Giovanni Pico della Mirandola

First published Tue Jun 3, 2008; substantive revision Wed Jun 6, 2012

Giovanni Pico della Mirandola (1463–94) is, after Marsilio Ficino, the best known philosopher of the Renaissance: his Oration on the Dignity of Man is better known than any other philosophical text of the fifteenth century. Pico was also remarkably original—indeed, idiosyncratic. The deliberately esoteric and aggressively recondite character of his thought may help explain why Renaissance philosophy has had so small a place, until recently, in the canonical history of the discipline as accepted by Anglophone philosophers.


1. Life

Pico was born on February 24, 1463, to a noble Italian family, the counts of Mirandola and Concordia near Modena in the Emilia-Romagna north of Tuscany. At the age of fourteen he left for Bologna, intending briefly to study canon law, but within two years he moved to Ferrara and shortly afterward to Padua, where he met one of his most important teachers, Elia del Medigo, a Jew and an Averroist Aristotelian. By the time he left Padua in 1482, he had also felt the attraction of the Platonism being revived by Marsilio Ficino, and by 1484 he was corresponding with Angelo Poliziano and Lorenzo de'Medici about poetry.

In 1485 he traveled from Florence to Paris, the citadel of Aristotelian scholasticism. Before he left, at the age of twenty-two, he had made his first important contribution to philosophy—a defense of the technical terminology which since Petrarch's time had incited humanist critics of philosophy to attack scholastic Latin as a barbaric violation of classical norms. Having refined his literary talent while developing his philosophical skills, Pico issued his manifesto in the form of a letter to the renowned Ermolao Barbaro, using the occasion and the genre to show, like Plato in the Phaedrus, how rhetoric could equip a philosopher to defend his calling against rhetorical assault.

After a short stay in Paris, Pico returned to Florence, and then Arezzo, where he caused a scandal by abducting a young woman named Margherita, already married to Giuliano Mariotto de'Medici. Despite the support that came from Lorenzo, the commotion that followed and then a plague kept Pico on the move, just at the time he was writing a Commento on a love poem by Girolamo Benivieni and planning his larger scheme of philosophical concord. At its core this project aimed to secure human happiness by way of a philosophical harmony between Platonists and Aristotelians. But in keeping with Pico's immense ambition, the scope of the effort became global, striving to join all schools of thought in a single symphony of philosophies. Pico planned to underwrite a magnificent conference on this theme in Rome early in 1487, and in preparation he assembled 900 theses from numerous authorities—ancient and medieval, pagan and Christian, Moslem and Jewish. He had these Conclusions printed in Rome at the end of 1486, and to introduce them he composed a work of eventually immense fame, the Oration on the Dignity of Man—as it came to be called.

Intervention by the Holy See derailed Pico's plans and blocked the conference. Innocent VIII appointed a commission that first declared six of the theses suspect and condemned seven others, then rejected Pico's clarifications and repudiated all thirteen. When the Apology that Pico hastily published provoked Innocent to denounce all nine hundred Conclusions, the audacious young Count left for Paris, but at the pope's request he was detained by French authorities and briefly jailed. By the summer of 1488 he was back in Fiesole as the guest of Lorenzo, to whom in 1489 he dedicated a short work called Heptaplus, on the Sevenfold Account of the Six Days of Genesis.

Since 1483 Pico had a third of the income produced by his family's estates, which along with his Mirandola property he transferred in 1491 to his nephew Gianfrancesco, who was to become an important philosopher in his own right and an early voice for the revival of scepticism as an instrument of Christian faith. At this time, however, even after the dust had settled on the provocative Conclusions, contemporaries were unsure of the elder Pico's orthodoxy, and the Cabalist exegesis of Genesis in the Heptaplus—tame though it is by Pico's earlier standards—could scarcely restore their confidence. Meanwhile, Pico pursued safer philological inquiries with Poliziano, who received the dedication of a fragment On Being and the One in 1492. Even though De ente et uno was meant as the first installment of the great work that would prove Plato's thought in concord with Aristotle's, not everyone accepted Pico's position harmoniously—least of all Antonio Cittadini, a Pisan professor who was still fighting about it with Gianfrancesco Pico two years after his uncle's death.

