Intertheory Relations in Physics

First published Tue Jan 2, 2001; substantive revision Mon Jun 25, 2012

Many issues in the philosophy of science concern the nature of theories and certain relations that may obtain between them. Typically, one is interested in the degree to which a successor to a given theory “goes beyond” (both descriptively and explanatorily) the theory it succeeds. Most often these issues are framed in the context of reductive relations between theories. When does a theory T′ reduce to a theory T? How is one to understand the nature of this reduction relation? Interestingly, there are two distinct, yet, related ways of understanding the reductive relationship between T and T′. Thomas Nickles noted this in a paper entitled “Two Concepts of Intertheoretic Reduction.” On the one hand, there is the “philosopher's” sense of reduction on which the supplanted theory is said to reduce to the newer more encompassing theory. On the other hand, the “physicist's” sense of reduction puts things the other way. The newer, typically more refined theory is said to reduce to the older typically less encompassing theory in some sort of limit. These two senses of reduction will be discussed in turn.

1. Philosopher's Sense of Reduction

Most contemporary discussions of reductive relations between a pair of theories owe considerable debt to the work by Ernest Nagel. In The Structure of Science, Nagel asserts that “[r]eduction … is the explanation of a theory or a set of experimental laws established in one area of inquiry, by a theory usually though not invariably formulated for some other domain.” (Nagel, 1961, p. 338) The general schema here is as follows:

  • T reduces T′ just in case the laws of T′ are derivable from those of T.

Showing how these derivations are possible for “paradigm” examples of intertheoretic reduction turns out to be rather difficult.

Nagel distinguishes two types of reductions on the basis of whether or not the vocabulary of the reduced theory is a subset of the reducing theory. If it is—that is, if the reduced theory T′ contains no descriptive terms not contained in the reducing theory T, and the terms of T′ are understood to have approximately the same meanings that they have in T, then Nagel calls the reduction of T′ by T “homogeneous.” In this case, while the reduction may very well be enlightening in various respects, and is part of the “normal development of a science,” most people believe that there is nothing terribly special or interesting from a philosophical point of view going on here. (Nagel, 1961, p. 339.)

Lawrence Sklar (1967, p. 110–111) points out that, from a historical perspective, this attitude is somewhat naive. The number of actual cases in the history of science where a genuine homogeneous reduction takes place are few and far between. Nagel, himself, took as a paradigm example of homogeneous reduction, the reduction of the Galilean laws of falling bodies to Newtonian mechanics. But, as Sklar points out, what actually can be derived from the Newtonian theory are approximations to the laws of the reduced Galilean theory. The approximations, of course, are strictly speaking incompatible with the actual laws and so, despite the fact that no concepts appear in the Galilean theory that do not also appear in the Newtonian theory, there is no deductive derivation of the laws of the one from the laws of the other. Hence, strictly speaking, there is no reduction on the deductive Nagelian model.

One way out of this problem for the proponent of Nagel-type reductions is to make a distinction between explaining a theory (or explaining the laws of a given theory) and explaining it away. (Sklar, 1967, pp. 112–113) Thus, we may still speak of reduction if the derivation of the approximations to the reduced theory's laws serves to account for why the reduced theory works as well as it does in its (perhaps more limited) domain of applicability. This is consonant with more sophisticated versions of Nagel-type reductions in which part of the very process of reduction involves revisions to the reduced theory. This process arises as a natural consequence of trying to deal with what Nagel calls “heterogeneous” reductions.

The task of characterizing reduction is more involved when the reduction is heterogeneous—that is, when the reduced theory contains terms or concepts that do not appear in the reducing theory. Nagel takes, as a paradigm example of heterogeneous reduction, the (apparent) reduction of thermodynamics, or at least some parts of thermodynamics, to statistical mechanics.[1] For instance, thermodynamics contains the concept of temperature (among others) that is lacking in the reducing theory of statistical mechanics.

