Operationalism

First published Thu Jul 16, 2009

Operationalism is based on the intuition that we do not know the meaning of a concept unless we have a method of measurement for it. It is commonly considered a theory of meaning which states that “we mean by any concept nothing more than a set of operations; the concept is synonymous with the corresponding set of operations” (Bridgman 1927, 5). That drastic statement was made in The Logic of Modern Physics, published in 1927 by the American physicist P. W. Bridgman. The operationalist point of view, first expounded at length in that book, initially found many advocates among practicing physicists and those inspired by the tradition of American pragmatism or the new philosophy of logical positivism. It is highly doubtful that Bridgman intended to advance a precise and universal theory of meaning, or any systematic philosophical theory at all. His writings were primarily “reflections of a physicist”[1] rooted in experimental practice and aimed at articulating the scientific method from a first-person point of view. However, as Bridgman's ideas gained currency they were shaped into a general philosophical doctrine of “operationalism” or “operationism”, and in that form became very influential in many areas, especially in methodological debates in psychology. Both in philosophy and in psychology operationalism is nowadays commonly regarded as an extreme and outmoded position, but that is not to say that the potential of Bridgman's original ideas has been exhausted.

This article has three sections, each of which serves a different aim. Section 1 introduces Bridgman's key ideas on operational analysis, explaining their motivations and tracing the course of their development. Section 2 summarizes various critiques of operationalism, which eventually led to a general philosophical consensus against it. Section 3 gives a view on the remaining potential of Bridgman's ideas on operational analysis for philosophy of science today.


1. Bridgman's ideas on operational analysis

1.1 Background and motivation

Percy Williams Bridgman (1882–1961) was a physicist at Harvard University whose pioneering work in the physics of high pressures was rewarded with a Nobel Prize in 1946.[2] His chief scientific contribution was made possible by technical prowess: in his laboratory Bridgman created pressures nearly 100 times higher than anyone else had achieved before him, and investigated the novel behavior of various materials under such high pressures. But Bridgman was placed in a predicament by his own achievements: at such extreme pressures, all previously known pressure gauges broke down; how was he even to know what levels of pressure he had in fact reached? (see Kemble, Birch and Holton 1970) As he kept breaking his own pressure records, Bridgman had to establish a succession of new measures fit for higher and higher pressures. Therefore it is no surprise that he thought seriously about the groundlessness of concepts where no methods were available for their measurement.

Another important stimulus to his philosophical thinking was his encounter with the revolutionary new physics of the early 20th century. Bridgman's concerns about the definition and meaning of scientific concepts were forged in the general climate of shock suffered by physicists at that time from a barrage of phenomena and theoretical ideas that were entirely alien to everyday expectations, culminating with quantum mechanics and its “Copenhagen” interpretation. In a popular article, Bridgman wrote: “if we sufficiently extend our range we shall find that nature is intrinsically and in its elements neither understandable nor subject to law” (1929, 444).

Especially important for Bridgman's thinking was Albert Einstein's special theory of relativity. Bridgman credited an unexpected teaching assignment in 1914 for his first real encounter with special relativity, which gave him considerable distress as he tried to clarify the confusing conceptual situation surrounding the theory (Bridgman in Frank 1956, 76). At the heart of special relativity was Einstein's recognition that judging the simultaneity of two events separated in space required a different operation from that required for judging the simultaneity of two events happening at the same place. Fixing the latter operation was not sufficient to fix the former, so a further convention was necessary, which Einstein supplied in the form of his operation of sending light beams from each of the events in question to the midpoint between their locations, to see if they arrive there at the same time. How superior this way of thinking was, compared to Isaac Newton's declaration that he would “not define Time, Space, Place or Motion, as being well known to all” (quoted in Bridgman 1927, 4)! Bridgman felt that all physicists, including himself, had been guilty of unthinking extensions of concepts, especially on the theoretical side of physics.

Bridgman's sentiment arising out of these reflections, however, was not the familiar one of happy celebration of Einstein's genius. He rather regretted the sorry state of physics which had necessitated Einstein's revolution. Einstein showed what dangerous traps we could fall into by stepping into new domains with old concepts in an unreflective way. Anyone thinking in operational terms would have recognized from the start that the meaning of “distant simultaneity” was not fixed unless an operation for judging it was specified (Bridgman 1927, 10–16). In Bridgman's view, Einstein's revolution would never have been necessary, if classical physicists had paid operational attention to what they were doing. He thought that any future toppling of unsound structures would become unnecessary if the operational way of thinking could quietly prevent such unsound structures in the first place. Operational awareness was required if physics was not to be caught off-guard again as it had been in 1905: “We must remain aware of these joints in our conceptual structure if we hope to render unnecessary the services of the unborn Einsteins” (Bridgman 1927, 24).

Bridgman's impulse was to specify every possible detail of his operations, because any detail could make an important difference. Note the following passage, inspired by the shock of learning from the special theory of relativity that the measured length of an object was not independent of its velocity:

Now suppose we have to measure a moving street car. The simplest, and what we may call the “naïve” procedure, is to board the car with our meter stick and repeat the operations we would apply to a stationary body. Notice that this procedure reduces to that already adopted in the limiting case when the velocity of the street car vanishes. But here there may be new questions of detail. How shall we jump on to the car with our stick in hand? Shall we run and jump on from behind, or shall we let it pick us up in front? Or perhaps does now the material of which the stick is composed make a difference, although previously it did not? All these questions must be answered by experiment. (Bridgman 1927, 11; emphasis added)

1.2 Length as the showcase of operational analysis

Bridgman found that the challenges of the unknown were amply present even in very prosaic circumstances. Therefore he chose to open his discussion of operational analysis in The Logic of Modern Physics (Bridgman 1927) with the example of the most mundane of all scientific concepts: length. He was both fascinated and troubled by the fact that “essential physical limitations” forced scientists to use different measurement operations for the same concept in different domains of phenomena. Length is measured with a ruler only when we are dealing with dimensions that are comparable to our human bodies, and when the objects of measurement are moving slowly relative to the measurer. To measure, say, the distance to the moon, we need to infer it from the amount of time that light takes to travel that distance and return, and that is also the procedure taken up in Einstein's theorizing in special relativity; “the space of astronomy is not a physical space of meter sticks, but is a space of light waves” (Bridgman 1927, 67). For even larger distances we use the unit of “light-year,” but we cannot actually use the operation of sending off a light beam to a distant speck of light in the sky and waiting for years on end until hopefully a reflected signal comes back to us (or our descendants). Much more complex reasoning and operations are required for measuring any distances beyond the solar system:

Thus at greater and greater distances not only does experimental accuracy become less, but the very nature of the operations by which length is to be determined becomes indefinite…. To say that a certain star is 105 light years distant is actually and conceptually an entire different kind of thing from saying that a certain goal post is 100 meters distant. (Bridgman 1927, 17–18; emphasis original)

Thus operational analysis reveals that length is not one homogeneous concept that applies in the whole range in which we use it:

In principle the operations by which length is measured should be uniquely specified. If we have more than one set of operations, we have more than one concept, and strictly there should be a separate name to correspond to each different set of operations. (Bridgman 1927, 10; emphases original)

In practice scientists did not recognize multiple concepts of length, and Bridgman was willing to concede that it was allowable to use the same name to represent a series of concepts, if the different measurement operations gave mutually consistent numerical results in the areas of overlap:

If we deal with phenomena outside the domain in which we originally defined our concepts, we may find physical hindrances to performing the operations of the original definition, so that the original operations have to be replaced by others. These new operations are, of course, to be so chosen that they give, within experimental error, the same numerical results in the domain in which the two sets of operations may be both applied. (Bridgman 1927, 23)

However, such numerical convergence between the results of two different operations was regarded by Bridgman as merely a “practical justification for retaining the same name” for what the two operations measured (Bridgman 1927, 16).