In 1493 Pico achieved reconciliation with a higher authority when Alexander VI pardoned him for his earlier misadventures. By this time he had already grown close to Girolamo Savonarola, the fearsome millenarian preacher who had recently become Prior of the Dominican Convent of San Marco in Florence. Pico had known the prophetic friar for some time, but now Savonarola was on his way to establishing a theocratic tyranny in Florence. Growing ever more saintly, Pico disposed of more of his property, giving some to the Church and some to his family, as his habits became less and less worldly. He was working hard on another huge project, the unfinished Disputations Against Divinatory Astrology, when death (hastened by poison, some said) came to him on November 17, 1494. Florence fell to the French armies of Charles VIII on the same day, ending the dazzling age of Florentine culture that Pico's blazing genius made all the brighter, though only briefly. Ficino's steadier spirit survived him by five years.

2. Works and Reputation

Pico's modern fame comes mainly from a speech that he never gave, the Oration on the Dignity of Man that got its title only after he died. He wrote the Oration in 1486 to introduce his 900 Conclusions, having chosen the capital of Christendom as just the place to dispute the outrageous theological novelties advertised by them—including the claim that magic and Cabala are the best proofs of Christ's divinity. The Pope quashed Pico's rash project, but not before the Conclusions were already in print. To make matters worse, Pico then defended them in an unsubmissive Apology that printed half of the original, and not yet published, Oration—though not the half that later became famous. As a whole, and mainly because its language is enigmatic, the Oration was less inflammatory than the Conclusions; it first appeared in the collection of his uncle's works (Commentationes) published by Gianfrancesco Pico in 1496. Gianfrancesco, the main source of biographical information about the elder Pico, says that his uncle thought little of the speech, regarding it as a piece of juvenilia. For the next three centuries, few of Pico's readers were moved to challenge this verdict, despite the author's continuing fame. Until post-Kantian historians of philosophy were charmed by it, the Oration was largely (though not entirely) ignored, in part because of its publishing history.

Except as part of Pico's collected works, the Latin text of the speech was printed only once before the 1940s, when the first translation into English also appeared, just after the first Italian version in 1936. What readers saw on the title-page of the 1496 Commentationes was simply A Very Elegant Oration, which in 1530—in the only separately published Latin text of the pre-modern era—expanded into On Man by Giovanni Pico della Mirandola, explaining the loftier mysteries of sacred and human philosophy. Meanwhile, the front-matter of the five collected editions or reprints between 1498 and 1521 stayed with the 1496 formulation, Oratio quaedam elegantissima, which in 1557 finally became On the Dignity of Man in a Basel collection and, in a Venice edition of the same year, A Very Elegant Oration on the High Nobility and Dignity of Man. The two other early modern collections of 1572 and 1601 used a new format that no longer listed contents by title at the front of the book.

The British Library Catalog, which has about 1300 entries for books by Erasmus published by 1700, has about 100 for Pico. During the same period, when Marsilio Ficino's De vita libri tres went through more than thirty editions, Pico's Latin Oration—far better known to modern readers than Ficino's Three Books on Life—got almost no attention from publishers. Of the five dozen or so Pico titles that found a publisher by 1700, about half were collections of letters. The first two, called Golden Letters, were incunabular editions, and the letters also figured prominently in early collections of Pico's works, whose front-matter listed Ficino, Poliziano and other cultural celebrities with whom Pico corresponded

Two things made Pico's Latin letters a durable commercial hit: celebrity and education. Since Latin was still the main medium of learned communication in the late seventeenth century, when Isaac Newton published his Principia in that undead language, educated people kept writing letters in Latin and used writers like Pico as models. And Pico was attractive not only because of his elegant style but also because he had been a celebrity in his own lifetime and remained so in Newton's day. He stayed famous in three ways: as a critic of astrology; as an expert on Cabala; and as the amazing Pico—as the Phoenix who blazed through a brief life in the triple glare of an old aristocratic society, a new mandarin culture of classical scholarship and, in his last years, the millenarian fantasies of Savonarola's Florence. Noble origins, fashionable friends, physical beauty, prodigious learning, capacious memory, scholarly journeys, youthful sins, trouble with the Church, eventual repentance and a pious death: these are the motifs of the family hagiography by his nephew that have kept Giovanni Pico famous for being famous over the centuries.

