Notes to Personal Autonomy

1. Frankfurt has modified his original account many times. Thus, for example, he has responded to the sort of regress worries mentioned later in the entry by appealing, first, to an agent's “decisive commitments,” and more recently, to her “satisfaction” with her motives -- an absence of “restlessness or resistance” in response to their motivating force. (Frankfurt 1999b)

2. Whereas hierarchical accounts tend to reflect sympathies with Hume's philosophy of mind, Watson explicitly allies himself with Plato.

3. Caring, Jaworska explains, “combines various individual emotions into a complex structure, [synthesizing and organizing] disparate elements of one's psychic life” (Jaworska 2009, 92). It is, she continues, a sufficient basis for being a “self” that is capable of “autonomous self-governance.” She notes, however, that this is not enough to “express autonomy in particular choices”(99).

4. Bernard Berofsky calls attention to the fact that there is support “across a broad spectrum” of theorizing in psychology and psychiatry for the idea that certain inner states undermine autonomy by creating “barriers to objectivity.” They do this, he explains, by “persisting in a way that removes them from experiential review and the influence of newly acquired information.” (Berofsky 1995, p. 199) Though Fischer and Ravizza, Wolf, and Nelkin argue that responsiveness to reasons is necessary condition of moral responsibility, in presenting and defending their views, they suggest that unless an agent satisfies this condition, she does not really govern herself. As Wolf puts it, they are interested in the “relation to one's will which is necessary in order for one's actions … to be ‘up to oneself' in the way that is necessary for responsibility.” (4) (Note that Wolf reserves the term ‘autonomy' for one particular conception of this self-relation: the incompatibilist view that an agent's control over her behavior must be “ultimate” — that “her will must be determined by her self, and her self must not, in turn, be determined by anything external to itself” (10).) According to Wolf, responsiveness to reasons is a necessary supplement to a coherentist condition: “a person's status as a responsible agent rests not only on her ability to make her behavior conform to her deepest values but also on her ability to form, assess, and revise those values on the basis of a recognition and appreciation of … the True and the Good.” In stressing that an autonomous agent “must be in a position that allows her reasons to be governed by what reasons there are… [i.e.,] by what is valuable and worthless” (117-118), Wolf evokes a tradition that goes back to Plato. But she rejects the Platonic conception of values as “things” that can be “apprehended by some special faculty” (123). Fischer and Ravizza likewise try to steer clear of controversial metaethical assumptions. “Regular reasons-receptivity” is, they argue, essential to having “guidance control” over one's action. “It involves a pattern of actual and hypothetical recognition of reasons (some of which are moral reasons) that is understandable by some appropriate external observer. And the pattern must be at least minimally grounded in reality.” (90) (For more on the metaphysics of reasons, see note 10.) Unlike Wolf, Fischer and Ravizza do not think that reasons responsiveness suffices for moral responsibility. They believe that in order for an agent to “own” the reasons-responsive mechanism that produces his action, he must “take responsibility” for it. To do this, he must “see himself as an agent” and “accept that he is a fair target of the reactive attitudes as a result of how he exercises this agency in certain contexts” (210-211). (For more on the relation between moral responsibility and autonomy, see note 17.)

5. The appeal of the reasons-responsive approach may also reflect a failure to distinguish governing oneself from exercising control over one's life. Whether one's future circumstances are likely to constrain the options one would like to have surely depends on whether one's present actions are responsive to the reasons for and against acting this way. Even if, however, one cannot exercise control over one's destiny if one lacks control over how one acts at any given time, exercising control over how one acts is perfectly compatible with making choices that leave one with very limited options. (The conception of autonomous agency as a capacity for shaping one's life as a whole features prominently in discussions of applied ethics.)

