Francesco Patrizi

First published Mon Nov 22, 2004

Renaissance, Francesco Patrizi of Cherso (1529-1597) was a leading critic of the dominant Aristotelianism of the times. Not to be confused with the earlier humanist and political theoretician, Francesco Patrizi of Siena (1413-1494), Patrizi of Cherso focused his attention on a wide variety of philosophical, scientific, artistic and literary issues, providing in his “New Philosophy” a major alternative to earlier schools of thought and a model which later thinkers such as Galileo Galilei no doubt found valuable in developing the mathematized physics which would prove the dominant force in the rise of early modern science. In addition, Patrizi's research into the history of ancient and medieval philosophical sources as an essential part of his method for establishing the legitimacy of his own position would make those texts available to his contemporaries in a way they had never been before and serve as a model for future generations of scholars. It also emphasized the centrality of the study of the history of philosophy as an integral part of engaging in philosophical investigation in its own right.

1. Life and Works

Born on the island of Cherso, or Cres, off the coast of Dalmatia, in 1529, Francesco Patrizi began his initial scholarly training in his home city, followed by studies in Venice and Ingolstadt, before enrolling at the University of Padua in 1547. Although he initially intended to study medicine, he quickly turned to the humanities, learning Greek and beginning the systematic analysis of philosophical texts which would come to be the major preoccupation of his professional life. He spent seven years at Padua working with an outstanding faculty in Aristotelian philosophy while engaging in discussions with thinkers devoted to the study of Plato and other alternative philosophical sources. He later travelled to several other Italian cities and moved to Cyprus, where he was able to strengthen his knowledge of Greek and assemble a collection of Greek manuscripts (Muccillo 1993). Following two excursions to Spain, during which he sold a major portion of his Greek manuscripts to Philip II, he was offered an appointment to teach Platonic philosophy at the University of Ferrara in 1578, a position he held until invited by Cardinal Ippolito Aldobrandini to accept a similar assignment at the University of Rome, the “Sapienza”, in 1592. He spent the last years of his life as one of the very few philosophers teaching Platonism in a university setting in late sixteenth-century Italy, passing away in 1597 while still engaged in defending his controversial work, “The New Universal Philosophy” (Nova de universis philosophia), from the theological criticisms that had led it to be condemned by the Congregation of the Index shortly after it appeared in print in 1591. Upon his death, his chair in Platonic philosophy was awarded to the other major university teacher of Platonism in Italy at the time, Patrizi's contemporary and correspondent, Jacopo Mazzoni (Kristeller 1964, 113-116; Muccillo 1992).

Based on the published and unpublished works he wrote during his career, it is clear that Patrizi's range of interests was quite broad, reflecting both the artistic, historical and literary influence Renaissance humanism continued to enjoy in scholarly circles during the sixteenth century as well as the emergence of a devotion to practical scientific and engineering issues on the part of many philosophers. A brief survey of his works amply reveals the scope of his concerns [see Bibliography]. Among his earliest publications was a collection of works which appeared at Venice in 1553, including his utopian “The Happy City” (La città felice), a dialogue on honor (Il Barignano) and a discourse on the diversity of poetic inspirations (Discorso della diversità de' furori poetici). He composed poetic works of his own. In 1560 he published his ten dialogues on history and, two years later, ten dialogues on rhetoric. He also engaged in exchanges on literary subjects with some of the leading authors of his day.

It was not until 1571 that Patrizi put forward his first major philosophical work in a more narrowly construed sense, when the first part of his “Peripatetic Discussions” (Discussiones peripateticae) appeared at Venice; a greatly expanded version would be published at Basel ten years later. The Discussiones would constitute one of Patrizi's most important contributions to Renaissance philosophy. It provided a thoroughgoing analysis and critique of Aristotle's thought, which continued to be the most influential source in theological as well as secular philosophical settings in the sixteenth century. In addition to taking on the leading philosophical tradition of his day, Patrizi's work would serve as the basis for his own development of an anti-Aristotelian philosophy in the years ahead. [see section 2].