Because he died so young, Pico finished very little and published less: the vernacular Commento was neither completed nor published by him; the Conclusions are just bare statements of theses; half of the rushed Apology was lifted from the unpublished Oration; On Being and the One is a small piece of a larger effort to harmonize Plato and Aristotle; and Gianfrancesco found the unfinished Disputations Against Astrology bundled with his dead uncle's papers. Unless we count the two epistolary essays on poetry and philosophical language, the only substantial and completed work that Pico gave to the world in his lifetime was the Heptaplus (1489), a Cabalist commentary on the first 26 verses of Genesis.

That topic, called Ma'aseh Bereshit or the Work of the Beginning, was a favorite of Menahem Recanati, Abraham Abulafia and other Cabalists whom Pico knew through learned Italian Jews, including Elia del Medigo, Flavius Mithridates and Yohanan Alemanno. Cabala, which Pico saw as the holier Hebrew analog of the gentile ‘ancient theology’ revealed by Marsilio Ficino, is provocatively on display in the 900 Conclusions: 119 of them, including the final and culminating 72, are Cabalist theses—outlandishly Cabalist from a Christian point of view. Pico's project, part of a search for harmonies connecting all the world's wisdom traditions, was to ground primary doctrines of Christology and trinitarian theology in Cabala, which he traced to the oral Torah confided to Moses and passed on in secret through Esdras and other sages. Because of its Mosaic origin, Cabala was holier to Pico than the pagan wisdom that Ficino had traced to Zoroaster and Hermes Trismegistus, in ancient Chaldaea and Egypt, where Ficino found the beginnings of Platonic philosophy. Pico was the first Christian who had the expertise, including a little Hebrew and Aramaic, to back up the astonishing claims that would make Cabala the core of the ancient theology.

Although Cabalist writings had first appeared in the twelfth century, Christians before Pico knew almost nothing about them. The Cabala that he discovered for the Latin West is a theory as well as a practice, at bottom a kind of biblical hermeneutics. And for some Cabalists, then and now, textual theorizing underwrites a spiritual practice whose aim is mystical ascent or the excitation of prophetic or messianic states by various techniques, including magic and theurgy. Many Cabalists believe that the Hidden God, called the Infinite, reveals himself not only in the Bible but also through ten emanations or attributes, the Sefirot. Hypostasized in myths, made concrete by images and symbolized by letters and numbers, the Sefirot are at the core of Cabalist speculation, whose other major focus is the names of God and their resonance in words of scripture.

Cabalists regard the meaning of God's sacred speech, the Hebrew text of the Bible, as infinite, finding significance even in its smallest particles—not only the divine words but also their letters (which are also numbers) and even the shapes of those letters. The most powerful words are God's names, the holiest of which, the Tetragrammaton, cannot be uttered; written as YHWH, it is pronounced Adonai, a spoken name like Elohim, Ehyeh, El Shaddai and others used of God in the Hebrew Bible. Other words of great power are the names of the Sefirot, which are unknown, as such, to the Bible; they are names not of God but of aspects or manifestations or emanations of divinity.

Since God in his highest essence remains hidden, finite beings can know the Infinite only in so far as it descends from its secret heights. The last moments of that descent make up the world of common human awareness. The first moments, far beyond the reach of ordinary perception, are the ten Sefirot. Much of the literature of Cabala tries to describe the Sefirot, often as shown in Figure 1, where all ten (designated S1 through S10) are arranged in a diagram or ‘tree.’ The major names in Hebrew of S4, for example, are Gedullah and Hesed, meaning Greatness and Love or Piety, rendered by Pico as Amor or Pietas. The divine name usually associated with S4 is El, but Pico knew that Cabalists use many other words and names (Abraham, Michael, the South, Water) to describe S4. The terminology that Pico used for the Sefirot, which he called ‘numerations’ in Latin, is displayed in more detail in Figure 2.