Nagel notes that “if the laws of the secondary science [the reduced theory] contain terms that do not occur in the theoretical assumptions of the primary discipline [the reducing theory] … , the logical derivation of the former from the latter is prima facie impossible.” (Nagel, 1961, p. 352) As a consequence, Nagel introduces two “necessary formal conditions” required for the reduction to take place:

  1. Connectability. “Assumptions of some kind must be introduced which postulate suitable relations between whatever is signified by ‘A’ [the term to be reduced, that is, an element of the vocabulary of theory T′] and traits represented by theoretical terms already present in the primary [reducing] science.”
  2. Derivability. “With the help of these additional assumptions, all the laws of the secondary science, including those containing the term ‘A,’ must be logically derivable from the theoretical premises and their associated coordinating definitions in the primary discipline.” (Nagel, 1961, pp. 353–354)

The connectability condition brings with it a number of interpretive problems. Exactly what is, or should be, the status of the “suitable relations,” often called bridge “laws” or bridge hypotheses? Are they established by linguistic investigation alone? Are they factual discoveries? If the latter, what sort of necessity do they involve? Are they identity relations that are contingently necessary or will some sort of weaker relation, such as nomic coextensivity, suffice? Much of the philosophical literature on reduction addresses these questions about the status of the bridge laws.[2]

The consideration of certain examples lends plausibility to the idea, prevalent in the literature, that the bridge laws should be considered to express some kind of identity relation. For instance, Sklar notes that the reduction of the “theory” of physical optics to the theory of electromagnetic radiation proceeds by identifying one class of entities — light waves — with (part of) another class — electromagnetic radiation. He says “… the place of correlatory laws [bridge laws] is taken by empirically established identifications of two classes of entities. Light waves are not correlated with electromagnetic waves, for they are electromagnetic waves.” (Sklar, 1967, p. 120) In fact, if something like Nagelian reduction is going to work, it is generally accepted that the bridge laws should reflect the existence of some kind of synthetic identity.

Kenneth Schaffner calls the bridge laws “reduction functions.” He too notes that they must be taken to reflect synthetic identities since, at least initially, they require empirical support for their justification. “Genes were not discovered to be DNA via the analysis of meaning; important and difficult empirical research was required to make such an identification.” (Schaffner, 1976. pp. 614–615)

Now one problem facing this sort of account was forcefully presented by Feyerabend in “Explanation, Reduction, and Empiricism.” (Feyerabend, 1962) Consider the term “temperature” as it functions in classical thermodynamics. This term is defined in terms of Carnot cycles and is related to the strict, nonstatistical second law as it appears in that theory. The so-called reduction of classical thermodynamics to statistical mechanics, however, fails to identify or associate nonstatistical features in the reducing theory, statistical mechanics, with the nonstatistical concept of temperature as it appears in the reduced theory. How can one have a genuine reduction, if terms with their meanings fixed by the role they play in the reduced theory get identified with terms having entirely different meanings? Classical thermodynamics is not a statistical theory. The very possibility of finding a reduction function or bridge law that captures the concept of temperature and the strict, nonstatistical, role it plays in the thermodynamics seems impossible.

The plausibility of this argument, of course, depends on certain views about how meaning accrues to theoretical terms in a theory. However, just by looking at the historical development of thermodynamics one thing seems fairly clear. Most physicists, now, would accept the idea that our concept of temperature and our conception of other “exact” terms that appear in classical thermodynamics such as “entropy,” need to be modified in light of the alleged reduction to statistical mechanics. Textbooks, in fact, typically speak of the theory of “statistical thermodynamics.” The very process of “reduction” often leads to a corrected version of the reduced theory.

In fact, Schaffner and others have developed sophisticated Nagelian type schemas for reduction that explicitly try to capture these features of actual theory change. The idea is explicitly to include in the model, the “corrected reduced theory” such as statistical thermodynamics. Thus, Schaffner (1976, p. 618) holds that T reduces T′ if and only if there is a corrected version of T′, call it T′* such that

  1. The primitive terms of T′* are associated via reduction functions (or bridge laws) with various terms of T.
  2. T′* is derivable from T when it is supplemented with the reduction functions specified in 1.
  3. T′* corrects T′ in that it makes more accurate predictions than does T′.
  4. T′ is explained by T in that T′ and T′* are strongly analogous to one another, and T indicates why T′ works as well as it does in its domain of validity.

Much work clearly is being done here by the intuitive conception of “strong analogy” between the reduced theory T′ and the corrected reduced theory T′*. In some cases, as suggested by Nickles (1973) and Wimsatt (1976), the conception of strong analogy may find further refinement by appeal to what was referred to as the “physicist's” sense of reduction.