By actively seeking to compare Aristotle's philosophical views with those of other ancient thinkers, the Discussiones earns Patrizi a place in the history of a major philosophical genre which has its roots in classical antiquity and which flourished again during the late fifteenth and sixteenth centuries, in large part due to the increased availability of translations and commentaries of the works of Plato and other ancient sources. This ‘Comparatio’ tradition would not only attain popularity in printed works but would provide an alternative model for teaching philosophy and natural science in university settings, where Peripatetic views had long held the field. Unlike the ‘Conciliatio’ approach adopted by such thinkers as Giovanni Pico della Mirandola, which sought to reconcile the apparent differences between the teachings of Plato and Aristotle, authors like Patrizi and contemporaries such as Jacopo Mazzoni and Paolo Beni attempted to use a direct confrontation of the opposing views as a method for arriving at a position which was most defensible philosophically. In his own major works Patrizi did not hesitate to emphasize his opposition to Aristotelianism and his preference for a Platonic approach. [see section 3.]

The publication of the Discussiones did not by any means signal an end to Patrizi's broader literary and historical interests, however. In 1583 he published a major study on the ancient Roman army, based on his reading of Polybius, Livy and Dionysius of Halicarnassus, following it up a decade later with a two-volume comparison of ancient Roman military tactics and strategies with those of his own day, probably in attempt to encourage an improvement in Italian military standing. He translated works of Platonic thinkers such as Proclus, the pseudo-John Philoponus, and various tracts in magical philosophy, now recognized as spurious, which were associated with the ancient Egyptian sage Hermes Trismegistus and his followers. His attention to the latter sources placed him in the middle of the growing debate on the authenticity and philosophical merit, if any, of the “ancient theology” and the practice of spiritual and demonic magic by such contemporary thinkers as the unfortunate Giordano Bruno. [see section 4].

Shortly before being called to Rome by Pope Clement VIII to teach Platonic philosophy at the University of Rome, the Sapienza, Patrizi published the first edition of his philosophical masterpiece, the Nova de universis philosophia (Ferrara, 1591; an edition with significant variants was printed at Venice with a spurious retrodating of 1593). In sum, it brings together many of the major themes that had dominated his philosophical career: the opposition to Aristotle and the Peripatetic philosophical method, the admiration for Platonism as a philosophical alternative, together with the incorporation of insights derived from other ancient and modern sources to form a novel system that Patrizi was proud to call his own and seek to have established as a new basis for philosophical instruction in the universities of Europe. Not surprisingly, opposition to his goals was determined, with critics on both the theological and philosophical sides voicing their concerns. In spite of his having produced a series of emendations in response to criticisms by theological and philosophical critics, his work was condemned by the Congregation of the Index of prohibited Books “until corrected” in 1592. He was to spend the last years of his life trying to defend his views, which in some cases hindsight shows to have pointed toward some of the ways in which science and philosophy would move in the Seventeenth Century and beyond. [see section 5.]

2. Critique of Aristotelianism

Given that his earliest development of an interest in logic and philosophy occurred at the University of Padua, it is surely no surprise that a close familiarity with the works of Aristotle and his interpreters would form a major part of his training. It is perhaps worth stressing that in philosophy as in other areas such as art, architecture, science and literature, the Renaissance was a “retrospective” age. From roughly the mid-Fourteenth through the late Sixteenth centuries, many of the leading scholars of Europe were engaged in attempting to recover the high levels of skills and learning that characterized late classical antiquity. Humanists trained in the ancient languages sought to recover texts which had been lost or ignored for a millennium or more. We owe the very concept of the “Middle Ages” (not to mention the more pejorative notion of the “dark ages”) to this movement. Patrizi's early mastery of Greek and his interest in assembling a library of classical Greek manuscripts (Muccillo 1993) places him well within the tradition of seeking to restore the legacy of antiquity as a precondition for moving ahead to a “new” era.

Aristotle's works had, of course, been made available to scholars via translation from Greek and Arabic sources during the medieval period (Twelfth through Fourteenth centuries), and a familiarity with Aristotle's logic and natural philosophy became a requirement for an Arts degree at medieval universities and thus an integral part of the training of those who wished to pursue advanced studies in medicine, theology or canon or civil law. But the number of philosophers or theologians who could access the Aristotelian corpus in the original Greek was quite small, and there was an extensive body of works in Greek devoted to commentaries and criticisms of the Stagirite's positions that would not become available to a majority of readers until the Renaissance provided accessible translations. It is not surprising that Patrizi devoted much of his time and effort to these endeavors, and his doing so would have a profound effect on the way in which he and many of his contemporaries and successors would come to interpret the Peripatetic system.