S1 Keter
Crown
Fatum Supremum
’Ehyeh
S3 Binah
Intelligence
Intelligentia
YHWH (’Elohim)
S2 Hochmah
Wisdom
Sapientia
Yah
S5 Gevurah/Din
Power/Judgment
Potentia/Judicium
’Elohim
S4 Gedullah/Hesed
Greatness/Love or Piety
Amor or Pietas
’El
S6 Tiferet/Rahamim
Beauty/Compassion
Tipheret/Clementia
YHWH (’Adonay)
S8 Hod
Majesty
Decor
’Elohim Tseb'aot
S7 Netsah
Endurance
Eternitas
YHWH Tseb'aot
S9 Tsaddiq/Yesod
Righteous/Foundation
Justus/Fundamentum
’El Hay/Shaddai
S10 Malkut/ ‘Atarah
Kingdom/Diadem
Regnum
’Adonai

Figure 1: The Ten Sefirot

S1 Fatum Supremum
Father, Unity
Lord of the Nose
aleph, hu
S3 Intelligentia
Holy Spirit, Reason
Green Line, Jubilee, Repentance, Love
beth, he, scin
S2 Sapientia
Son, Christ, Jesus, Messiah, Intellect
Beginning, Eden, Fear
beth, iod
S5 Judicium,Potentia
Isaac, Gabriel
North, Fear, Fire
S4 Amor, Pietas
Abraham, Michael
South, Love, Water
S6 Tipheret, Clementia
Son, Christ, Jesus, Messiah
Jacob, Uriel
East, Sun, Day, Shining Mirror, Heaven
vav
S8 Decor S7 Eternitas
S9 Fundamentum, Justus
Redeemer, Water
nun, ze
S10 Regnum
Holy Spirit
David, Raphael, Israel, Sabbath
West, Bride, Daughter, Dwelling, Moon, Night, Unshining Mirror, Fear
Red Heifer, Hind With One Horn, Pure Wine, Sea
tav, he

Figure 2: Pico's Sefirot (Numerations)

Pico was the first Christian to treat knowledge of Cabala as valuable. Flavius Mithridates, his most prolific Jewish informant, translated (and mistranslated) thousands of pages of Cabala into Latin for him. Large portions of the Oration, drawing on these texts, are also informed by Cabala in ways that no contemporary Christian could have detected—least of all a Christian who lacked the clues provided by the Conclusions. The esoteric intention of Pico's thought, proclaimed emphatically in the Oration, is the feature that most distances it from the whole project of post-Cartesian philosophy in the West and also from earlier philosophies outside the Platonic tradition. Wishing not just to mystify but also to provoke, Pico succeeded and paid the price of the Church's censure.

Theology, spirituality and philosophy—all in the broadest sense—are the main topics of Pico's Cabala, which shows (or hints) how God reveals himself in the Sefirot, the divine names and the words of scripture. In the 72 Cabalist theses at the end of the Conclusions, this revelation becomes Christology and Trinitarian theology. From a Cabalist point of view, the Sefirot and the divine names are actors in dramas of theology, cosmology, anthropology and angelology whose major themes are exile, death, atonement and redemption, stories that Pico transposes onto the Christian Trinity, with Jesus Christ, the Messiah, as the saving hero.

Accordingly, leading points of spiritual practice in the Conclusions are prayer, prophecy and ascent to mystical union with God, which is also the main topic of the Oration, where Pico makes positive use of magic and theurgy as steps toward the ascent. The Conclusions, which confirm this endorsement of magic, also show in greater detail than the Oration why Pico links magic with Cabala. He sees it as a spiritual technique which, like the higher theurgy of the Neoplatonic philosophers, locates and opens routes to God which ordinarily are unknown to humans. The practice of Cabala starts with theory because these hidden channels of divinity must be disclosed and interpreted before they can be used: spirituality follows hermeneutics.

Technical details of hermeneutics are the most obscure material in the Conclusions, especially Pico's speculations about Hebrew words and letters. Language is the gateway to wisdom, the elements of language are letters and numbers, and these signs proliferate in secret codes. Pico's genius and ambition, which the Church would see as impudence, attracted him to this provocative theology of the hidden word, whose enigmas and ambiguities encouraged his fascination with the esoteric. The larger Cabalist project of the Conclusions, and hence of the Cabala in the Oration, is Christological and Trinitarian. The smaller exhibitions of Cabala that Pico uses to support his grand theory focus on particular Biblical texts, which are also illuminated by the Gentile wisdom of the ancient theologians.

