Notes to Panpsychism

1. A possible variant is, then, a doctrine which asserts that only some of the basic physical constituents of the world possess mental attributes (for example, as it might be, only electrons). Since there seems to be nothing upon which to base excluding certain of the fundamental physical entities from the realm of the mind, and since the panpsychist would regard the position that the physically fundamental entities should be conceived of as potentially mindless as wrongheaded, such a position has never been developed.

2. The appropriateness of the analogy is suspect since energy, although certainly ubiquitous, may not be as fundamental as the panpsychist would wish. The energy of systems is usually reducible, as in the common Hamiltonian description of a system, to velocities, masses and positions (within fields that yield potential energy).

3. Piaget's conclusions may be overstated although animistic tendencies in children are obviously present (for views contrary to Piaget's see Carey 1985, Wellman 1992). It is impossible to resist pointing out that the apparent decline in children's willingness to make widespread mentalistic attributions from 1929 to 1992 may reflect the increasing cultural ascendancy of scientific and materialistic modes of thought over that some time span.

4. Another Presocratic philosopher who has been said to espouse panpsychism for reasons similar in form to those of Thales (that is, via analogy and indeed an analogy with motion production) is Anaximenes (whose dates within the sixth century B.C.E. are uncertain), who in some way identified “air” (or “breath”) with soul or mind, thus making mind ubiquitous.

5. Empedocles is sometimes regarded as a panpsychist because of the universal role of love and strife (see Edwards 1967 for example) but there seems little of the mental in Empedocles's conceptions, which are rather more like forces of aggregation and dis-aggregation respectively (see Barnes 1982, pp. 308 ff.).

6. It is important to note that although we, overall rightly, regard Newton as one of the founders of the materialist world view he was reluctantly forced to imbue matter with a mysterious power that transcended the pure mechanics of Descartes (hence my scare quotes above). The postulation of a "force" of gravity added an intrinsic power to matter that many, including Newton himself, regarded as inconsistent with a scientific understanding of the world. Some philosophers have seen the notion of force as a transmuted form of the concept of spirit, and thus as a limited and covert importation of mentalistic features into matter.

7. The notion that biological species should be thought of as individuals rather than collections of individuals has received some attention in contemporary philosophy of biology (see Hull 1976, DeSousa 1989). It is, of course, another matter whether species, even if they are granted status as individuals, ought to be granted minds but it presumably cannot be ruled out a priori.

8. Although philosophically marginal, an intellectually significant figure worth mentioning as an example of a twentieth century panpsychist of some influence is Teilhard de Chardin (1881-1955). This mystic Roman Catholic polymath endorsed a kind of world-soul (thus embracing what Hartshorne called a synecological form of panpsychism) which he called the "noosphere" and urged that the old conception of matter and mind be replaced with a new notion of “matter-spirit”. The noosphere is the culmination of the evolution of consciousness (which is a continuation of biological evolution). But to avoid the discontinuity of emergentism, de Chardin embraced panpsychism.

9. Interestingly, Jaegwon Kim (1999) has recently endorsed the basic cogency of Nagel's argument, though in a back-handed way (Kim, so to speak, favors modus tollens over modus ponens). Rather than accept any form of panpsychism—indeed he does not consider the option at all—Kim prefers to defend physicalism by returning us to the days of reductive materialism; he sees no other way to avoid the charge that mental properties are epiphenomenal. Panpsychism appears to avoid both epiphenomenalism and reductionism, though at the cost of rejecting traditional forms of physicalism.

10. The mental lives of protozoa was apparently a lively topic at the time. Alfred Binet, the pioneer in intelligence testing, wrote the intriguingly entitled Études de psychologie expérimentale: le fétichisme dans l'amour, la vie psychique des micro-organismes, l'intensité des images mentales, etc. in 1891 (an English translation—The Psychic Life of Microorganisms—appeared in 1889).

11. Recent defenders of the so-called representational thedefense of consciousness (see for example Dretske 1995 or Tye 1995) contend that the informational aspect of consciousness exhausts its nature. We need not go so far here; it is enough that consciousness clearly does possess such an aspect.

12. Someone with preexisting emergentist leanings will tend to see this as trivialising panpsychism or rendering it empty. As McGinn says: “the weak version [of panpsychism] says that matter has some properties or other, to be labeled ‘proto-mental’, that account for the emergence of consciousness from brains. But of course that is true” (1999, p. 99).

Copyright © 2010 by
William Seager
Sean Allen-Hermanson

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