Even in such convergent situations, we have to be wary of the danger of slipping into conceptual confusion through the use of the same word to refer to the subjects of different operations. If we do not temper our thoughts with the operationalist conscience always referring us back to concrete measurement operations, we may get into the sloppy habit of using one word for all sorts of different situations (without even checking for the required convergence in the overlapping domains). Bridgman warned: “our verbal machinery has no built-in cutoff” (1959a, 75). Similarly we could be misled by the representation of a concept as a number into thinking that there is naturally an infinitely extendable scale for that concept, since the real-number line continues on to infinity in both directions. It would also be easy to think that physical quantities must meaningfully exist down to infinite precision, just because the numerical scale we have pinned on them is infinitely divisible. Bridgman issued a stark reminder:

Mathematics does not recognize that as the physical range increases, the fundamental concepts become hazy, and eventually cease entirely to have physical meaning, and therefore must be replaced by other concepts which are operationally quite different. For instance, the equations of motion make no distinction between the motion of a star into our galaxy from external space, and the motion of an electron about the nucleus, although physically the meaning in terms of operations of the quantities in the equations is entirely different in the two cases. The structure of our mathematics is such that we are almost forced, whether we want to or not, to talk about the inside of an electron, although physically we cannot assign any meaning to such statements. (Bridgman 1927, 63)

Bridgman thus emphasized that our concepts did not automatically extend beyond the domains in which they were originally defined. He warned that concepts in far-out domains could easily become meaningless for lack of applicable measurement operations. The case of length in the very small scale makes that danger clear. Beyond the resolution of the eye, the ruler has to be given up in favor of various micrometers and microscopes. When we get to the realm of atoms and elementary particles, it is not clear what operations could be used to measure length, and not even clear what “length” means any more.

1.3 Critique of other physical concepts

After introducing operational analysis with that refreshing discussion of the length concept, Bridgman published a long series of critical re-assessments of various fundamental physical concepts. His ruminations on length were extended into general commentary on the nature of space, and the concept of time received a similar treatment. His views on space and time were reminiscent of Henri Poincaré's and Pierre Duhem's: Bridgman noted that clocks had to be used in the empirical determination of the basic laws of physics, but our confidence that a clock ticks regularly was founded in the basic laws of physics governing its mechanism. Suppose we are trying to test the general theory of relativity by measuring the red-shift of light coming out of a heavy body:

If the vibrating atom is a clock, then the light of the sun is shifted toward the infra-red, but how do we know that the atom is a clock (some say yes, others no)? If we find the displacement physically have we thereby proved that general relativity is physically true, or have we proved that the atom is a clock, or have we merely proved that there is a particular kind of connection between the atom and the rest of nature, leaving the possibility open that neither is the atom a clock nor general relativity true? (Bridgman 1927, 72–73)

Bridgman found these reflections liberating as well as troubling. Basic space-time concepts are not uniquely determined a priori. For example, he noted that the definition of velocity shared in classical mechanics and special relativity was not the only one in line with our intuitions of what velocity meant. Consider this alternative: “a traveler in an automobile measures his velocity by observing the clock on his instrument board and the mile stones which he passes on the road.” If we adopt such a procedure we will find that the speed of light is infinite, if special relativity is correct about time dilation: with the car going at the speed of light according to an observer standing on the road, the clock on the car will not advance at all while the car passes any number of milestones. This alternative concept of velocity would have the advantage that “there would be no limit to the velocity which can be imparted to material bodies on giving them unlimited energy”, which seems intuitively “natural and simple”. But assigning an infinite velocity to light is also “most unnatural, particularly if we favor a medium point of view.” So there was a dilemma: “all sorts of phenomena cannot at the same time be treated simply.” (Bridgman 1927, 98–100)

In the latter parts of The Logic of Modern Physics Bridgman gave a fascinating array of discussions on the concepts of force, mass, energy, light, field, and more generally the theories of thermodynamics, relativity, and quantum mechanics. These thoughts were developed further in the remaining decades of his life, and collected in subsequent volumes including The Nature of Physical Theory (1936), The Nature of Thermodynamics (1941), Reflections of a Physicist (1950, second edition 1955), The Nature of Some of Our Physical Concepts (1952), and The Way Things Are (1959a). Bridgman made a searching examination of the familiar concepts of classical physics, checking to see if they retained operational meaning in domains of phenomena that were unfamiliar to the creators of classical physics. In some cases his analysis showed that the classical concepts were operationally unsound even in the contexts in which they were originally created. Later in life he stated that his initial foray into philosophy was motivated by his “disquietude” about physics, especially electrodynamics and thermodynamics, in which “the fundamental understanding of even the acknowledged leaders in physics were inadequate” (Bridgman 1959b, 519). In contrast, he thought that on the whole the contemporary development of quantum theory went in the right direction, especially in Werner Heisenberg's version of it, which discarded classical concepts where they did not apply (e.g., space-time orbits for electrons), and crafted new concepts with clear operational meaning in new domains of phenomena. However, he was not entirely satisfied with Niels Bohr's doctrine that all the operations of physics needed to be explained in the “macroscopic language of daily life or of present-day philosophy”; rather, he thought we needed to develop a “more adequate macroscopic language” (1959b, 526).

Interestingly, Bridgman never stopped thinking about relativity. The operationalist lesson he had taken from Einstein was so dear to him that he did not shrink from criticizing Einstein himself when the latter seemed to betray his own principles in the general theory of relativity. Already in The Logic of Modern Physics he had opined: “I personally question whether the elements of Einstein's formulation, such as curvature of space-time, are closely enough connected with immediate physical experience ever to be accepted as an ultimate in a scheme of explanation, and I very much feel the need for a formulation in more intimate physical terms” (1927, 176). Years later, when Bridgman was invited by P. A. Schilpp to contribute to the Library of Living Philosophers volume on Einstein, he issued the following “indictment” against Einstein: “he has carried into general relativity theory precisely that uncritical, pre-Einsteinian point of view which he has so convincingly shown us, in his special theory, conceals the possibility of disaster” (Bridgman in Schilpp 1949, 354; reprinted in Bridgman 1955, 337). Einstein brushed aside Bridgman's objection, merely stating that for a formal system to qualify as a physical theory it was “not necessary to demand that all of its assertions can be independently interpreted and ‘tested’ ‘operationally’” (Einstein in Schilpp 1949, 679). This exchange is reminiscent of the one that Heisenberg reported, in which Einstein responded with bemused incomprehension to Heisenberg's protest that he was following a lesson from Einstein in treating only directly observable quantities in his matrix mechanics (Heisenberg 1971, 62–69). Bridgman also carried out further operational analysis of special relativity, and his late thoughts on the subject were published posthumously in A Sophisticate's Primer on Relativity (1962).

