Notes to Nominalism in Metaphysics

1. There is a third conception of Nominalism, championed by Nelson Goodman, on which it is the doctrine that there is ‘no distinction of entities without distinction of content’, which comes to be the idea that no two distinct entities can be broken down into exactly the same atoms (1972, 159–60). This is different from the two senses of Nominalism distinguished in the main text, since it does not reject universals or abstract objects per se. Clearly some abstract objects and universals must be rejected by Goodmanian Nominalism: sets or classes, structured propositions, structural universals; but the problem with these is not that they are abstract or universal but that they violate Goodman's principle that no two distinct entities can be composed of the same atoms. Though the motivation for Goodman's Nominalism is one of the motivations for the other two kinds of Nominalism distinguished above, namely the ‘aversion to unwonted multiplication of entities’ (Goodman 1972, 159), Goodman's Nominalism is very different from the other two kinds of Nominalism since rather than rejecting a kind of entity what it rejects is a ‘means of construction’ (Goodman 1986, 160) or composition. Why does Goodman call it ‘Nominalism’? He sometimes states his view as the view that the world is a world of individuals (1972, 155) and this sounds nominalist in the sense of rejecting universals. However, for Goodman an individual is simply the value of a variable of the lowest type in a certain system and so a universal could count as an individual for him. Since Goodman´s conception of Nominalism is not widespread I shall not discuss it in this entry.

2. Thus so-called Trope Theory counts as a kind of Nominalism. In Rodriguez-Pereyra 2002 the word ‘Nominalism’ is given a sense according to which it means the rejection of universals and tropes (2002, 3). Although the word is sometimes used in that more restricted sense, it is more correct and more in line with older tradition to use ‘Nominalism’ (in one of its senses) to mean rejection of universals.

3. Lowe's view is not that this is the only proper characterisation of abstract objects, but simply that this is one of them.

4. This is true, for instance, of the Nominalism of Goodman and Quine in their joint 1947 paper, at least as far as non-spatiotemporality is concerned (Goodman and Quine 1947, 105).

5. The main sceptic about such a distinction was F. P. Ramsey (1925).

6. The way I have drawn the distinction between particulars and universals is by no means unproblematic. Firstly, there are problems with the instantiation relation. It is not clear whether it is indeed prior to the distinction between particulars and universals or even exactly what it consists in. Secondly, the distinction entails that although roundness and squareness are universals, (round and square)-ness is not, since given that nothing can be round and square, (round and square)-ness can have no instances. But, if roundness and squareness are universals and (round and square)-ness exists, it is plausible that (round and square)-ness is a universal. Thirdly, the distinction entails that properties that can have only one instance, like the property of being the tallest man ever, count as particulars, but it is not clear that, if there are universals, this property should not be classified as a universal. I do not mean to suggest that these problems are not solvable, nor do I mean to suggest that they are.

7. Another option, exemplified in Armstrong (1997, 118–19), is to accept that a relation of instantiation must be postulated, but to argue that only one is needed, because all the steps of the regress supervene upon the first and supervenience brings no ontological addition. The idea that supervenience brings no ontological addition is controversial.

8. Although close to it, this need not amount to the same as Goodman's principle that no two entities can be broken down into the same entities, for it can be held, as in Lewis 1986b, that composition is the combining of many things into one, and that sets are sums of singletons. In that case the principle that no two things can be composed by exactly the same parts does not rule out singleton sets, since the singleton is not generated through the combining of many things. But Goodman's principle is supposed to rule out singleton sets.

9. Campbell calls tropes ‘abstract’ because he takes as abstract those entities that do not ordinarily exist apart from other instances of qualities, not because he thinks of them as non-spatiotemporal (Campbell 1990, 2–3).

10. Alternatively one might say that properties are predicates or that properties are concepts. But these views seem to have very little appeal, and are subject to the same difficulties as Predicate Nominalism and Concept Nominalism as presented in the main text of this entry.

11. Except for ‘Trope Theory’, all the names of the other nominalist theories in this subsection derive from Armstrong 1978, vol. I, 12–16.

12. By the aggregate of scarlet things it is meant the aggregate of wholly scarlet things. The wholly scarlet parts of partially scarlet things count as wholly scarlet things.

13. No distinction between classes and sets is intended in this entry.

14. In the case of n-place relations, the theory identifies them with classes of ordered n-tuples.

15. It is assumed here that particulars are world-bound, i.e. that none are parts of more than one world, as is the case in Lewis' theory.