6. On this view autonomy is “achieved when the individual subjects the norms with which he or she is confronted to critical evaluation and then proceeds to reach practical decisions by way of independent and rational reflection” (Young 1986). In other words, one's conduct is autonomous only if one exercises “assorted introspective, imaginative, reasoning, and volitional skills” (Meyers 1987). In refining and defending this conception, Mele argues that an autonomous agent must be capable of reflecting critically upon her desires, and of altering them in light of this reflection. Similarly, Christman stresses the importance of the autonomous agent's ability to reflect (in a “minimally rational” way) on the process whereby she acquired a given desire. He argues that someone acts autonomously when she is moved by a given desire only if she would not reject the desire if she reflected on its genesis.) Some such procedural requirement is often grafted onto coherentist accounts. Thus, in his early work, Gerald Dworkin argues that someone who identifies with his motives lacks autonomy if this identification reflects the fact that he has “been influenced in decisive ways by others in such a fashion that we are not prepared to think of it as his own choice” (Dworkin 1976, 25). (In later work, Dworkin suggests that an autonomous agent need not actually identify with her motives as long as she is capable of altering her preferences in light of her uncompelled reflection. (Dworkin 1988, 17))

7. As Dworkin puts it, what is necessary for autonomy is “some ability both to alter one's preferences and to make them effective in one's actions” (Dworkin 1988).

8. In discussing this phenomenon, Frankfurt coins the term “volitional necessity.” He believes that the experience of being incapable of willing to do otherwise is not only compatible with governing one's own actions, but is the best indication of where one stands, and so is the surest symptom that one is the power behind one's exercise of authority. See also note 15 and the associated text.

9. Note that it is possible to endorse this response while rejecting the assumption that reasoning is a mode of gaining access to an independent order of reasons. Kant argues, for example, that our commitment to acting for reasons is a commitment to accepting certain principles of reasoning as constraints on what we have reason to do. On this account, whatever moves us to reason in a way that violates these principles prevents us from appreciating the reason-giving force of certain facts. But on this account, we fail to govern ourselves when we fail to respond to these reasons only because responding to these reasons just is responding to demands we impose on ourselves. (One point of clarification is worth adding to this overly brief summary: In order to avoid the implication that no one is accountable for doing things she has good reason not to do, Kant appeals to the wrongdoer's ungrounded choice to defy the laws of her own reason. (See Kant 1793) Similar concerns push some reasons-responsive theorists closer to the incompatibilist position mentioned later in the entry. Thus, for example, Wolf argues that no one is accountable for her failure to respond to reasons if her action was causally determined by conditions over which she had no control. (Wolf 1980).)

10. Relational accounts generally focus less on the constituents of autonomous agency than on the conditions under which it is possible for someone to be an autonomous agent. But some philosophers who appeal to the importance of social relations argue that we cannot distinguish the mental states that are internal to an agent's point of view from those that are external without appealing to her social relations (see, for example, Oshana); and some of these philosophers stress, in particular, the role that a shared understanding of what is important plays in determining whether the influence of a given attitude or standing disposition is attributable to the agent herself (Anderson 2003).

11. Much of the debate over the relationship between causal determinism, on the one hand, and autonomy, free will, and moral responsibility, on the other, focuses on the modal argument that is at the heart of van Inwagen's defense of incompatibilism. According to this argument, no one is accountable for what she does if her action is causally determined by past conditions over which she had no control. On Kane's account, the desire to be an autonomous agent is the desire to have “the power to be the ultimate producers of [one's] own ends… the power to make choices which can only and finally be explained in terms of [one's] own [will] (i.e., character, motives, and efforts of will).” “No one,” he argues, “can have this power in a determined world.” (254)

12. According to Velleman, intentions are a special sort of belief that the agent has the power to make true. “Our expectation of doing something embodies an invention rather than a discovery. For we can simply adopt the expectation that we're going to do any one of the things for which we have some antecedent motives, and this expectation will modify the balance of forces so as to make itself true. We are thus in a position to make up our forthcoming behavior. Making up what we will do is, in fact, our way of making up our minds to do it.” (24)Without endorsing Velleman's suggestion that reasons for action are ultimately explanatory reasons, Anderson and Lux also defend a knowledge criterion of autonomy. An agent, they argue, is not “genuinely self-governing” if she does not understand “the extent to which [she] has the capacities required” to do what she intends to do. (Anderson and Lux)

