equal in length to all other radii.

18. See the “Lectiones opticae” of 1670 in Newton 1984, vol. 1: 86–7.

19. We owe this translation of the phrase to Alexandre Koyré, who first noted that Newton uses the word “feign” in a parallel discussion in English in 1957: 229 and 299 n. 12.

20. For an influential discussion of the development in Newton's conception of hypotheses over time, see Cohen 1966; see also the discussion in Ducheyne 2012: 58ff.

21. See the Tentamen in Leibniz 1849, vol. 6: 149, and also Bertoloni Meli 1993: 128–9.

22. Despite its importance, scholars still struggle with the proper characterization of the mechanical philosophy—see Garber and Roux (2012) for a recent series of papers on this topic. McGuire's classic paper (1972) indicates the complexities in mechanist thinking in the seventeenth century. As for Newton, some deny that he accepted the mechanical philosophy (Janiak 2008), but others argue that if properly characterized, Newton should be understood as a mechanist (Machamer, McGuire, & Kochiras 2012).

23. This is a potentially confusing way of referring to the mass—specifically, what we would call the inertial mass—of a body. See Definition Three in the Principia (Newton 1999: 404–5).

24. By his “readers” here, Newton apparently means the readers of the Principia, which had been published six years earlier, rather than Bentley, who would have been the “reader” of this letter.

25. One of the most influential accounts is in Henry 1994. In recent years there has been a robust debate about the correspondence with Bentley in particular, and about Newton's attitude toward action at a distance in general, with many interpreters criticizing the account in Janiak 2008, according to which Newton rejects the possibility of action at a distance in very strong terms. See, e.g., Ducheyne 2011, Henry 2011, and Schliesser 2011. Cf. Janiak's reply to their criticisms in 2013, and Henry's retort in 2014 forthcoming.

26. This view has been a central aspect of twentieth-century scholarship on Kant, and seems to be a common theme across various interpretive traditions. For instance, despite their obvious philosophical and fundamental political differences (Friedman 2000), both Cassirer and Heidegger highlight Newton's influence on Kant's critical philosophy in particular (Cassirer 1911: vol. 2: 600 and Heidegger 1962: 52–63, 65–6, 68–71).

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