Bridgman's critique of concepts in physics also led naturally to a philosophical critique of some general conceptions underlying physics, such as simplicity, atomism, causality, determinism, and probability. He also gave critical considerations to mathematics and its application to the physical world. There was no stone Bridgman was willing to leave unturned in his relentless critique. He went as far as to declare: “arithmetic, so far as it purports to deal with actual physical objects, is also affected with the same penumbra of uncertainty as all other empirical science” (Bridgman 1927, 34).

Among physicists Bridgman's reflections found a strong echo, especially in the early days. Perhaps that was natural: it has been said, by Bridgman himself too, that operationalism arose from observing “physicists in action” (Bridgman in Frank 1956, 80). Gerald Holton (1995a, 224) recalls what an “electrifying experience” it was for himself and many other physicists to read The Logic of Modern Physics for the first time. The explanation Holton gives of the “immense power” of Bridgman's work is “not that the work brings to the reader a message never thought of before, but that it lays open, with clarity, what the reader has been trying to formulate on his or her own”.

1.4 Implications outside physics

Bridgman also extended his operationalist thinking by considering its implications outside physics. This was important to him at least from the time of The Logic of Modern Physics, in which he ventured: “many of the questions asked about social and philosophical subjects will be found to be meaningless when examined from the point of operations. It would doubtless conduce greatly to clarity of thought if the operational mode of thinking were adopted in all fields of inquiry as well as in the physical” (30–32). To Bridgman it was clear that “to adopt the operational point of view … means a far-reaching change in all our habits of thought”. He knew that in practice this would be a very difficult thing to do: “Operational thinking will at first prove to be an unsocial virtue; one will find oneself perpetually unable to understand the simplest conversation of one's friends, and will make oneself universally unpopular by demanding the meaning of apparently the simplest terms of every argument”. Perhaps this throwaway remark was a sign of things to come, as Bridgman would in the end find himself rather isolated and plagued by misunderstanding, even among those who found his philosophical ideas worth discussing, as we will see in Section 2.

Bridgman did not develop in detail his operationalist ideas in relation to any other science than physics, apparently content to leave that job to the specialists in the respective fields. Some others did take up Bridgman's call for operationalist reformulations of their fields, with interesting consequences. It could be said that operationalism did not change the practice of physics itself much from what it already was, and the physicists followed him only as far as he asserted what was common sense to them. Matters were different in other sciences that paid attention to Bridgman, and that was most significant and pronounced in the case of psychology.

Behaviorist psychologists took up operationalism (or operationism, as it was more often called in psychology) as a weapon in their fight against more traditional psychologists, especially those who prized introspection as the most important source of psychological knowledge. The Harvard psychologist Edwin Boring (1886–1968) saw Bridgman's philosophy as a modern substitute for positivism, and he seems to have coined the term “operationism” (see Walter 1990, 178). It was Boring's student Stanley Smith Stevens (1906–1973) who was perhaps the most aggressive promoter of operationism in psychology (Hardcastle 1994; Feest 2005). Stevens saw operationism as a sure method of increasing rigor in psychological experiments and discourse, asserting that “to experience is, for the purpose of science, to react discriminately”, since these reactions are what science can measure and record publically (quoted in Feest 2005, 136). Echoing Bridgman's take on Einstein, Stevens declared in 1935: “The revolution that will put an end to the possibility of revolutions is the one that defines a straightforward procedure for the definition and validation of concepts. … Such a procedure is the one which tests the meaning of concepts by appealing to the concrete operations by which the concept is determined. We may call it operationism” (quoted in Walter 1990, 180).

In his concrete research in psychology Stevens focused on psychophysics, starting with his Ph.D. dissertation on the perceived attributes of tones, written under Boring's supervision. Another notable operationist in psychology was Edward Chace Tolman (1886–1959), also a Harvard Ph.D., who taught for most of his life at the University of California at Berkeley. Starting with his research on problem-solving behavior in rats, Tolman gave an operational treatment of desire, for example operationalizing hunger in terms of “time since last feeding”. Tolman did not deny that desire was a subjective feeling, but insisted that doing scientific research on it required experimentally tractable operations that would allow scientists to get a hold on something related to that subjective experience (see Feest 2005, 136–138). In Gustav Bergmann's assessment, operationism helped behaviorism to move from its initial metaphysical Watsonian variety to its modern version (Bergmann in Frank 1956, 53).

Despite the strong popularity of operationist behaviorism in certain quarters, it never commanded a complete consensus even in American psychology. Perhaps the most unexpected opposition came from Bridgman himself. Behaviorists were wanting to use operations to attain objectivity in psychology, which for them meant taking psychological discourse away from attempts to describe private experience. This was just the wrong move in Bridgman's view, as we will see in more detail in Section 2.4 below. Bridgman engaged in some discussion with Stevens but discovered that the latter's enthusiasm for “operational ideas” was really for something that he could not agree with. By 1936 he declared privately: “I have rather washed my hands of him” (quoted in Walter 1990, 184). Bridgman's disagreement with B. F. Skinner (1904–1990) was even more severe, and resulted in a prolonged dispute between the two (Holton 2005; Walter 1990, 188–192). Operationism became a subject of great controversy in psychology, epitomized in a 1945 special issue of the Psychological Review devoted to a symposium on operationism suggested by Boring, who remained supportive of the movement at some critical distance. To some limited extent this debate still continues in psychology (see Feest 2005).

2. Critiques of operationalism

Despite the initial popularity of Bridgman's ideas, by the middle of the 20th century the common reactions among philosophers and philosophically-minded scientists were strongly critical. Operationalism received many high-profile debates, among them a symposium held at the annual meeting of the American Association for the Advancement of Science (AAAS) in 1953 (published in Frank 1956), and the Psychological Review issue mentioned above. On such occasions Bridgman attempted to refine and defend his views, but also found that the debate was moving in directions that both surprised and disturbed him. In his contribution to the AAAS symposium he exclaimed:

There would seem to be no reason why I am better fitted than anyone else to open this discussion. As I listened to the papers I felt that I have only a historical connection with this thing called “operationalism.” In short, I feel that I have created a Frankenstein, which has certainly got away from me. I abhor the word operationalism or operationism, which seems to imply a dogma, or at least a thesis of some kind. The thing I have envisaged is too simple to be dignified by so pretentious a name. (Bridgman in Frank 1956, 75–76)

Still, arguably it was not Bridgman's own ideas about operational analysis but the Frankenstein of operationalism that had a more significant impact in philosophy and science, so this survey of operationalism must deal with how other people responded to operationalism as they saw it. In the course of the discussion I will try to point out some places where there were clear misunderstandings of Bridgman's ideas, and also other places where Bridgman himself was ambivalent or ambiguous, rather than simply misunderstood.