2. Physicist's Sense of Reduction

Philosophical theories of reduction would have it that, say, quantum mechanics reduces classical mechanics through the derivation of the laws of classical physics from those of quantum physics. Most physicists would, on the other hand, speak of quantum mechanics reducing to classical mechanics in some kind of correspondence limit (e.g., the limit as Planck's constant (h/2π) goes to zero). Thus, the second type of intertheoretic reduction noted by Nickles fits the following schema:

Schema R: limε→0 Tf   = Tc

Here Tf is the typically newer, more fine theory, Tc is the typically older, coarser theory, and ε is a fundamental parameter appearing in Tf .

One must take the equality here with a small grain of salt. In those situations where Schema R can be said to hold, it is likely not the case that every equation or formula from Tf will yield a corresponding equation of Tc .

Even given this caveat, the equality in Schema R can hold only if the limit is “regular.” In such circumstances, it can be argued that it is appropriate to call the limiting relation a “reduction.” If the limit in Schema R is singular, however, the schema fails and it is best to talk simply about intertheoretic relations.

One should understand the difference between regular and singular limiting relations as follows. If the solutions of the relevant formulae or equations of the theory Tf are such that for small values of ε they smoothly approach the solutions of the corresponding formulas in Tc, then Schema R will hold. For these cases we can say that the “limiting behavior” as ε→0 equals the “behavior in the limit” where ε = 0. On the other hand, if the behavior in the limit is of a fundamentally different character than the nearby solutions one obtains as ε→0, then the schema will fail.

A nice example illustrating this distinction is the following: Consider the quadratic equation x2 + x − 9ε = 0. Think of ε as a small expansion or perturbation parameter. The equation has two roots for any value of ε as ε→0. In a well-defined sense, the solutions to this quadratic equation as ε→0 smoothly approach solutions to the “unperturbed” (ε = 0) equation x2 + x = 0; namely, x = 0, −1. On the other hand, the equation x2ε + x − 9 = 0 has two roots for any value of ε > 0 but has for its “unperturbed” solution only one root; namely, x = 9. The equation suffers a reduction in order when ε = 0. Thus, the character of the behavior in the limit ε = 0 differs fundamentally from the character of its limiting behavior. Not all singular limits result from reductions in order of the equations. Nevertheless, these latter singular cases are much more prevalent than the former.

A paradigm case where a limiting reduction of the form R rather straightforwardly holds is that of classical Newtonian particle mechanics (NM) and the special theory of relativity (SR). In the limit where (v/c)2→0, SR reduces to NM. Nickles says “epitomizing [the intertheoretic reduction of SR to NM] is the reduction of the Einsteinian formula for momentum,

p   =   m0v / √ (1 − (v/c)2)

where m0 is the rest mass, to the classical formula p = m0v in the limit as v→0.”[3] (Nickles, 1973, p. 182)

This is a regular limit—there are no singularities or “blowups” as the asymptotic limit is approached. As noted one way of thinking about this is that the exact solutions for small but nonzero values of |ε| “smoothly [approach] the unperturbed or zeroth-order solution [ε set identically equal to zero] as ε→0.” In the case where the limit is singular “the exact solution for ε = 0 is fundamentally different in character from the ‘neighboring’ solutions obtained in the limit ε→0.” (Bender and Orszag, 1978, p. 324)

In the current context, one can express the regular nature of the limiting relation in the following way. The fundamental expression appearing in the Lorentz transformations of SR, can be expanded in a Taylor series as

1/√(1→(v/c)2)   =   1 − 1/2 (v/c)2 − 1/8 (v/c)4 − 1/16 (v/c)6 − …

and so the limit is analytic. This means that (at least some) quantities or expressions of SR can be written as Newtonian or classical quantities plus an expansion of corrections in powers of (v/c)2. So one may think of this relationship between SR and NM as a regular perturbation problem.

Examples like this have led some investigators to think of limiting relations as forming a kind of new rule of inference which would allow one to more closely connect the physicists' sense of reduction with that of the philosophers'. Fritz Rohrlich, for example, has argued that NM reduces (in the philosophers' sense) to SR because the mathematical framework of SR reduces (in the physicists' sense) to the mathematical framework of NM. The idea is that the mathematical framework of NM is “rigorously derived” from that of SR in a “derivation which involves limiting procedures.” (Rohrlich, 1988, p. 303) Roughly speaking, for Rohrlich a “coarser” theory is reducible to a “finer” theory in the philosophers' sense of being rigorously deduced from the latter just in case the mathematical framework of the finer theory reduces in the physicists' sense to the mathematical framework of the coarser theory. In such cases, we will have a systematic explication of the idea of “strong analogy” to which Schaffner appeals in his model of philosophical reduction. The corrected theory T′* in this context is the perturbed Newtonian theory as expressed in the Taylor expansion given above. The “strong analogy” between Newtonian theory T′ and the corrected T′* is expressed by the existence of the regular Taylor series expansion.