It is perhaps significant that Patrizi's earliest works, produced while he was still in close contact with teachers and colleagues at Padua, reveal a far less critical view of Aristotle and his doctrines than his later writings would, generally attempting to utilize Plato and other earlier thinkers to complement rather than refute Peripatetic positions (see the article by F. Bottin in the Other Internet Resources). In this regard, it is quite likely that Patrizi may be said to have undergone a philosophical development from an earlier, more sympathetic, view of Aristotle's philosophy to a more critical attitude as his familiarity with Platonic and other earlier sources increased and he became aware of the debates among the contemporary Aristotelians themselves, such as Pietro Pomponazzi and Agostino Nifo, over such basic doctrines as the immortality of the soul and the nature of the physical cosmos. Add to this the ongoing exchanges he had with thinkers committed to developing a philosophical and scientific method outside both the Platonic and Aristotelian “mainstreams” and it becomes clear why Patrizi came to play the major role he did in the move from an entrenched Peripatetic approach to the search for a “new” method which would come to characterize the leading philosophers and scientists of the Seventeenth Century and beyond.

Beginning with the first edition of his Discussiones peripateticae in 1571, Patrizi initiated a more critical assessment of the character and philosophical reasoning of Aristotle than had characterized his earlier writings. That work, followed by the expanded edition of 1581, provided a close comparison of the views of Aristotle and Plato on a wide range of philosophical issues, arguing that Plato's views were preferable on all counts (Kristeller 1964, 115), although it should be noted that the three books added to the 1581 edition exhibit a far more aggressive tone than the initial edition. In addition, Patrizi echoes the theme put forward earlier by Christian Platonists such as Augustine, Pseudo-Dionysius the Areopagite, and his own Renaissance predecessor Marsilio Ficino, that Platonism is more in harmony with Church doctrine than the Stagirite's were. Later, by including the spurious work Theology of Aristotle, derived largely from the Neoplatonist Plotinus, as an appendix to his Nova de universis philosophia (1591), he implied that Aristotle in fact agreed with many of the Platonic doctrines he openly attacked in his corpus of attributed works, thus suggesting an underlying duplicity on Aristotle's part in order to bolster his own philosophic credentials as an independent thinker. And Patrizi's own “novel” philosophical system would underscore the anti-Aristotelian attitude he had expressed throughout his career.

What were some of the major issues on which Patrizi took Aristotle to task? In his Della poetica (Aguzzi-Barbagli 1961-1971) he evaluated and rejected the Stagirite's analysis of poetry as a form of imitation, seeking to replace it with his own view, influenced at least in part by Platonic sources (Bolzoni 1980, 1983; Spedicati 1986). With regard to Aristotle's views on metaphysics and natural philosophy, he rejected the notion that the three basic “principles” of form, matter and privation could provide an adequate account of the nature of being, especially given that matter was conceived in terms of pure potentiality and form as incapable of existing except as embodied in a material substrate (Vasoli 1996). Within the broader range of scientific and cosmological issues discussed in his major work on his “New” philosophy, Patrizi rejects Aristotle's denial of the possibility of a vacuum, arguing instead for a position closer to the atomistic view that a material void is possible, although couched in terms of his own conception of space. In that work he would also argue for replacing the four standard Aristotelian material elements – earth, air, fire and water – with his own alternatives – space (spatium), light (lux), heat (calor) and humidity (fluor). He rejected the finitude of the physical universe and the concept that heavenly bodies moved in conjunction with fixed celestial spheres. In sum, by drawing upon a series of ancient, late medieval and Renaissance sources, Patrizi sought to replace the dominant Aristotelianism of his era with a new and challenging alternative – one which showed at many levels his preference for a Platonic conception of reality.

3. Defense of Platonism

In rejecting the Peripatetic conceptions so dominant in philosophy and science, Patrizi was clearly motivated not only by his desire to replace what he took to be incorrect views contained in the Aristotelian works but by his wide reading and critical study of many of the major sources associated with the Platonic tradition. In addition to the translations of and commentaries on the Platonic dialogues and the works of Plotinus published by Marsilio Ficino, Patrizi's knowledge of Greek gave him access to a body of writings from other relevant authors. Besides translating John Philoponus' commentary on Aristotle's Metaphysics, Proclus' Elements of Theology and Physical Elements, he was well versed in the works of thinkers such as Antiochus of Ascalon, Cicero, Ammonius Saccas, Boethius and Augustine, who actively sought to incorporate Platonic teachings as an essential part of their own views, as well as Platonically-influenced contemporaries such as Francesco Verino il Secondo and Jacopo Mazzoni. He argued actively for the replacement of Aristotle's works as the model for philosophical and scientific education at the University level, and his holding chairs in Platonic philosophy at both Ferrara and Rome indicates his success in bringing his ideal to fruition.