Zoroaster, Hermes Trismegistus, Orpheus, Pythagoras and other ancient theologians are among the authorities from whom Pico derives his 900 theses, but so are Aquinas, Albertus and other scholastics, Averroes, Avicenna and other Muslims as well as Plato, Aristotle, Plotinus, Proclus and the Greek commentators. The Conclusions are, among other things, an egregious advertisement of Pico's learning in a catalog of philosophical propositions which are often challenging to orthodoxy and sometimes paradoxical—a word that Pico himself used to describe some of his propositions, whose ancestors were the quodlibetal theses debated in medieval universities. He ascribed only the last group of about 500 to himself, attaching the first set of roughly 400 to ancient and medieval authorities, among whom were the Cabalists—by far the least familiar to Pico's contemporaries.

In the Heptaplus of 1489 we can still hear the Cabalist voice of the Conclusions, but mainly because Pico's earlier works since the Commento of 1485–6 have prepared us to listen for it. Although all these texts discuss Cabala more openly than the Heptaplus, they seem to have made little impression on Pico's contemporaries. Roberto Salviati, a well informed Florentine who knew Pico well, called the Heptaplus “the first fruits of his studies” when he arranged to have it printed. That Salviati thought the Commento, Conclusions and Apology negligible or embarrassing is more likely than that he did not know those works. Simple ignorance is likelier in the case of the Oration, which Pico's nephew would later describe as having been kept out of circulation by his uncle. For readers whom Cabala might alienate, the Heptaplus was not much of a threat because Pico had sanitized it. (For the best account of the Heptaplus, see the book by Crofton Black (2006).)

Although Genesis was not as attractive to Christian interpreters as Job or the Psalms, explicating the creation narrative of Gen. 1:1–26 had been a task of hermeneutics since the great hexameral commentaries of Basil of Caesarea and Ambrose. Like all of the Bible, the creation story was thought to have three layers of meaning beyond its literal or ‘historical’ sense: allegorical, tropological and anagogical. The standard view was that “history talks about events, allegory about how one thing is understood from another, tropology discusses morals, … and anagogy is the spiritual meaning … that leads to higher things.” The Heptaplus proposes and practices a new kind of allegory, a method derived from the structure of creation itself and directed toward a new type of anagogy or ascent to supreme bliss (felicitas) in the Godhead.

Pico provides the key to his system only in the last part of the Heptaplus, which seems to be an appendix tacked on to the work—just another display of the author's virtuoso skill in Hebrew. But to learned Jews of the day, whether they were Cabalists or not, Pico's analysis of the Hebrew letters of the first word of Genesis (Bereshit, “In the beginning”) would have seemed crude and simple-minded. Only from a Christian perspective was there anything exotic in it, and its main effect on Christians would have been to dazzle them with art.

This seemingly extraneous ending is actually a grand and arcane finale. It hints at a secret that no Christian of Pico's day could have grasped: that Moses himself, the author of the creation story, had passed through 49 Gates of Understanding—7 × 7—on his way to the fiftieth, the supreme and final Gate to union with God. The 49 preliminary Gates are all the compartments of creation, which in turn demonstrate Pico's new allegorical method by exemplifying it: the universe of existence is also the universe of understanding that shows the path to mystical union.

Although Pico does not explain the Gates in the 900 Conclusions, he does mention them in a way that gave later scholars, like Johann Reuchlin, the clues that they needed to find such enigmas in Cabalist texts and then decipher them. The short version of the story is that Wisdom, the second Sefirah (S2; see Fig. 1) builds the palace of Intelligence (S3) and carves 50 Gates in it, 7 revealed in each of the 7 lower Sefirot (S1-7) and another one unrevealed. The 50 Gates, also called the Jubilee, correspond to the 50-year festival ordained in Leviticus but also to a millenarian Great Jubilee of 50,000 years, when the 7 sabbatical cycles or weeks of 7,000 years come to an end. After the lower Sefirot collapse into S3 in a final millennium, the cycle starts again, having been completed in that last generation of a thousand years—in the Sabbath of the Shekinah (S10). This Sabbath, the seventh day of rest after the six days of creation, is Pico's ultimate allegory of mystical union, the secret encoded not only in the letters of Bereshit but also in the sevenfold structure of the Heptaplus itself.