As noted the trouble with maintaining that this relationship between the philosophical and “physical” models of reduction holds generally is that far more often than not the limiting relations between the theories are singular and not regular. In such situations, Schema R fails to hold. Paradigm cases here include the relationships between classical mechanics and quantum mechanics, the ray theory of light and the wave theory, and thermodynamics and statistical mechanics of systems in critical states.

3. Hierarchies of Theories

Despite the fact that limiting relations between theories may be singular in this way, it is (at times) useful and appropriate to think of physical theories as forming a hierarchy related by length or energy scales. The idea is that different theories may apply at different length or energy scales. If one takes this idea seriously, then it may very well be the case that each theory in this hierarchy will be phenomenological relative to those theories at higher energies or shorter distances. Equivalently, such a hierarchy may form a tower of effective theories. An effective theory is one that describes the relevant phenomena in a circumscribed domain—a domain characterized by a range of energies, for example.

The idea of effective theories is not new. In the 19th century and earlier, scientists developed continuum equations such as the Navier-Cauchy equations describing the behavior of isotropic elastic solids and the Navier-Stokes equations for incompressible viscous fluids. These equations were, and still are, remarkably safe. This means that once one inputs the appropriate values for a few phenomenological parameters (such as Young's modulus and the sheer stress in the Navier-Cauchy equations), one arrives at equation models that allow us to build bridges and buildings that do not collapse. It is remarkable that a theory/model that almost entirely fails to refer to the details of the atomic and molecular structure of a steel beam, say, can be so successful and safe. A question of deep philosophical interest concerns how this can be the case. The phenomenological parameters must encode at least some details about the atomic and molecular make up of the beam. (Hence, the “almost” in the statement above.)

However, this raised an important question: Can one tell a story bridging the models at the atomic scale and those at the continuum scale of centimeters and greater? Reductionists typically believe that it is possible to connect, and presumably to derive, the continuum models starting from atomic scale details. There has been a battle for two centuries at least between those who are persuaded that such a bottom-up story can be told, and those such as Duhem, Mach, and others who have championed a top-down modeling strategies. In the 19th century this took the form of a heated dispute between so-called rari-constancy and multi-constancy theorists who, respectively, tried to determine the continuum equations from top-down (ignoring unknown micro details) considerations, and theorists trying to determine the continuum equations with small scale atomic assumptions guiding the constructions. In fact, surprisingly, the former prevailed. (Todhunter and Pearson, 1960; Batterman, 2012)

The debate between bottom-up, reductionist modelers and top-down, continuum modelers receives its modern presentation, at least in part, in the debates about the existence and nature of emergent phenomena. One area of recent interest where this occurs is in our understanding of effective quantum field theories.

In quantum field theory, for instance, there has been considerable success in in showing how a theory appropriate for some range of energy scales is related to a theory for another range via a process of renormalization (Bain, 2012). Renormalization provides a kind of limiting relationship between theories at different scales despite the fact that the reductive Schema R typically fails because of divergences related to singular limits. The physics at one scale is relatively independent of that at some higher energy (shorter length). In effect, renormalization is a mathematical scheme for characterizing how the structure of interactions changes with changing scale: it turns out that the domain characterized by some lower energy (or larger length) scale is surprisingly and remarkably decoupled from that of higher energies (or smaller lengths). In other words, the decoupling entails that the higher energy regime does not much effect the behaviors and character of the lower energy regimes.

New work, more generally on the problem modeling systems at widely different scales (10+ orders of magnitude), in nano chemistry and in materials science, brings some hope that the all-or-nothing dichotomy between reduction and emergence can be somewhat blunted. As noted, a question of real philosophical interest concerns how to understand the relative autonomy of theories and models at large scales. (Why, again, are the continuum equations so safe for large scale modeling?) Contemporary work in applied mathematics on so-called homogenization theory is beginning to provide interesting connections across these widely separated scales. (Torquato, 2002; Phillips, 2001)

The mathematics of renormalization is best understood as an instance of this general strategy for homogenization or upscaling. (Batterman, 2012) It is crucial for a contemporary understanding of relations between theories. It is fair to say, however, that being able to understand such intertheoretic relations via homogenization and renormalization techniques does not entail the existence of reductive relations between the theories either in the philosophers' or the physicists' sense of the term. However, such an understanding may very well lead to a more nuanced and precise characterization of the debates about reduction and emergence.

