#### Supplement to Experiment in Physics

## Appendix 5: Right Experiment, Wrong Theory: The Stern-Gerlach Experiment

From the time of Ampere onward, molecular currents were regarded as
giving rise to magnetic moments. In the nuclear model of the atom the
electron orbits the nucleus. This circular current results in a
magnetic moment. The atom behaves as if it were a tiny magnet. In the
Stern-Gerlach experiment a beam of silver atoms passed through an
inhomogeneous magnetic field
(Figure 12).
In Larmor's classical theory there was no preferential direction for
the direction of the magnetic moment and so one predicted that the beam
of silver atoms would show a maximum in the center of the beam. In
Sommerfeld's quantum theory an atom in a state with angular momentum
equal to one (L = 1) would have a magnetic moment with two components
relative to the direction of the magnetic field,
±eh/4m_{e}. (Bohr had argued that only two spatial
components were allowed). In an inhomogeneous magnetic field, H, the
force on the magnetic moment µ will be µ_{z} x
(Gradient of the magnetic field in the z direction), where
µ_{z} = ± eh/4m_{e}, where e is the charge
of the electron, m_{e} is its mass, h is Planck's constant, and
z is the field direction. Thus, depending on the orientation of the
magnetic moment relative to the magnetic field there will be either an
attractive or repulsive force and the beam will split into two
components, exhibiting spatial quantization. There will be a minimum at
the center of the beam. "According to quantum theory
µ_{z} can only be ± (e/2m_{e})(h/2π).
In this case the spot on the receiving plate will therefore be split
into two, each of them having the same size but half the intensity of
the original spot" (Stern 1921, p. 252, JM) This difference in
prediction between the Larmor and Sommerfeld theories was what Stern
and Gerlach planned to use to distinguish between the two theories.
Stern remarked that "the experiment, if it can be carried out, (will
result) in a clear-cut decision between the quantum-theoretical and the
classical view" (Stern 1921, FW).

Sommerfeld's theory also acted as an enabling theory for the
experiment. It provided an estimate of the size of the magnetic moment
of the atoms so that Stern could begin calculations to see if the
experiment was feasible. Stern calculated, for example, that a magnetic
field gradient of 10^{4} Gauss per centimeter would be
sufficient to produce deflections that would give detectable
separations of the beam components. He asked Gerlach if he could
produce such a gradient. Gerlach responded affirmatively, and said he
could do even better. The experiment seemed feasible. A sketch of the
apparatus is shown in
Figure 12.
The silver
atoms pass through the inhomogeneous magnetic field. If the beam is
spatially quantized, as Sommerfeld predicted, two spots should be
observed on the screen. (The sketch shows the beam splitting into three
components, which would be expected in modern quantum theory for an
atom with angular momentum equal to one). I note that Sommerfeld's
theory was incorrect, illustrating the point that an enabling theory
need not be correct to be useful.

A preliminary result reported by Stern and Gerlach did not show
splitting of the beam into components. It did, however, show a
broadened beam spot. They concluded that although they had not
demonstrated spatial quantization, they had provided "evidence that the
silver atom possesses a magnetic moment." Stern and Gerlach made
improvements in the apparatus, particularly in replacing a round beam
slit by a rectangular one that gave a much higher intensity. The
results are shown in
Figure 13
(Gerlach and
Stern 1922a). There is an intensity minimum in the center of the
pattern, and the separation of the beam into two components is clearly
seen. This result seemed to confirm Sommerfeld's quantum-theoretical
prediction of spatial quantization. Pauli, a notoriously skeptical
physicist, remarked, "Hopefully now even the incredulous Stern will be
convinced about directional quantization" (in a letter from Pauli to
Gerlach 17 February 1922). Pauli's view was shared by the physics
community. Nevertheless the Stern-Gerlach result posed a problem for
the Bohr-Sommerfeld theory of the atom. Stern and Gerlach had assumed
that the silver atoms were in an angular momentum state with angular
momentum equal to one (L = 1). In fact, the atoms are in an L = 0
state, for which no splitting of the beam would be expected in either
the classical or the quantum theory. Stern and Gerlach had not
considered this possibility. Had they done so they might not have done
the experiment. The later, or new, quantum theory developed by
Heisenberg, Schrodinger, and others, predicted that for an L = 1 state
the beam should split into three components as shown in
Figure 12.
The magnetic moment of the atom
would be either 0 or ± eh/(4π x m). Thus, if the silver atoms
were in an L = 1 state as Stern and Gerlach had assumed, their result,
showing two beam components, also posed a problem for the new quantum
theory. This was solved when Uhlenbeck and Goudsmit (1925, 1926)
proposed that the electron had an intrinsic angular momentum or spin
equal to h/4π. This is analogous to the earth having orbital angular
momentum about the sun and also an intrinsic angular momentum due to
its rotation on its own axis. In an atom the electron will have a total
angular momentum **J** = **L + S**, where
**L** is the orbital angular momentum and
**S** is the spin of the electron. For silver atoms in an
L = 0 state the electron would have only its spin angular momentum and
one would expect the beam to split into two components. Goudsmit and
Uhlenbeck suggested the idea of electron spin to explain features in
atomic spectra such as the anomalous Zeeman effect, the splitting of
spectral lines in a magnetic field into more components than could be
accommodated by the Bohr-Sommerfeld theory of the atom. Although the
Stern-Gerlach results were known, and would certainly have provided
strong support for the idea of electron spin, Goudsmit and Uhlenbeck
made no mention of the result.

The Stern-Gerlach experiment was initially regarded as a crucial test between the classical theory of the atom and the Bohr-Sommerfeld theory. In a sense it was, because it showed clearly that spatial quantization existed, a phenomenon that could be accommodated only within a quantum mechanical theory. It decided between the two classes of theories, the classical and the quantum mechanical. With respect to the particular quantum theory of Bohr and Sommerfeld, however, it wasn't crucial, although it was regarded as such at the time, because that theory predicted no splitting for a beam of silver atoms in the ground state (L = 0). The theory had been wrongly applied. The two-component result was also problematic for the new quantum theory, which also predicts no splitting for an angular momentum zero state and three components for an L = 1 state. Only after the suggestion of electron spin did the Stern-Gerlach result confirm the new theory.

Although the interpretation of the experimental result was incorrect for a time, the result itself remained quite robust through the theory change from the old to the new quantum theory. It is important to remember that experimental results do not change when accepted theory changes, although certainly, as we have seen, their interpretation may change. Gerlach and Stern emphasized this point themselves.

Apart from any theory, it can be stated, as a pure result of the
experiment, and as far as the exactitude of our experiments allows us
to say so, that silver atoms in a magnetic field have only *two
discrete* values of the component of the magnetic moment in the
direction of the field strength; both have the same absolute value with
each half of the atoms having a positive and a negative sign
respectively (Gerlach and Stern 1924, pp. 690-691, FW)

Experimental results, as well as experiments, also have a life of their own, independent of theory.