What were some of the major advantages Patrizi felt Platonism had over Aristotelianism and how does his own scientific-philosophical synthesis reflect this conviction? This is best illustrated in his major work, the Nova de universis philosophia (Patrizi 1591, reprint with variants dated 1593). The work consists of four major parts, combining, as he claims in the title, Aristotelian, Patrizian and Platonic methods to produce a new philosophy. This new system involves three stages, initially ascending, as Aristotle's had, to the First Cause, but not by using motion to reach the “Unmoved Mover”, but rather by employing light (lux) and illumination (lumen) to attain to the Father of Lights. Then the Patrizian method will provide an analysis of the Divinity, followed by the employment of a Platonic method to show how all creation is derived from God. Although on the surface such a program could be seen as falling within the boundaries of the conciliatory model which many of his contemporaries used to incorporate both Platonic and Aristotelian elements into their thought, a closer analysis reveals the underlying Platonic nature of his undertaking.

The four major sections of the Nova … Philosophia are as follows: Panaugia, or “All-Splendor”; Panarchia, or “All Principles”; Pampsychia, or “All-Soul” and Pancosmia, or “All-Cosmos”. It has been emphasized (Kristeller 1964, 120) that Patrizi's selection of light as the basis of his initial “Aristotelian” method of establishing the existence of God as “First Light” involves a departure from an Aristotelian approach in favor of a more Platonic one, although this has been called into question (Ryan 2002, 192-195). The key point seems to be why light rather than motion is elevated by Patrizi to the status of the primary basis for an a posteriori proof of God's existence as First Cause. From a Platonic perspective, the answer seems clear. Plato's use of the Sun as the physical counterpart of the Good in the Republic and his extensive use of visual metaphors for intellective processes (rather than, for example, the tactile images that later Stoic thinkers would employ in arguing that the mind can “grasp” certain appearances) strongly suggest that Patrizi was seeking to replace the Aristotelian model with a Platonic one. The fact that the notion of “seeing” the truth would become standard in later Platonic sources such as Plotinus and lead to the development of what has been termed Neoplatonic Light Metaphysics only strengthens the case. In the Panaugia Patrizi construes light as an intermediary between the corporeal and incorporeal realms. The existence of light in the corporeal realm argues for the existence of a purely incorporeal light, and indeed Patrizi construes God as the Lux Prima from which by illumination proceeds the entire realm of incorporeal entities. God is also the ultimate source of corporeal light as well (Vasoli 1991).

In contrast to the Panaugia's emphasis on the centrality of light, the Panarchia, constituting as it does the initial application of the overtly “Patrizian” method mentioned in the title of the work, builds upon a pattern more familiar to students of the Platonic tradition. Dedicated to showing how the levels of reality flow from the ultimate cause, Patrizi's ontology draws upon such Platonic predecessors as Plotinus, Proclus and Marsilio Ficino to present a ten-level system. Beginning with God, whom he terms the “One-All” (Un'omnia), he establishes Unity, Essence, Life, Intelligence, Soul, Nature, Quality, Form and Body as the succeeding categories which constitute the incorporeal and corporeal universe. Such a pastiche would doubtless resonate with students of the history of Platonism. God thus is viewed as having both internal and external products in Patrizi's version of what might be termed the “chain of being”.

The third section of the Nova … Philosophia, the Pampsychia, focuses on Soul as an intermediary between the spiritual and corporeal realms. As has been pointed out (Kristeller 1964, 122), Soul thus plays a role similar to that assigned to Light in the Panaugia, but the precise relationship between the two is not dealt with. The soul of an individual living being has the same connection to its body as the World Soul has to the universe as a whole; thus the Anima mundi is not simply a collection of individual souls but a separate entity which vivifies the universe as a distinct reality.

The fourth and final part of Patrizi's work, the Pancosmia, shows how the physical world derives its existence from the supramundane realities discussed previously and how a “Platonic” method may be used to arrive at an understanding of the connections between the two realms. Thus Patrizi puts forward a model for the understanding of the universe which bridges the gap between philosophy and science and incorporates methodologies for explaining physical and astronomical phenomena which would resonate with thinkers seeking to establish an alternative approach to the study of nature from the largely qualitative analysis embodied in Aristotle's natural philosophy. [see Section 5].