Given the timing and contexts of the publication of Bridgman's ideas, the philosophical debates surrounding them were to a large extent framed in relation to logical positivism, which was just making its big impact on the American philosophical scene. In fact, no less than Herbert Feigl (1902–1988) came to Harvard with the express purpose of learning from Bridgman, despite the latter's warning that he did not have much to teach (Walter 1990, 164–165). Bridgman's insistence on operational meaningfulness had at least a surface resemblance to the logical positivists' verification theory of meaning. Bergmann thought Bridgman had given a “scientist's version” of the latter (Bergmann in Frank 1956, 55), and Carl Hempel regarded operationalism and logical positivism as “closely akin” to each other (Hempel in Frank 1956, 56). And it is not difficult to see how a kindred philosophical doctrine coming from a world-class scientist would have captured the logical positivists' imagination.

When subjected to the scrutiny of professional philosophers, however, Bridgman's ideas were soon exposed as unsystematic and undeveloped, as he freely admitted himself. Moreover, it became evident that his ideas did not help logical positivists solve the key problems that they were struggling with. After the initial fascination, the standard positivist (and post-positivist) reaction to operationalism was disappointment, and operationalism was often seen as a failed philosophy that did not live up to its promises.

2.1 Operational definitions do not exhaust meaning

Nowhere was the positivist disappointment with Bridgman sharper than in considerations of operationalism as a theory of meaning. There was a set of objections which together amounted to a complaint that operational definitions did not give a sufficient account of the meaning of concepts, even where there were operations clearly relevant to the concepts in question.

The core of the problem here is an overly restrictive notion of meaning, which reduces it to measurement; I will call this Bridgman's reductive doctrine of meaning. Although Bridgman was not proposing a general philosophical theory of meaning, he did make remarks that revealed an impulse to do so. Consider the following statement, the last part of which I have already quoted:

We evidently know what we mean by length if we can tell what the length of any and every object is, and for the physicist nothing more is required. To find the length of an object, we have to perform certain physical operations. The concept of length is therefore fixed when the operations by which length is measured are fixed: that is, the concept of length involves as much as and nothing more than the set of operations by which length is determined. In general, we mean by any concept nothing more than a set of operations; the concept is synonymous with the corresponding set of operations. (Bridgman 1927, 5)

Similarly, he also displayed an impulse to use operations to make a criterion of meaningfulness: “If a specific question has meaning, it must be possible to find operations by which an answer may be given to it.” (Bridgman 1927, 28)

One lesson we can take from Bridgman's troubles is that meaning is unruly and promiscuous. The kind of absolute control on the meaning of scientific concepts that Bridgman wished for is not possible. The most control that can be achieved is for the scientific community to agree on an explicit definition and to respect it. But even firm definitions can only constrain the uses of a concept. The entire world can agree to define length by the standard meter in Paris (or by the wavelength of a certain atomic radiation), and that still comes nowhere near exhausting all that we mean by length. Bridgman himself later specifically admitted that his statement that meanings were synonymous with operations was “obviously going too far when taken out of context” (1938, 117). Especially compared with the notion of “meaning as use,” often traced back to the later phase of Ludwig Wittgenstein's work,[3] it is easy to recognize the narrowness of Bridgman's initial ideas. Bridgman's later gloss on his ideas was in fact rather late-Wittgensteinian: “To know the meaning of a term used by me it is evident, I think, that I must know the conditions under which I would use the term” (1938, 116). Since measurement operations provide only one specific context in which a concept is used, operational definitions can only cover one particular aspect of meaning.

Recognizing the restrictiveness of Bridgman's early remarks on meaning gives us a useful framework for understanding one common objection to operationalism. As Donald Gillies (1972, 6–7) emphasizes, if we accept the most extreme kind of operationalism, there is no point in asking whether a measurement method is valid; if the measurement method defines the concept and there is nothing more to the meaning of the concept, the measurement method is automatically valid, as a matter of convention or even tautology. Metrological validity becomes an interesting question only if the concept possesses a broader meaning than the specification of the method of its measurement. Then the measurement method can be said to be valid if it coheres with the other aspects of the concept's meaning. That way we may also make a judgment about whether an operational definition (or any other kind of definition) is an appropriate one, depending on how well it coheres with other elements of the concept's meaning and how beneficially it controls other elements of meaning.

2.2 Operational definitions are not required for all useful concepts

So far I have noted that an operational definition is not sufficient to express a concept's meaning fully. Going further than that, many critics of operationalism have argued that not every good scientific concept needs to have an operational definition. If operationalism means demanding that every concept and every inferential step should have an immediate operational significance, it constitutes an overly restrictive empiricism. At times Bridgman did appear to be making such a demand, as illustrated in the poignant episode (discussed in Section 1.3 above) in which he criticized Einstein for betraying his own operationalist lesson in the general theory of relativity. Einstein's view was that there was no reason for physicists to shrink from using a non-operational concept if that delivered good results.

Einstein was self-consciously opportunistic in his methodological eclecticism, but philosophers wanted to find a more general rationale for freeing scientific theorizing from operationalist micro-management. The crux of the problem here for the operationalist is that theoretical concepts are much too useful in science. Bridgman actually acknowledged from early on that there were good theoretical concepts that were not amenable to direct operationalization, illustrating the point with the example of stress and strain inside a solid body (1927, 53–54), and the wavefunction in quantum mechanics (Bridgman in Frank 1956, 79). Bridgman saw clearly that these theoretical concepts only had indirect connections with physical operations, but he did not see any problems with that. He in fact went so far as to say: “there need be no qualms that the operational point of view will ever place the slightest restriction on the freedom of the theoretical physicist to explore the consequences of any free mental construction” (Bridgman in Frank 1956, 79). All that was required was that the theoretical system touched the operational ground somewhere, eventually. However, in that case Bridgman's message was the same as Einstein's, as the physicist R. B. Lindsay pointed out (Lindsay in Frank 1956, 71–72).

Bridgman's position on the matter of theoretical concepts was complicated, and perhaps not entirely self-consistent (I will return to this point in Section 3.3). One common objection to operationalism is based on a misunderstanding that reveals an essential difference between Bridgman and most of his critics. It is often said that operationalism cannot be right because each scientific concept can be measured in various ways. This criticism is based on the presumption that the concept in question has unity, which means that its definition must also be unified. If there are a variety of measurement methods all of which apply to one concept, then measurement methods cannot be what supplies the unified definition; instead, some theoretical account must be given as to how the variety of operations under consideration serve to measure the same thing. Bridgman, in contrast, had no such presumption of conceptual unity. For him, the initial position to take was that if there are different methods of measurement we have different concepts, as he said about “tactual” and “optical” length being two different concepts. Now, it could be that there is one aspect of reality that different measurement operations all get at, but that is something to be demonstrated, not to be assumed at the outset. The possibility of unity can be entertained if the minimum condition of numerical convergence is met—that is, if two measurement operations have an overlapping range and their results agree in the overlap. Still, Bridgman maintained some skepticism about whether it was safe for us to infer real conceptual unity from such numerical convergence.