But who knew or could have known? In 1489, when the Heptaplus was published, its only informed readership was the handful of learned Jews in Italy who could also read Latin—the very people who had taught Pico himself enough Cabala to fill his Conclusions with it. In the Heptaplus, however, even where its structure and content obviously depend on Cabala, Pico suppresses what the Jews had taught him, until the final exposition of Bereshit that could only have baffled Christian readers if it did not offend them. As in his earlier works, Pico intends to mystify because he believes that the highest and most sacred wisdom must not be divulged in plain language. He wants God's secrets to be understood only by an élite clever enough to unravel the allegories that conceal them. The surprising thing, in the Western tradition of philosophy, is that Pico thinks of this project as philosophical.

Despite Pico's effort to keep Cabala so well hidden in the Heptaplus that Christians would not reject the book outright, it was the extravagant and explicit theosophy of the Conclusions, framed posthumously by the Oration, that made him the patriarch of Christian Cabala. Reuchlin and other masters of this new syncretism looked back to Pico as their model; German theologians and biblical scholars were still debating his theses when the young Immanuel Kant began teaching in Königsberg. But by the end of the eighteenth century, Kant had so thoroughly revolutionized philosophy that its history had to be reformulated in Kantian terms. In practice, the task was to update the huge Critical History of Philosophy produced by Jacob Brucker in 1742, where the eclectic Brucker describes Pico as that worst of all monsters, a Platonizing, Judaizing syncretist. Half a century later, Wilhelm Tennemann began the revisionist History of Philosophy (1798–1819) in which Pico makes his first appearance as a proto-Kantian advocate of human freedom and dignity.

In the first few pages of the Oration—pages read more often than any other product of Renaissance Latin humanism—God tells Adam that he, alone of all creatures, can make himself what he wants to be. Fascinated by this stirring prelude to a longer speech, Tennemann, and many readers after him, have taken Pico's oratorical prelude as evidence of a morality grounded, like Kant's, in human freedom and dignity. Having gathered strength during the nineteenth century, and having acquired a romantic patina, this view of Pico—and, by implication, of Renaissance humanism—reached its peak with the great Neo-Kantian of his age, Ernst Cassirer. When Cassirer and Paul Kristeller, also a Kantian, came to the United States, they brought their Kantian Pico with them, launching his long career in university textbooks of ‘Western Civilization’ after World War II. Meanwhile, Eugenio Garin had published what is still the most important book on Pico in the Fascist Italy of 1937, just before the racial laws were put into force.

The most conspicuous pages of the Oration, celebrated by Garin and many others as the humanist charter of human freedom and dignity, are just the first few. Assured by them that we can be what we want to be, we are then told—contrary to the usual interpretation of the Oration—that what we must be is not human at all. We must become angels—bodiless, sexless and ultimately, that most unromantic of all conditions, selfless in the strict sense. Cherubim, the next-to-highest angels, are the first higher stage that we must reach, and to achieve that lofty state we must shed not only the body that imprisons us but also the identity and personality that distinguish us from all other individuals and from God. Mystical union with God is Pico's final goal, and extinguishing the self is a necessary consequence of achieving it. “Let a holy ambition possess our spirit,” Pico writes.

Let us climb for the heights, panting; and let us strive with all our might to reach them, since we can do it if we will it. Let us scorn the things of earth, let us despise those of heaven, and then, leaving behind whatever is of the world, let us fly up to the hypercosmic court nearest the most exalted divinity…. As we emulate the Cherubic life on earth, checking the impulses of the emotions through moral knowledge, dispelling the darkness of reason through dialectic, let us cleanse the soul by washing away the dirt of ignorance and vice so that the emotions will not rage in fury nor reason go mad and foolish. Then let us flood the soul, purified and well tempered, with the light of natural philosophy so that finally we may perfect it with knowledge of divinity…. [Then] we will fully enjoy the peace that we have longed for—the holiest peace, the unbreakable bond, the friendship of the single-souled wherein all our spirits do not so much converge in the one mind above every mind as in some unsayable way emerge as absolutely one. This is that friendship which the Pythagoreans say is the end of all philosophy. This is that peace which God gives on high and angels descending to earth have announced to men of good will so that through this peace these same men, ascending to heaven, might be made into angels…. Ever forgetful of herself, [the soul] will wish to die in herself that she might live in her spouse, in whose sight the death of his saints is most precious—death, I say, if one should use the word ‘death’ for that fullness of life whose contemplation the sages have said is the aim of philosophy…. Lifted now to the topmost height of her watchtower, for all eternity looking out without interruption over what is, what will be and what has been, we shall sing prophecies like Phoebus, and, gazing up at primeval beauty, we shall be its winged lovers, until at last, with a love that cannot be described, driven wild by desire and transported beyond ourselves like burning Seraphs, full of divine power, we shall be ourselves no longer, but shall be Him, the very one who made us.