4. Use of Pre-Platonic Sources

Surely one of the most interesting aspects of Patrizi's philosophical works is his ongoing dedication to the study of sources in the history of philosophy as an essential part of his developing his own philosophical views. Not content merely to interpret the major sources such as Aristotle and Plato, nor even to limit himself to the “comparatio” tradition which sought to delineate the major differences between those two schools of thought, Patrizi used his linguistic, historical and humanistic skills to recover, study and make available a great many sources which he believed (rightly or wrongly) to have dated from the pre-Platonic and pre-Socratic period. He may thus be said to have exemplified an interest in two themes prevalent in other Renaissance authors – the notion of a “perennial philosophy” which reappears in different guises at different periods in the history of thought, and that of an “ancient theology” traceable back to pre-Hellenic civilizations (Schmitt 1966; Vasoli, 1981; Muccillo, 1996). His systematic collection of pre-Aristotelian sources as part of his attempt to determine the Stagirite's true place in the history of philosophy put valuable textual materials in the hands of future generations of scholars in a way that anticipated the modern collections of resources in the last two centuries.

Patrizi's concern with early sources was not strictly scholarly or historical, as can readily be seen by examining his works and the ways in which those texts were employed. An independent thinker, he was willing to consider as wide a range of views as possible on subjects of interest to him, whether they were scientific, philosophical, historical, or dealt with concrete problems in engineering or hydrology. And he made use of them in his own way, unwilling to adhere unquestioningly to the theories and practices of contemporaries who dealt with the same works in different ways. To cite a concrete example, Patrizi accepted the authenticity of the body of works attributed to the pseudo-Egyptian sage Hermes or Mercurius Trismegistus, as had Marsilio Ficino before him and many of his own contemporaries, such as Giordano Bruno (Yates 1964). He printed some Hermetic works and the Chaldaean Oracles attributed to Zoroaster (Patrizi 1593). It was, ironically, within Patrizi's own lifetime that serious textual and historical arguments would finally be put forward to undermine the authority of many of these spurious works, and his own commitment to the authenticity of the Hermetica can now be seen to have played a major role in leading some of his critics and defenders to single out and publicize some of the historical and textual grounds for rejecting them as spurious (Purnell 2002; Mulsow, ed. 2002).

But what is most interesting is that Patrizi did not employ these texts in the way that fanatical Hermeticists like Bruno did, who saw therein a justification for the practice of spiritual and demonic magic and a basis for undermining the authority of the Christian church as a “triumphant beast”, perverting the “true” religion of the ancient Egyptians. Instead, Patrizi found in those works themes which he felt would be echoed by “later” Greek authors such as Plato and his followers, adding additional support to their appeal. Yet it is clearly no coincidence that Patrizi's own difficulties with the Church over the Nova … Philosophia would occur while Bruno was languishing in prison in Rome prior to his execution in February 1600 and that Galileo Galilei and other innovative cosmologists would face similar confrontations with the Congregation of the Index and the Inquisition.

Given the “retrospective” character of the Renaissance in general, it is not surprising that what were believed to be the oldest texts to have survived from antiquity would enjoy the audience they did. Such works would have a profound effect on how the more familiar and “standard” philosophical and scientific sources were interpreted. And the coupling of critical historiographical and etymological skills as developed by Renaissance humanists with the philosophical and scientific interests of thinkers like Patrizi would usher in a new age of systematic analysis of the intellectual legacy of the ancient world.

5. The Relation of Philosophy to Science

One of the most intriguing aspects of Francesco Patrizi's heritage as a forebear of early modern science and philosophy is his ongoing attempt in his major works to incorporate a systematic account of the natural world within an overall methodological and metaphysical context, anticipating by doing so some of the defining characteristics of such thinkers as Galileo, Descartes and Leibniz. Perhaps nowhere is this more clearly displayed than in his later writings, especially the Pancosmia section of the Nova … Philosophia and in his discussion of mathematical and physical space (Brickman, tr. 1943; Vedrine, ed. 1996).