Bridgman's ambivalence about conceptual unity elicited a serious worry about the systematic import of scientific concepts and theories, most astutely expressed by Hempel (1966, 91–97). Bridgman's skeptical caution would result in an intolerable fragmentation of science, Hempel argued. It would result in “a proliferation of concepts of length, of temperature, and of all other scientific concepts that would not only be practically unmanageable, but theoretically endless.” Hempel's worry was that Bridgman's quest for safety was blinding him to one of the ultimate aims of science, “namely the attainment of a simple, systematically unified account of empirical phenomena” (Hempel 1966, 94). Along similar lines, Lindsay (1937, 458) had earlier argued that “such an isolation of concepts would defeat the very aim of physical science, which is to provide a simple and economical description” of physical experience “in terms of a minimum number of concepts”. Bridgman had serious doubts about the plausibility of such a simple, unified account of nature, as I will explain further in Section 3.4. But Hempel and others could genuinely envisage it. Hempel noted that with the development of science there was a continually growing and thickening network of “nomic threads” linking various “knot-concepts” with each other as further empirical laws were discovered. Hempel argued that it was essential to keep this thickening conceptual network systematic and simple; to that end, “concept formation and theory formation must go hand in hand” (Hempel 1966, 97). That, in turn, often necessitated “a modification of the operational criteria originally adopted for some of the central concepts” (Hempel 1966, 95). Operationalism would stand in the way of such flexibility.

2.3 What are operations?

Apart from the questions of whether operational definitions are sufficient or necessary, it is actually unclear what types of things operations are, and how they should be specified. The surface-level intuition is simple: the operations that matter are measurement operations involving physical instruments. But from the start Bridgman (1927, 5) also stated that the operations which fixed meaning were mental if the concepts in question were mental (e.g., in mathematics). And he knew that measurement operations involved more than physical manipulations of instruments; at least there are recordings and computations involved in the processing and analysis of data, and there are mental acts linking various parts of that complex procedure, too. To take the simplest example, the operation of counting is a mental operation, but it is an integral part of many “physical” procedures. He called such crucial non-physical operations “paper-and-pencil” operations. Bridgman lamented that it was the “most wide spread misconception with regard to the operational technique” to think that it demanded that all concepts in physics must find their meaning only in terms of physical operations in the laboratory (Bridgman 1938, 122–124; also Bridgman 1959b, 522). Later he gave a rough classification of operations into the instrumental, mental/verbal, and paper-and-pencil varieties (Bridgman 1959a, 3).

This issue becomes sharper when we ask the question of purpose: what are the aims of operational analysis, and which operations are suitable for achieving those aims? Having distinguished various types of operations, Bridgman also had to deal with the question of whether different types had different epistemic values, going beyond his initial intuitive fondness for instrumental operations. For example, if the point of operationalizing a concept was to make its meaning clear and precise, which meant using “operations which can be unequivocally performed” (Bridgman 1938, 119), then why were paper-and-pencil operations such as the construction of Euclidean geometric figures not just as good as instrumental operations? In the end he was willing to dispense with any ultimate privileging of instrumental operations. But he still maintained a preference for them when possible, without giving a convincing reason for that preference (Bridgman 1938, 127).

Thus Bridgman's position on the nature and function of operations was uneasy from start to finish. Various critics rightly zeroed in on this point. The most important point of contention was whether and why physical or instrumental operations had any special epistemic advantage. The Yale physicist Henry Margenau put the point succinctly:

Operationalism is an attitude that emphasizes the need of recourse, wherever feasible, to instrumental procedures when meanings are to be established. Bridgman disavows its status as a philosophy, and wisely so, for as a general view …. it cannot define the meaning of “instrumental procedure” in a manner that saves the view from being either trivial (which would be true if “instrumental” were construed to include symbolic, mental and paper-and-pencil operations) or too restrictive (if all operations are to be laboratory procedures). (Margenau in Frank 1956, 45)

As one can imagine, this dilemma also hampered attempts to use operational analysis in psychology. Operations in psychological research inevitably involved verbal instructions, reports and reactions. It was difficult to argue that these mental or verbal operations were superior in reliability or meaningfulness to the introspective reporting of mental states, which operationists tried so hard to exclude from scientific psychology.

Bridgman himself was troubled by the question regarding the nature of operations and admitted late in his life that he had not really provided “an analysis of what it is that makes an operation suitable”, or “in what terms can operations be specified” (Bridgman in Frank 1956, 77). An even deeper pessimism was expressed in Bridgman's 30-year retrospective on The Logic of Modern Physics, commissioned for Daedalus by Holton: “To me now it seems incomprehensible that I should ever have thought it within my powers … to analyze so thoroughly the functioning of our thinking apparatus that I could confidently expect to exhaust the subject and eliminate the possibility of a bright new idea against which I would be defenseless” (Bridgman 1959b, 520).

2.4 Are operations private or public?

One last issue needs to be mentioned, before I complete the discussion of the critique of operationalism: the privacy of operations. This is perhaps not widely remembered now, but it was the issue on which Bridgman's position elicited the most severe incomprehension and objection, even from many who called themselves operationalists.

The emblematic moment in this dispute came during the 5th International Congress for the Unity of Science in 1939, held at Harvard University—one of the highpoints of the activities of the “Vienna Circle in exile” in America (see Holton 1995b). Bridgman was invited to address this conference, and chose to give a talk entitled “Science: Public or Private?”.[4] At this point it became clear that his enterprise was fundamentally at odds with the logical positivist project, despite the surface kinship:

The process that I want to call scientific is a process that involves the continual apprehension of meaning, the constant appraisal of significance, accompanied by a running act of checking to be sure that I am doing what I want to do, and of judging correctness or incorrectness. This checking and judging and accepting that together constitute understanding are done by me, and can be done for me by no one else. They are as private as my toothache, and without them science is dead. (Bridgman 1955, 56)

Positivists and behaviorists had embraced operationalism for precisely the opposite reason: they thought operations were public, objective and verifiable, unlike private experience. But Bridgman was insistent that operations were a matter for private experience. He could see no warrant in simply taking someone else's testimony as true or reliable, or in regarding the report of an operation performed by someone else as the same kind of thing as an operation performed and experienced by himself. In a later paper called “New Vistas for Intelligence” he declared: “Science is not truly objective unless it recognizes its own subjective or individual aspects” (Bridgman 1955, 556). As Holton puts it (2005, 74), Bridgman's drive in operational analysis was “to throw the spotlight on performable action, above all an action performed by himself. Ultimately, he was a private man, so much so that he was accused of solipsism, to which he scarcely objected.” In his epistemic individualism Bridgman was perhaps only matched by Herbert Dingle among notable 20th-century philosophers of science (see Dingle 1950).