4. Intertheory Relations

It seems reasonable to expect something like philosophical reductions to be possible in those situations where Schema R holds. On the other hand, neither philosophical nor “physical” reduction seems possible when the limiting correspondence relation between the theories is singular. Perhaps in such cases it is best to speak simply of intertheoretic relations rather than reductions. It is here that much of philosophical and physical interest is to be found. This claim and the following discussion should not be taken to be anything like the received view among philosophers of science. Instead, they reflect the views of the author.

Nevertheless, here is a passage from a recent paper by Michael Berry which expresses a similar point of view.

Even within physical science, reduction between different levels of explanation is problematic—indeed, it is almost always so. Chemistry is supposed to have been reduced to quantum mechanics, yet people still argue over the basic question of how quantum mechanics can describe the shape of a molecule. The statistical mechanics of a fluid reduces to its thermodynamics in the limit of infinitely many particles, yet that limit breaks down near the critical point, where liquid and vapour merge, and where we never see a continuum no matter how distantly we observe the particles … . The geometrical (Newtonian) optics of rays should be the limit of wave optics as the wavelength becomes negligibly small, yet … the reduction (mathematically similar to that of classical to quantum mechanics) is obstructed by singularities … .
My contention … will be that many difficulties associated with reduction arise because they involve singular limits. These singularities have both negative and positive aspects: they obstruct the smooth reduction of more general theories to less general ones, but they also point to a great richness of borderland physics between theories. (Berry, 2001, p. 43)

When Schema R fails this is because the mathematics of the particular limit (ε→0) is singular. One can ask what, physically, is responsible for this mathematical singularity. In investigating the answer to this question one will often find that the mathematical blow-up reflects a physical impossibility. For instance, if Schema R held when Tf is the wave theory of light and Tc is the ray theory (geometrical optics), then one would expect to recover rays in the shortwave limit λ→0 of the wave theory. On the ray theory, rays are the carriers of energy. But in certain situations families of rays can focus on surfaces or lines called “caustics.” These are not strange esoteric situations. In fact, rainbows are, to a first approximation, described by the focusing of sunlight on these surfaces following its refraction and reflection through raindrops. However, according to the ray theory, the intensity of the light on these focusing surfaces would be infinite. This is part of the physical reason for the mathematical singularities. See also the discussion of the rainbow by Pincock 2011, and Belot 2005.

One is led to study the asymptotic domain in which the parameter ε in Schema R approaches 0. In the example above, this is the short wavelength limit. Michael Berry (1980, 1990, 1994a, 1994b) has done much research on this and other asymptotic domains. He has found that in the asymptotic borderlands between such theories there emerge phenomena whose explanation requires in some sense appeal to a third intermediate theory. The emergent structures (the rainbow itself is one of them) are not fully explainable either in terms of the finer wave theory or in terms of the ray theory alone. Instead, aspects of both theories are required for a full understanding of these emergent phenomena.

This fact calls into question certain received views about the nature of intertheoretic relations. The wave theory, for example, is surely the fundamental theory. Nevertheless, these considerations seem to show that that theory is itself explanatorily deficient. There are phenomena within its scope whose explanations require reference to structures that exist only in the superseded, false, ray theory. A similar situation arises in the asymptotic domain between quantum mechanics and classical mechanics where Planck's constant can be considered asymptotically small. (See, Belot 2005 for an alternative point of view.)

There is much here worthy of further philosophical study. Some very recent work by Butterfield (2011), Butterfield and Bouatta (2011), Norton (2012), Menon and Callender (2012) challenges the point of view suggested by the above discussion. These authors address issues about the nature of infinite idealizations, reduction, and emergence. A common theme is that it is possible to reconcile emergence and reduction. By and large these authors adopt a Nagelian sense of reduction as definitional extension. For a contrary point of view one can see Batterman (2002, 2012).

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Other Internet Resources

  • Berry, M.V., and Howls, C.J., 1993, “Infinity Interpreted,” Physics World (June 1993): 35–39

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