13. Attempts to make sense of weakness of will go back to Plato and Aristotle. For some more recent discussions, see Davidson 1980, Watson 1977, Bratman 1979, Mele 1995, Buss 1997 and Stroud and Tappolet 2003. (Recently, Richard Holton has pointed out that there is a familiar conception of weakness of will according to which it is not a failure to conform to one's contemporaneous all-things-considered evaluative judgment but a failure to follow through on an earlier resolution. (See Holton 1999))

14. The example is Frankfurt's (Frankfurt 2002b). The mother, he says, may be “glad to be putting her need for the relationship above what is best by a measure that she now refuses to regard as decisive” (163). More generally, Frankfurt argues that “the fact that something is important to someone is a circumstance that naturally has its causes, but it may neither originate in, nor be at all supported by, reasons. It may simply be a brute fact, which is not derived from any assessment or appreciation whatever” (161). “Suppose,” Frankfurt elsewhere writes, “I were to conclude for some reason that it is not desirable for me to seek the well-being of my children. I suspect that I would continue to love them and to care about their well-being anyhow. This discrepancy between my judgment and my desire would not show that I had become alienated from the desire.” (Frankfurt 2002, 223) For a thorough discussion of Frankfurt's position, see Watson 2002.

15. Velleman has expressed reservations about identifying the constitutive aim of rational agency with the disposition to govern one's own behavior. But Christine Korsgaard has defended this Kantian idea. (See Korsgaard 2009.) For a very brief comment on the role that the commitment to being governed by reason plays in Kant's own account, see note 10. Note the very special sense in which, according to Kant, no rational agent can dissociate herself from this commitment: she cannot do so without contradicting herself.

16. This is not an entry on moral responsibility. As earlier references and the bibliography indicate, however, there is an intimate connection between moral responsibility and the phenomenon under discussion here: the minimal conditions of self-governing actions -- the conditions that distinguish these actions from everything else we intentionally do -- are the conditions an agent must satisfy in order to be accountable for the motivating force of whatever psychological states causally determine her intentions. This means that insofar as debates about the necessary conditions of moral responsibility are not debates about the conditions under which a morally responsible agent is blameworthy or praiseworthy for what she does, they are central to the topic of this entry. If philosophers suggest otherwise, this is because they are not talking about the minimal conditions under which agents qualify as “self-governing” (see Fischer 2012) and/or because they do not believe that there is any metaphysical condition on moral responsibility. According to the second alternative, whether someone is praiseworthy or blameworthy does not depend on whether she has determined her own action in some special way. (For a highly influential defense of this position, see Strawson, P.F. See also note 18.)

17. Note that to be “accountable” is not necessarily to satisfy the conditions that justify others in holding one accountable. As Gary Watson points out, holding someone accountable for wrongdoing involves reacting adversely to this person; and this means that whether one is justified in holding someone accountable depends on whether it is fair to react adversely to what she does. The answer to this question may depend on more than whether she governs her action. It may depend, for example, on whether she has the conceptual capacities we expect a moral agent to exercise. (See Watson 2004) Note further that some philosophers (most notably P. F. Strawson) have argued that there is no important conception of accountability according to which the judgment that someone is praiseworthy or blameworthy presupposes the further judgment that she has determined her own action in some special way. This skepticism appears to be supported by the very concerns raised in this section: if we cannot spell out the special metaphysical condition that renders agents accountable for their actions, then it is tempting to conclude that whether someone is accountable for her actions is not a metaphysical matter after all. (For an exploration of the Strawsonian approach to moral responsibility, see Watson 1993. For a more recent attempt to develop a Strawsonian approach, see Wallace 1994. See also Arpaly 2006.)

18. Buss 2012 responds to the challenge identified here with an account that differs from the four highlighted in this entry. On this account, whether the causal influences on an agent's reasoning are attributable to the agent herself depends on whether they satisfy a normative condition: an agent is prevented from governing herself only if she forms her intention under the decisive influence of mental states that are at odds with her identity as a representative human being; and a mental state satisfies this condition if and only if its influence tends to be at odds with the conditions under which human beings function minimally well.