Bridgman's individualistic bent, both in epistemology and social life, was in stark contrast to the logical positivist vision of knowledge and society, particularly the strand of positivism driven by Otto Neurath (1882–1945). The latter's aversion to the private compelled him to express even first-hand observation reports as third-person happenings in space and time, of the following type: “Otto's protocol at 3:17 o'clock: [Otto's speech-thinking at 3:16 o'clock was: (at 3:15 o'clock there was a table in the room perceived by Otto)].” (Neurath [1932–33] 1983, p. 93). Bridgman was unyielding in his opposition to Neurath's type of objectification of personal experience. To him, operations provided the best possible refuge from the ocean of uncertainty always threatening to engulf science, and the relative certainty was only possible if he was learning from his own operations, not from second-hand reports from some other person. In this regard Bridgman was closer to the strand of logical positivism represented by Moritz Schlick (1882–1936), who insisted on maintaining the notion of direct experience as the final arbiter of knowledge. Schlick ([1930] 1979) admitted that experience was fleeting and only provided momentary points of verification rather than any lasting “foundation” one could build knowledge on. Bridgman's operations had more promise in this regard, as the operations were meant to be repeatable so the descriptions of operations and their results would be lasting. However, that was not to be such a straightforward matter, as we will see in Section 3.4.

As Holton (1995a; 2005) reports from his first-hand observations of Bridgman, the privacy of operations (and the consequent privacy of science) was not an idle philosophical doctrine. In the lab he carried out as much of the work as possible with his own hands, using few assistants and crafting most of his instruments himself. Holton (1995a, 222–223) quotes the following report as typical of the way Bridgman worked: “It is easy, if all precautions are observed, to drill a hole … 17 inches long, in from 7 to 8 hours”—that is, a hole as narrow as the lead in a pencil, in a block of very hard steel. In academic life Bridgman (1955, 44) openly lamented the “intellectual fashion … of emphasizing that all our activities are fundamentally social in nature”. As for his social and political writings, they were often agonizing attempts to clarify, for himself, the place of the “intelligent individual” in society. He was unabashedly elitist, both on behalf of the gifted individual and of scientists as a group, and argued that giving appropriate special treatment to scientists would in the end benefit society (that is, all the individuals in society). Maila Walter observes (1990, 192–193): “Within the community of scientists and scientific philosophers, Bridgman had become the lone spokesman for a radical existential subjectivism”, more akin to Rheinhold Niebuhr's existentialist theology than to any commonly recognized philosophy of science. Bridgman's uncompromising individualism continued right to the end, with a self-administered euthanasia in the late stage of a painful terminal illness (see Holton 1995a, 226–227).

3. Current relevance of operationalism

Is operationalism only a historical curiosity? In this final section, I would like to give a synoptic view of the relevance of operationalism to some issues that are current in philosophy of science.

3.1 Operations as units of analysis of scientific practice

As already noted, Bridgman's ideas first gained recognition in the midst of the logical-positivist preoccupation with language and meaning; therefore, operationalism was taken primarily as a doctrine about meaning and, as such, shown to be inadequate. In that context, it was reasonable for most philosophers to abandon it. Bridgman made various attempts to get beyond the popular caricature of operationalism adopted by advocates and critics alike. These attempts never received sufficient attention, but they offer some valuable lessons and show many productive directions in which his views can be interpreted and extended.

It is useful to continue listening to his retrospective given in the 1953 AAAS conference, quoted earlier. Bridgman tells us that what he advocated was merely:

an attitude or point of view generated by continued practice of operational analysis. So far as any dogma is involved here at all, it is merely the conviction that it is better, because it takes us further, to analyze into doings or happenings rather than into objects or entities. (Bridgman in Frank 1956, 76)

Already in his paper on “Operational Analysis” Bridgman (1938, 115–116) had stated that in the attempt to understand how science works, “the subject matter … is activity of one sort or another”. He equated “activity” and “operations”, the term “operation” only accentuating the directedness of the activity in question. In his last general philosophical treatise, The Way Things Are, Bridgman came back to this theme and stated that an operational analysis was only “a particular case of an analysis in terms of activities—doings or happenings”, instead of analysis “in terms of objects or static abstractions”, or “in terms of things or static elements” (1959a, 3; also 1959b, 522).

If we take our inspiration from this later Bridgman, we can take him as a guide for a new practice-oriented philosophy of science. We can put aside his reductive doctrine of meaning, his puritanical search for certainty, and his ambivalent privileging of instrumental operations over other types of operations. What Bridgman started up but never quite accomplished in a systematic and complete way was a philosophical analysis of science in terms of activities. Operations provide the philosopher (and the historian) of science with a very useful unit of analysis: actions or events, as opposed to objects, statements, beliefs, theories, paradigms, research programs, etc. The concept of operation should provide an effective framework for incorporating certain highly valuable insights about the nature of scientific practice, including the ideas of Ludwig Wittgenstein (1953) on language-games, Michael Polanyi (1958) on tacit knowledge, Marjorie Grene (1974) on the knowing agent, and Ian Hacking (1983) on direct interventions in experimental investigations.

In order to develop Bridgman's operational analysis into a full-fledged philosophy of scientific practice, there are some aspects of his thought that we need to develop and articulate further. First of all, we need a clearer and more detailed taxonomy of operations, without trying to say which types are better or worse at the outset. From this point of view it should not be regarded as a problem or an annoyance that there are different types of operations. The categories offered by Bridgman are much too broad, so we need to identify and describe specific and concrete operations, and distinguish simple and elementary ones from more complex ones. For example, the operation of length measurement with a meter-stick would be analyzable into the instrumental operations of alignment and concatenation, the perceptual operation of judging spatial coincidence, and the mental operation of counting. The operation of hypothesis-testing (in the “received view”) would be analyzable into the simpler operations of deductive prediction, experimental observation, and the comparison between deduced and observed outcomes. In the understanding of these operations we would need a detailed account of the scientist as the agent who performs the operations; here we return to Bridgman's preoccupation with the free individual, but also in essential social interaction with other individuals. A full understanding of operations would require an understanding of the agent's purposes (partly based on the fundamental aims of science), assumptions (including metaphysical principles essential for the particular type of activity in question), and skills and capabilities (including the tacit dimension). If we can achieve such a thick description of the operations that constitute scientific practice, we would be able to make good on Bridgman's promise that “it is better, because it takes us further, to analyze into doings or happenings rather than into objects or entities.”

3.2 Operationalism as a philosophy of extension[5]

Above I have presented a new operationalism as a promising framework for the analysis of scientific practice. Do Bridgman's ideas and attitudes also hold any current relevance for scientific practice itself? He did intend to reform scientific practice itself, not just its second-order analysis, so we must ask whether his reformist agenda has anything left in it for current science. To the casual reader, much of Bridgman's writing will seem like a series of radical complaints about the meaninglessness of various concepts and statements. But he was not interested in skeptical critique as an idle philosophical exercise. He got most worried when a concept was being extended to new situations where the familiar operations defining the concept ceased to be applicable. His arguments often had an iconoclastic flavor because he was exceptionally good at recognizing where a concept had been extended to new domains unthinkingly and most people were not even aware that the extension had been made. From the methodological lesson he took from Einstein to the insights gained in his own high-pressure physics, an important focus of Bridgman's operationalism was on regulating the extension of concepts to uncharted domains.