16. This does not mean that necessarily every one who believes that sets of spatiotemporally located members are spatiotemporally located is committed to the idea that such sets are concrete, for they might draw the abstract/concrete distinction in a different way than I have done here. But it does mean that they take sets of spatiotemporally located members to be concrete in the sense of this entry.

17. Why ‘particulars and/or properties and/or relations’? Because propositions may have only properties or relations as constituents. An example might be the proposition that scarlet resembles vermillion. But properties and relations, as we saw in a previous section, may be reducible to particulars, in which case every proposition must have particulars as constituents.

18. Note that Quine thought that the relativity of eternal sentences to languages turned them problematic in a way similar to propositions, for Quine thought that the notion of language has no clear and intelligible conditions of identity, and this is what he found problematic about propositions (Quine 1969, 142).

19. As presented in Balaguer 1998, semantic fictionalism is inspired by and similar, but not exactly analogous, to the kind of fictionalism defended by Hartry Field in the Philosophy of Mathematics (1980). In particular, unlike Field's mathematical fitcionalism, Balaguer's semantic fictionalism does not require that reference to abstract objects is dispensable (1998, 811). Balaguer does not assert that semantic fictionalism is true (1998, 810).

20. But sometimes the word ‘Nominalism’ is used in connection to a stance with respect to possible worlds, e.g. in Loux 1998, 176. But Loux uses it in a sense different from the one adopted in this entry. For Loux the ‘possible worlds nominalist’ must believe that other worlds exist and contain only concrete particulars and that by means of such possible worlds and the concrete particulars that populate them is possible to carry out the nominalistic project of providing a reductive account of talk about properties, propositions, and the like (1998, 176). The nominalist about possible worlds, as I shall understand the position here, is committed neither to the claim that such reductive account is possible nor to the claim that possible worlds exist.

21. Note that sometimes Plantinga doesn't use a biconditional but instead says only that a states of affairs S includes (precludes) a states of affairs S* if … (1974: 45, 2003a: 107). But it is quite clear that he is providing definitions (1974: 44), which is why the biconditional is more appropriate, and indeed he uses the biconditional in his 2003b: 194 when introducing the notion of inclusion.

22. Stalnaker takes possible worlds to be properties. But are his possible worlds universals? If it is essential of universals that they can have more than one instance then Stalnaker's possible worlds seem not to be universals, since they can have only one instance.

23. As it is clear from his 1986b, Forrest takes these uninstantiated properties to be universals.

24. Note that here every subset of a world is a world itself, something that does not happen in Adams' account, since on his account the sets of propositions that constitute possible worlds are maximal.

25. Lewis explored four different ways of drawing the abstract/concrete distinction (the Way of Example, the Way of Conflation, the Negative Way, and the Way of Abstraction) and the consequences that these ways had with respect to the concreteness of possible worlds as he took them to be. He concluded that, ‘by and large, and with some doubts in connection with the Way of Example and the Negative Way’, he should say of worlds as he took them to be that they are concrete (1986a, 86).

26. Rodriguez-Pereyra 2004 proposes an alternative modal realist conception of possible worlds as sums or collections of, among other things, pure sets. If this is what possible worlds are it seems that they are not concrete, or at least not purely concrete.

27. These are first order atomic states of affairs. Higher order states of affairs can bring together more than one universal. Armstrong admits higher order states of affairs.

28. But there is an exception to Armstrong's combinatorialism. Strictly speaking not all the possible states of affairs are combinations of the elements of the actual world. Some of them involve alien particulars, that is particulars that do not exist in the actual world (1989, 58). Armstrong rejects, though, alien universals (1989, 55). Thus no possible state of affairs can involve universals not present in the actual world.

29. With a couple of further conditions: that the conjunction in question be a totality of atomic states of affairs and that for every particular figuring in a conjunction of states of affairs that is a possible world there must be at least one state of affairs in that conjunction in which the particular is combined with a monadic universal. See Armstrong (1989, 47–8).

30. That the prefix is called a ‘story prefix’ does not mean that what is mentioned within the prefix must be a work of fiction: it can be any representation whatsoever, whether true or false (Rosen 1990, 331). So it can be a philosophical theory postulating the existence of possible worlds.

31. Clearly modal fictionalism is an option not only for those who believe that possible worlds do not exist, but also for those who simply do not believe that they exist.

32. But the modal fictionalist need not be a nominalist about abstract objects in general, in which case he need not worry about whether theories are abstract or concrete.

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Gonzalo Rodriguez-Pereyra <>

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