In the Pancosmia Patrizi is intent upon replacing the four Aristotelian elements with his own alternatives – space, light, heat and humidity. Space (spatium) is viewed as preferable to the Aristotelian conception of “place”, construed as the inner surface of the body surrounding any object. Patrizi elevates the notion of space to make it the first principle of the corporeal world. Space is construed as prior to all bodies, even light, and constitutes two distinct realms. Mundane space is finite in extent and contains the physical cosmos. It is surrounded in turn by an infinite external space empty of all bodies. The universe consists of three separate worlds: the “Empyrean”, an infinite space filled with light; the “Aetheric”, which contains all the stars and other heavenly bodies down to the Moon; and the “Elementary”, which embraces the sublunar realm. Patrizi holds that the stars and planets move freely through the aether, doing away with the fixed celestial spheres which had dominated cosmology from antiquity and had even been accepted by Copernicus.

One can easily see numerous sources in the history of science which may have influenced Patrizi's conception of the universe. The infinity of space and the existence of a vacuum were maintained by the ancient atomists, and, as noted, the centrality of light as an intermediary level between the corporeal and incorporeal has solid roots in the Platonic tradition. In some ways Patrizi's cosmology may well reveal the influence of similar attacks on the Aristotelian position put forward by his contemporary and correspondent, Bernardino Telesio of Cosenza. But it is equally clear that his system represents his own unique blend of metaphysics and physics. He does not embrace a Brunonian schema which couples the notion of an infinite universe with that of an infinite number of world-systems spread throughout it. Patrizi's universe is still geocentric, though it places the Earth at the center of an infinite expanse of light-filled space beyond the material realm. And although it rejects the Sun-centered universe, it does accept the Earth's diurnal rotation. An innovative production, it could hardly help but influence later theories (Filippona La Bruna 1965; Grant 1981; Petković 2002).

Another fundamental distinction Patrizi introduces is that between mathematical and physical space, a view which will have profound import for the main figures identified with early modern thought, such as Galileo, Kepler, Newton, Descartes and Leibniz. In Patrizi's system, mathematical space is a pure reality, ontologically prior to all bodies; its primary unit is the geometrical point. Physical space, on the other hand, contains bodies, which are not purely three-dimensional geometrical forms, but provide the additional factor of resistance, a view which can be seen as anticipating Leibniz's addition of the notion of force to Descartes' conception of bodies as geometrically definable (Kristeller 1964, 123). Thus Patrizi can be counted among the Renaissance thinkers such as Jacopo Mazzoni, Galileo's mentor at the University of Pisa, who posited mathematics as prior to physics and quite probably opened the doors to the mathematized physics which would come to dominate early modern science (Purnell 1972; Wallace 1998). Yet for Patrizi it is geometry which is the most valuable tool for the study of the physical world, not arithmetic. Perhaps oddly for someone with a background so deeply rooted in Platonism, Patrizi considered numbers to be merely products of thought, not constitutive or revelatory of the ultimate character of the natural world. Perhaps it would take the development of analytic geometry to alter such a view in due course.

Although space was put forward as the main principle of the physical, the three derivative principles also play important roles in Patrizi's model. The primary occupant of space is light; from it in turn heat is produced, which is construed as a formal and active principle. It is probably no coincidence that heat had been one of the three basic principles underlying his colleague Telesio's system of nature, together with cold and matter, although Telesio's was a qualitative rather than quantifiable universe, as Patrizi's would be. The final constituent of Patrizi's physics is humidity (fluor), which is passive and material and somewhat akin to the elements associated with pre-Socratic thinkers such as Empedocles.

In sum, then, given the innovative, retrospective, Platonic and Aristotelian/anti-Aristotelian aspects of Patrizi's thought, what is the best way to “categorize” him as a Renaissance philosopher? Humanist, scientist, mathematician, literary critic and poet, historian, engineer and utopian theorist, it is hard to find one category which fills the bill. Perhaps there is a message here, not just about Francesco Patrizi of Cherso but about many Renaissance thinkers of his day. Confronted by so many models from previous ages and seeking to discover the best means to move into the future, it is hardly surprising that many of the most open-minded thinkers of the time can best be viewed more appropriately as transitional figures, rather than Platonists, Aristotelians or “philosophers of nature” as many have been claimed to have been. For example, to characterize Patrizi as a “Renaissance Platonist” with such thinkers as Marsilio Ficino and Giovanni Pico della Mirandola is to ignore or understate the significant differences among them. And to see him as a “philosopher of nature” with such contemporaries as Bernardino Telesio and Giordano Bruno hardly fits as well. That he should be so hard to define – both looking back and looking forward – should not disturb us. He was, after all, a “Renaissance” thinker, helping to usher in a new age.

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