Bridgman reminded us forcefully that measurement operations did not have unlimited domains of application, and that our conceptual structures consequently had “joints” at which operational meanings changed. But there can be no “joints” if there is no continuous tissue around the disjointed bones. Less metaphorically: if we reduce meaning entirely to measurement operations, there are no possible grounds for assuming or demanding any continuity of meaning where there is clear discontinuity in measurement operations. When we have two different operations which give convergent results in the overlapping domain, how do we tell whether what we have is an accidental convergence of the measured values of two unrelated quantities, or a unified concept measured by two different methods? Some critics have maintained that only a recourse to theories can give us the answer (e.g., Lindsay 1937, 458; Gillies 1972, 23). That does not seem to me always necessary, as theory is not the only source of semantic continuity. There are instrumental operations that are not metrological, and these operations can provide a continuity of meaning, against which metrological validity can be judged (see Section 2.1). We can take operationalism as a useful and practicable caution not to make conceptual extensions without operational grounds.

A homespun example from the 18th century illustrates this point nicely: the efforts of the English potter Josiah Wedgwood (1730–1795) to extend the temperature scale to cover the very high temperatures in his kilns, at which mercury vaporized and glass melted. All previously known thermometers failed in that pyrometric range, so Wedgwood felt obliged to invent a whole new measurement standard (reminiscent of Bridgman in his high-pressure laboratory). Wedgwood noticed that very high temperatures made pieces of clay shrink, and created a temperature scale by assuming that the amount of contraction was proportional to temperature beyond “red heat”. As the start of his scale (red heat, defined as 0) was already beyond the boiling point of mercury, Wedgwood's scale was wholly disconnected from the temperature scale defined by mercury thermometers. Later, in response to widespread demand to clarify the meaning of his scale in more usual terms, Wedgwood made a translation of his scale into Fahrenheit degrees, by means of an intermediate standard (thermal expansion of silver) which overlapped with the high end of the mercury scale and the low end of the clay scale. (This process produced some unlikely numbers, for example 21,877°F for the temperature of his air-furnace.) It seems that Wedgwood initially did exactly what operationalist conscience would dictate: as the new instrument did not operate at all in the range of any trustworthy previous thermometers, he made a fresh scale. Why was that not the honest thing to do, and quite sufficient, too? Why did everyone, including Wedgwood himself, feel compelled to interpret the Wedgwood clay scale in terms of the mercury-Fahrenheit scale? Why was a continuous extension desired so strongly, when a disjointed set of operations seemed to serve all necessary practical purposes?

The urge for conceptual extension, in the Wedgwood case, was rooted in a widespread feeling that there was a property in the pyrometric range that was continuous in its meaning with temperature in the everyday range. Where did that feeling come from, long before there was any well-defined and agreed-upon theoretical concept of temperature? If we look closely at the situation, numerous subtle and often-unspoken connections do emerge between pyrometric temperature and everyday temperature. In the first place, we do bring objects to pyrometric domains by prolonged heating—that is to say, by a prolonged application of ordinary processes that cause the rise of temperature within the everyday domain. Likewise, the same causes of cooling that operate in the everyday domain will bring objects from pyrometric temperatures down to everyday temperatures; that is precisely what happens in calorimetric pyrometry (or, when we simply leave very hot things out in cold air for a while). These concrete physical operations provide a continuity of operational meaning between two domains that are not connected by a common measurement standard. Here again we need to articulate something that Bridgman already did imply: not all instrumental operations are measurement operations as such (for instance, we may know how to make iron melt without thereby obtaining any precise idea of the temperature at which that happens). Operational meaning even in the narrow, instrumental sense is broader than meaning specified by methods of measurement.

The connections listed above rest on very basic qualitative causal assumptions about temperature: fire raises the temperature of any ordinary objects on which it acts directly; if two objects at different temperatures are put in contact with each other, their temperatures tend to approach each other. There are semi-quantitative links as well. It is taken for granted that the consumption of more fuel should result in the generation of more heat, and that is partly based on a primitive notion of energy conservation. It is assumed that the amount of heat communicated to an object is roughly proportional to the amount of change in its temperature (barring changes of state and interfering influences), and that assumption is based on the rough but robust understanding of temperature as the “degree of heat.” So, for example, when a crucible is put on a steady fire, one assumes that the temperature of its contents will rise steadily, up to a certain maximum. That is exactly the kind of reasoning used by the chemist John Frederic Daniell (1790–1845) to criticize some of Wedgwood's results:

Now, any body almost knows, how very soon silver melts after it has attained a bright red heat, and every practical chemist has observed it to his cost, when working with silver crucibles. Neither the consumption of fuel, nor the increase of the air-draught, necessary to produce this effect, can warrant us in supposing that the fusing point of silver is 4 1/2 times higher than a red heat, fully visible in day-light. Neither on the same grounds, is it possible to admit that a full red-heat being 1077°[F], and the welding heat of iron 12,777°[F], that the fusing point of cast iron can be more than 5000° higher. The welding of iron must surely be considered as incipient fusion. (quoted in Chang 2004, 149)

Similar types of rough assumptions were also used in the extension of temperature to very low temperatures (beyond the freezing point of mercury and alcohol).

These cases illustrate that concepts can and do get extended to fresh new domains in which theories are uncertain and experience scant, even if no definite measurement operations have been worked out. We start with a concept with a secure net of uses giving it stable meaning in a restricted domain of circumstances. The extension of such a concept consists in giving it a secure net of uses, also credibly linked to the earlier net, in an adjacent domain. Such extension can happen in all kinds of ways, including theoretical fiat and metaphysical presumption, but the operational method is the most assured one. Specific, well-defined operations, whether they be instrumental, mental or paper-and-pencil type, can start a secure skeleton of meaning in the new domain. With all the elements of new meaning operationally well-defined, it also becomes possible to attempt linking them up with each other at each step along the way and check the whole meaning for coherence. (Compare such a deliberate process with the vague presumption that terms in a theoretical equation must have the same meaning in the entire mathematical range given to the variables.) Operationalism in this guise can be used as a secure method of conceptual extension, not prone to the kind of fragmentation that Hempel feared. Such operationalism would not destroy systematic unity; on the contrary, it is an optimal strategy for achieving as much systematic unity as nature would allow, in a strongly empiricist system of knowledge.

3.3 Operationalism as a strategy for increasing empirical content

Conceptual extension is important, especially since it served as one of the key initial motivations of Bridgman's thought, but it is only part of the operationalist story. In more general terms, operationalism can be seen as a strategy for increasing the empirical content of scientific theories. Empirical content is not something we hear about very much these days in philosophy of science after the receding of Popperian and Lakatosian doctrines, but for Bridgman it was one of the key issues. If we take operationalism as a commitment to increase empirical content, Bridgman was not so much a high-handed judge who pronounced upon the meaningfulness of concepts in a black-and-white manner. Rather, he offered operational analysis as a tool of self-diagnosis and self-improvement. He was interested in advancing science, not in carping against it; like Descartes, he used skepticism as a means of achieving a more positive end. The operationalist dictum could be phrased as follows: maintain and increase the empirical content of theories by the use of operationally well-defined concepts.