19. Thomas Reid is an early champion of this approach. For an attempt to work out a rigorous incompatibilist conception of autonomy that does not appeal to the notion of agent causation, see Kane 1996.

20. Some psychologists believe that the experimental evidence supports this hypothesis: the experience as of being in control of our actions is, they claim, an illusion; by the time it seems to us that we are initiating an action, the physiological events that suffice to cause this action have already occurred. (For the classic experiments, see Libet, Gleason, Wright, and Pearl 1983; Libet, Wright, and Gleason 1983; and Libet 1985. For a more recent argument along these lines, see Wegner 2002.) This interpretation of the data can be challenged in various ways. (See, for example, Mele 2004, 2009) Perhaps more importantly, even if the experience as of governing one's action were illusory, the causal story of how we come to be mistaken would not address the conceptual issue addressed in this entry: what sort of self-relation is necessary and sufficient for governing ourselves?

21. See Kant 1785. As Bok explains,

When I act for reasons, the events that cause me to act as I do might be external to me, but the reasons that I regard as determining what I do cannot be. For while, qua event, my acceptance of some reason for action might or might not ultimately be caused by something outside myself, in regarding it as a reason for action I must regard it as having a justification that is independent of those causes. This justification might at various points appeal to theoretical claims. But I cannot regard it, qua justification, as having been produced or foisted on me by any natural event. When I consider it as a justification, I consider not its causal origins but its rational grounds; and I accept or reject it on that basis. When I explain what leads me to accept it, I will adduce not the causes that led me to do so, but the reasons that convinced me that it was sound. Because any reasons I adduce must themselves be reasons I accept, this type of explanation will not ultimately lead me to adduce determining factors that I do not regard as my own.(206)

For essentially the same point in a less Kantian context, see D.M. McKay 1960 and 1973, and Hampshire 1983. Like others, they point out that the question “How will A act?” has no determinate answer for A until she decides how to act. What is a simple fact from the perspective of a third-person observer is not a fact from the perspective of the agent herself. Similarly, David Velleman argues that the freedom that counts where autonomous agency is concerned is epistemic freedom with respect to one's alternatives. (Velleman 2000)

This essential formal feature of the practical point of view is at the center of most existentialist conceptions of human agency. Thus, for example, Jean-Paul Sartre claims that “[M]otives are only for consciousness. And due to the very fact that the motive can arise only as appearance, it constitutes itself as ineffective. … [C]onsciousness is not subject to it because of the very fact that consiciousness posits it; for consciousness has now the task of conferring on the motive its meaning and its importance.” (Sartre 1956, 71)

22. As note 17 indicates, this difficulty is closely related to the difficulty of identifying necessary and sufficient conditions of moral responsibility. Many philosophers have responded to the latter challenge by rejecting the assumption that our interest in moral responsibility is an interest in a single phenomenon. Since Watson 1996, there has been considerable discussion of the relationship between (1) the claim that an action is “attributable to” an agent; (2) the claim that an agent is “answerable for” her action and (3) the claim that an agent is “accountable for” her action. (See, for example, Shoemaker 2012.) Many philosophers believe that the range of answers people give to survey questions also challenge the assumption that “moral responsibility” is “a unified concept.” (See Doris, Knobe, & Woolfolk, Knobe and Doris. For a summary of, and response to, this interpretation of the survey results, see Nelkin 2007.) Disagreements on this point complicate disagreements over particular accounts of moral responsibility. Though this entry does not address these disagreements, it does assume that there is a special sense in which only autonomous actions can be attributed to those who perform them, and it assumes that agents whose acts are attributable to them in this sense (and only such agents) are accountable for what they do. (Note that it does not follow that attributability is sufficient for punishing wrongdoing—or even expressing negative attitudes to the one who does wrong. Other considerations will be relevant to whether this sort of reaction is justified.)

Copyright © 2013 by
Sarah Buss <sbuss@umich.edu>

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