Supplement to Peter Damian

Mistakes in some passages in O.J. Blum's translation (1998) of De divina omnipotentia

(Italics added.)

p. 353, n. 21 (601C):
And now I feel obliged to respond to an argument which, on the subject of this controversy, many put forward on the strength of the opinion of your holiness. (Ad illud postremo quod in hac disputandi materia plures obiciunt, sub sanctitatis tuae iudicio uideo respondendum.)

Should read: “And now I feel obliged to respond -- subject to the judgment of your holiness -- to an argument which ...”.

Blum's translation implies that the question about undoing the done had been suggested by Abbot Didier's view that God cannot restore virginity. In fact, it had been suggested by Damian's view that God is capable of everything. Damian submits the discussion that follows to the judgment of Abbot Didier. Cf. Section 6.

p. 357, n. 27 (603D):

Surely, it is obvious to all that, if one should trust these arguments based on the meaning of words, the power of God would appear impotent on many occasions. (Quis enim manifeste non uideat quia, si argumentationibus istis, ut sese ordo uerborum habet, fides adhibetur, diuina uirtus in temporum quibusque momentis inpotens ostendatur?)

Should read: “Who would not clearly see that if these arguments are to be trusted as stated, then divine power is shown to be impotent at any moment of time?”

Damian's point is to say that if we trust the arguments in question, and take the statements in them at face-value, the power of God would appear to be impotent at all moments of time (not only regarding the past, but also regarding the present and the future). Cf. Section 5.1.

p. 364, n. 41 (608B):

So tell me, please: in relation to the past, does God have the power to cause something not to have happened that has happened; or in respect to the present, to cause something now existing, so long as it exists, not to exist, or what will certainly take place, that it will not take place, or, on the other hand, is all the contrary true, which would seem to me deserving of abomination rather than being put to writing? (Age ergo, dic quomodo potest Deus facere de praeteritis ut quod factum est factum non fuerit, uel de praesenti quod nunc est, quamdiu est, ut non sit, uel quod omnino futurum est ut futurum non sit, uel rursus haec omnia per contrarium. Quae nobis profecto execrationi potius uidentur esse tradenda quam stilo.)

Should read: “Tell me, then: how can God make it, concerning the past, that what has been done has not been done, or, concerning the present, that what now exists, as long as it exists, does not exist, or that what will certainly exist will not exist, or all these things the other way around? These questions would seem to me to be deserving condemnation rather than being committed to paper.”

Damian's point is to ask his opponent, ironically, how God is able to cause something not to have happened that has happened, and so on in different tenses, or, the other way around, how God is able to cause something to have happened that has not happened, and so on in different tenses. In Damian's view, asking questions of this sort is impious. Cf. Section 5.1.

p. 365, n. 44 (609A):

Is it not the case, therefore, that from this the power of God appears to be the greater and more wonderful in that it is judged by wise fools to be weak and impotent? If, then, whatever is comes from him, he has given to things such an energy for existing, that after once they have existed, it is impossible for them not to have existed. (Vnde ergo Dei uirtus potentior et mirabilior esse perpenditur, inde a stulte sapientibus inpos et inualida iudicatur. Si enim quicquid est ab ipso est, ipse rebus hanc uim existentiae contulit ut postquam semel extiterint, non extitisse non possint.)

Should read: “Therefore, on the basis of those things from which God's power is seen to be greater and more admirable, the people who ineptly conceive of it judge it to be weak and impotent. For if whatever exists comes from him, he has given to things such a force to exist that after once they have existed, it is impossible for them not to have existed.”

Damian's point is to say that what the people who do not properly understand it see as a limitation to divine power is really an expression of his power, i.e., the constancy of the created history is an expression of God's power and not a symptom of his weakness. Cf. Section 5.1.

p. 369, n. 53 (611B-C):

To be sure, it is more wondrous and more imminently excellent that a virgin remain inviolate after giving birth than that one after losing her integrity should recover her virginal purity after its loss, because it is more difficult for one to enter after the doors were shut than to be enclosed by doors that had just been opened. (Et certe mirabilius est et ualde praecellentius uirginem incorruptam manere post partum, quam corruptam ad uirginale decus redire post lapsum, quia et maius est quemlibet clausis ianuis ingredi, quam eas quae patuerant ianuas claudi.)

Should read: “... , because it is more difficult for one to enter through closed doors than to close the doors that have been opened.”

Damian here compares virgin birth to going through doors without opening them and restoration of virginity to closing doors that have been opened. Cf. Section 4.

p. 370, n. 57 (612A-B):

This impossibility, moreover, is properly maintained in reference to the needs of nature. But God forbid that it be applied to divine majesty;... (Haec porro inpossibilitas recte quidem dicitur si ad naturae referatur inopiam; absit autem ut ad maiestatem sit applicanda diuinam.)

Should read: “This impossibility, then, is indeed rightly affirmed if it is attributed to the lack of means of nature, but on no account should it be applied to the divine majesty.”

For a discussion of this passage, see Section 2.

p. 384, n. 81 (620D):

This is especially so since I have judged that nothing more remains to be done about the subject of this dispute but by adducing the truth to reject the false accusation brought against me of having claimed too much for the power of God. (Praesertim dum super hac disputandi materia nil aliud nobis attinere decernimus, nisi ut ex inpotentia Dei deuolutam super nos calumniam ueritatis allegationibus repellamus.)

Should read: “... the false accusation brought against me regarding God's powerlessness.”

Damian was not accused of having claimed too much for the power of God, but of having claimed too little. His opponents thought that if we maintain that God is omnipotent in all things, we should also maintain that God can undo the done, which Damian did not want to assert. At this point, nothing more remains to be done about the subject of the dispute; Damian has already said enough to clear his own reputation which was his main objective in De divina omnipotentia. Cf. Section 2, Section 6.

(The author wishes to thank Gyula Klima for help with the translations.)

Copyright © 2012 by
Toivo J. Holopainen <>

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