What is empirical content? Karl Popper saw the amount of the empirical content of a theory as the number of states of the world that are forbidden by it. Regarding laws of nature he said: “the more they prohibit they more they say” (Popper 1972, 41). Or, somewhat more formally: “I define the empirical content of a statement p as the class of its potential falsifiers” (120). Similarly but staying away from the strict falsificationist idiom, Imre Lakatos understood empirical content as the number of empirically testable predictions. It is difficult to craft an exact quantitative measure, but we can at least say that the amount of empirical content depends on the number of empirically testable relations that a theory specifies. That, in turn, depends on the number of independently measurable parameters. Increasing the latter, or at least maintaining it, was something that Bridgman sought to achieve with his operationalism. This, I submit, was one of the key reasons why he did not like conceptual extensions that were not backed up by measurement operations in the new domain. To follow Bridgman's thinking along these lines, consider this intriguing passage, which at first glance looks like another complaint about meaninglessness. But towards the end the main point emerges as a worry about diminishing empirical content:

What is the possible meaning of the statement that the diameter of an electron is 10-13 cm? Again the only answer is found by examining the operations by which the number 10-13 was obtained. This number came by solving certain equations derived from the field equations of electrodynamics, into which certain numerical data obtained by experiment had been substituted. The concept of length has therefore now been so modified as to include that theory of electricity embodied in the field equations, and, most important, assumes the correctness of extending these equations from the dimensions in which they may be verified experimentally into a region in which their correctness is one of the most important and problematical of present-day questions in physics. To find whether the field equations are correct on a small scale, we must verify the relations demanded by the equations between the electric and magnetic forces and the space coördinates, to determine which involves measurement of lengths. But if these space coördinates cannot be given an independent meaning apart from the equations, not only is the attempted verification of the equations impossible, but the question itself is meaningless. If we stick to the concept of length by itself, we are landed in a vicious circle. As a matter of fact, the concept of length disappears as an independent thing, and fuses in a complicated way with other concepts, all of which are themselves altered thereby, with the result that the total number of concepts used in describing nature at this level is reduced in number.[6] (Bridgman 1927, 21–22)

Such a reduction in the number of operationally meaningful concepts is almost bound to result in a corresponding reduction in the number of relations that can be tested empirically. A good scientist would fight against such a reduction of empirical content.

This concern with empirical content also explains why Bridgman was not content with the mainstream post-positivist philosophical discourse on concept-formation and empirical significance, exemplified by the works of Carl Hempel and Willard Van Orman Quine. As noted in Section 2.2, Bridgman did not object to theoretical science creating a system of concepts and laws that made contact with observations only at some points. However, Quinean holism, in which the unit of empirical significance was the entire system of knowledge, had no particular concern about increasing the number of those points-of-contact with experience. Bridgman's ideal was to operationalize each and every concept if possible, and each case of de-operationalization rang alarm bells in his head.

Recognizing the importance of empirical content helps us make sense of Bridgman's complex attitude toward theoretical concepts. In a little-known section of The Logic of Modern Physics, he discussed what he called “mental constructs” in science, particularly those created in order to “enable us to deal with physical situations which we cannot directly experience through our senses, but with which we have contact indirectly and by inference” (1927, 53–60). Not all constructs are the same:

The essential point is that our constructs fall into two classes: those to which no physical operations correspond other than those which enter the definition of the construct, and those which admit of other operations, or which could be defined in several alternative ways in terms of physically distinct operations. This difference in the character of constructs may be expected to correspond to essential physical differences, and these physical differences are much too likely to be overlooked in the thinking of physicists. (Bridgman 1927, 59–60)

They were also very easily overlooked in the thinking of philosophers who debated his ideas. What Bridgman says here is entirely contrary to the common image of his doctrines. When it came to constructs, “of which physics is full,” Bridgman not only admitted that one concept could correspond to many different operations, but even suggested that such multiplicity of operational meaning was “what we mean by the reality of things not given directly by experience.” In an illustration of these ideas, Bridgman argued that the concept of stress within a solid body had physical reality, but the concept of electric field did not, since the latter only ever manifested itself through force and electric charge, by which it was defined (Bridgman 1927, 57). This comes down to the stance that a theoretical concept without direct operational meaning is worthwhile only if it serves as a mediator connecting two or more operationally meaningful concepts, creating an empirically testable relation. This is in fact not so different from Hempel's view quoted in Section 2.2, albeit with a different emphasis.

3.4 Operational analysis as the revealer of complexity

In closing, I would like to pull out an insight from Bridgman that is usually not recognized in discussions of operationalism, but actually has emerged as a significant point of contention in more recent philosophy of science. This is the issue of complexity. In Section 1.1 I have already quoted Bridgman's puzzling statement that nature is ultimately “neither understandable nor subject to law.” As it turns out, that was not an isolated off-hand remark. An important aspect of Bridgman's operationalism was a search for certainty, and it was a search made all the more desperate by a deep-rooted pessimism about the possibility of attaining any certainty in science, at least if scientists were to seek a simple and unified system of knowledge. Bridgman professed his belief that “the external world of objects and happenings is … so complex that all aspects of it can never be reproduced by any verbal structure.” He lamented: “Even in physics this is not sufficiently appreciated, as is shown, for example, by the reification of energy. The totality of situations covered by various aspects of the energy concept is too complex to be reproduced by any simple verbal device.” (Bridgman in Frank 1956, 78)

Bridgman's view on the complexity of nature also had a direct implication for the limits of operational analysis itself in providing clarity and precision. Right from The Logic of Modern Physics, Bridgman stressed that “all results of measurement are only approximate”; this obvious fact, he said, “tacitly underlies all our discussion”. This he attributed ultimately to something fundamental about the nature of human experience: “all experience seems to be of this character; we never have perfectly clean-cut knowledge of anything, but all our experience is surrounded by a twilight zone, a penumbra of uncertainty, into which we have not yet penetrated. This penumbra is as truly an unexplored region as any other region beyond experiment” (1927, 33). This indicated a fundamental limitation to the certainty of operations: “Operations themselves are, of course, derived from experience, and would be expected also to have a nebulous edge of uncertainty” (1927, 36). Bridgman remained clearly aware of the complexities revealed by operational analysis, stating late in his life that “operational analysis can always be pushed to the point where sharpness disappears” (Bridgman in Frank 1956, 78), and that “there is nothing absolute or final about an operational analysis” (Bridgman 1959b, 522). Still, he would not give up on the pushing, which was necessary to reach as much clarity as possible.

Bridgman's battle against his own skeptical and pessimistic conscience was a heroic one. After decades of operationalist thinking he arrived at “a picture of man isolated … in an oasis of phenomena which he will never be able to transcend because beyond its bounds the operations are impossible which are necessary to give meaning to his thought” (Bridgman 1955, 540). What this picture forced on him was a deep sense of humility, as expressed in his memorable statement on the scientific method: “The scientific method, as far as it is a method, is nothing more than doing one's damnedest with one's mind, no holds barred” (1955, 535). Retaining that sense of humility will help us in developing Bridgman's unfinished thoughts to create a new operationalism that does full justice to the complexity and richness of both nature and human scientific practice.

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behaviorism | cosmology: methodological debates in the 1930s and 1940s | logical positivism | Neurath, Otto | science: theory and observation in | Vienna Circle

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