Notes to Epistemological Problems of Perception

1. Yet another way to refer to this same basic idea is to speak of objects with which we are acquainted (or, sometimes, directly acquainted). See Russell 1912, chapter 5; and Fumerton 1995, chapter 3.

2. For a fairly comprehensive but rather one-sided discussion of responses to the argument from illusion, see Austin 1962.

3. A further advantage often claimed for the adverbial theory is that it is compatible with materialist views of the mind: while it is clear that the brain does not contain entities having the properties ascribed to sense-data and at best obscure how it could stand in a relation of apprehension to such entities, there is no clear reason why a state of being appeared to silver-elliptical-ly could not just be a brain state. (To which it might be responded: (i) that we nonetheless have no real understanding of how it could be a brain state, of what specific physical features of a brain state would make it such a state of being appeared to; and (ii) that the absence of any clear difficulty here is simply a reflection of the obscurity of the nature of the supposed adverbial state.)

4. This term is my own coinage and not one that is generally used.

5. One major proponent of the sense-datum theory has advanced the argument that the adverbial theory cannot adequately capture all of the cases that can be described in terms of sense-data, in particular that it cannot adequately describe cases in which we experience a number of different apparent objects having a variety of different properties in a way that keeps straight which object has which property. Thus compare a case in which I am experiencing a red circle and a green square with one in which I am experiencing a green circle and a red square. In both cases, I might be said to be sensing or to be appeared to red-and-green-and-round-and-square-ly, thus apparently failing to capture the distinction between the two cases. And the suggestion is that only the sense-datum theory can successfully distinguish what is going on in such cases, by making explicit reference to each of the apparent objects. See Jackson 1977, pp. 64-68. But this objection seriously underestimates the resources available to the adverbial theory. In the cases in question, the adverbialist can say that I sense red-circle-and-green-square-ly in the first case and green-circle-and-red-square-ly in the second case, thus capturing the difference. More generally, if it is possible to capture the content of a particular immediate experience adequately in sense-datum terms, as the proponent of sense-data must agree that it is, then the adverbialist can construct a description that is equally adequate insofar as the present issue is concerned by simply making the entire sense-datum description the basis for his adverbial modifier, that is, by saying that the person is sensing or being appeared to [such and such sense-data]-ly, with the appropriate sense-datum description going into the brackets. The problems with understanding what such an adverbial modifier seem no greater here than for any other case—assuming, as a proponent of sense-data must, that the sense-datum description is itself intelligible.

6. It is harder to identify the historical sources of phenomenalism. Contrary to what is often suggested, Berkeley's “idealist” view (in Berkeley 1710 and 1713) is not in fact in any clear way an anticipation of phenomenalism, but rather in effect a curious version of representationalism, in which our perceptual ideas constitute partial representations of the much more complete picture of the material world constituted by God's much more complete ideas. The phenomenalist view is at least suggested, but never quite arrived at in Hume 1739-40, Part IV, Sections 2-4. Perhaps the earliest reasonably clear statement is Mill 1865.

7. Or the features reflected in immediately experienced adverbial contents. But, as noted above, I will mostly leave this alternative formulation to be supplied by the reader.

8. There is also, as briefly mentioned earlier, a second fairly widely advocated argument for phenomenalism, one that starts from the premise that all intelligible ideas or concepts are derived by “abstraction” from immediate experience, so that we arguably could not even understand the idea of objects existing outside of that experience. If this were so, and if (as again seems obvious) we do understand the idea or concept of a physical or material object, then it would follow that this idea or concept is not about trans-experiential objects, but can only be about some feature or aspect of experience itself. The problem with this argument is that the initial premise about the derivation of concepts is far less obviously correct than is the claim that we do in fact have ideas or concepts, indeed lots of them, that are about things outside immediate experience — making it far more reasonable to reject the conclusion of this argument than to accept the initial premise.

9. See Ayer 1946-7 for a discussion of this example (in the context of a defense of phenomenalism.

10. For a much, much more extensive discussion of this general sort of point, see Price 1950. A very condensed summary of Price's account is offered in BonJour 2000.

11. For a good discussion of the general representationalist argument, especially with reference to the causal regularities in the material world, see Whiteley 1959. Whiteley, however, eventually arrives at a more extreme view according to which material objects explain our experience but cannot be known to have any of the properties actually manifested in that experience.

12. Locke adds solidity to the list of primary qualities. What he has in mind by this is not entirely clear, but solidity seems to be either the feeling of resistance that a rigid object produces when touched (in which case, it seems to belong with the secondary qualities) or else the causal capacity of preventing other objects from occupying the same space (in which case it is a causal property, what Locke calls a “power,” and again not a primary quality on a par with the others, all of which are directly present in experience).

13. Sometimes philosophers appeal in such discussions to a general standard of simplicity, according to which it is just a fundamental principle that the simpler explanation is more likely to be true. The problem with this is twofold: first, the justification or rationale for the principle in question is anything but clear; and, second, the way in which it would apply to the case with which we are concerned is at least debatable, since Berkeley's explanation, for example, might be claimed to be simpler on the grounds that it invokes only one entity, albeit an extremely complicated one, rather than the many objects that make up a material world.

14. Perhaps the most explicit and detailed attempt to defend the second direct realist thesis, while still accepting the view that material objects are not literally contained in or features of experience is to be found in Huemer 2001. But for Huemer, paradoxically enough, the distinctively perceptual character of the experience in question turns out to be largely irrelevant to the issue of justification.

15. The classic presentation of externalist reliabilism is Goldman 1986. See also Dretske 1981 and, for an earlier version of the same general approach with more explicit consideration of perception, Dretske 1969.

Copyright © 2007 by
Laurence BonJour

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free