At the lowest level of a self-annihilating paideia, the mystic starts as a philosopher—with ethics, logic, natural philosophy and theology—before ascending through the arcana of magic and Cabala to drown the I in the abyss of divinity. This is not a Kantian project, and the Oration on the Dignity of Man that locates the human condition in human freedom and dignity is a text created by us post-Kantians, not by Giovanni Pico.

The outline of the Oration given below is also not Pico's. Its seven parts may or may not be what he had in mind, but from the layout of the 900 Conclusions it is clear that he thought along numerological lines. Moreover, the title and organization of the Heptaplus show that 7 was a particularly meaningful number to him. The full title is Heptaplus, on the Sevenfold Account of the Six Days of Genesis, surely an invitation to ponder arithmetical mysteries. Since this work of 1489 restates a theme—ascending to felicitas or supreme happiness—that had occupied Pico since the Commento of 1485–6, it would not be surprising to find that its sevenfold structure derives from earlier writings, including the Oration. That famous speech can be analyzed as follows:

  1. Man is the greatest wonder because he can choose to transform himself.
  2. In order to choose well, however, he must emulate the angels.
  3. In order to emulate the angels, he must learn how to live the angelic life—specifically, the Cherubic life.
  4. This lesson, a curriculum, can be learned from the ancient fathers, who are
    1. Paul and Dionysius
    2. Jacob
    3. Job
    4. Moses
    5. The ancient theologians (Orpheus, Socrates, Plato, Plotinus)
    6. Pythagoras
    7. Zoroaster, the Chaldaeans, Abraham and Jeremiah
  5. Because it is philosophy that leads to the Cherubic life, Pico proclaims himself a philosopher.
  6. And the study of philosophy has also led Pico to other new doctrines, notably magic and Cabala.
  7. Therefore, despite the complaints of his critics, Pico will undertake his philosophical disputation.

The lesson taught seven times in the central part of the Oration (part 4 above) is a curriculum whose felicitous goal is mystical union with God: first elaborated by the ancient Neoplatonists, it was taken up by the Church Fathers and became a commonplace of Christian mysticism, though Pico would also have found it in such Cabalist texts as the commentary on the Song of Songs by Levi ben Gerson. The student starts with moral philosophy and then moves through dialectic and natural philosophy toward theology, until discursive thought gives way to ecstasy, pure contemplation and finally unification. The stages of this paideia are

  1. moral philosophy
  2. dialectic
  3. natural philosophy
  4. theology
  5. magic
  6. Cabala
  7. mystical union

Magic and Cabala are preliminary to union in this process but still important. By propelling the soul through the heavens toward supercelestial divinity, magic assists the transition from natural philosophy to natural theology and beyond, while Cabala, which rises higher than any discursive theology, changes humans into angels purged of all traces of matter and thus prepared for henôsis or absolute unification with God. The philosophical theory behind this spirituality goes back to the Greek Commentators on Aristotle and becomes more explicit in Avicenna, Averroes and other Muslim sages. In philosophical terms that were certainly controversial, but far more familiar than Cabala, Pico's aim was conjunction with the Agent Intellect.

In Pico's lifetime, of course, even his less obscure views about mystical union were little known because the texts were either not published or not comprehensible to a Latin readership. Gianfrancesco Pico, in the Life of Pico that accompanies the correspondence that the nephew also edited, tried to rescue his uncle's reputation. The final item in Pico's bibliography, the Disputations Against Astrology is, like the letters, problematic in its textual history because of Gianfrancesco's involvement in its publication. (The best account of the Disputations is the article by Anthony Grafton listed in Pichiana by Quaquarelli and Zanardi.)

The unfinished Disputations is a long and unwelcoming book, made all the more forbidding by its ragged presentation and reliance on so many obscure and technical sources; much of it repeats and reinforces ancient and medieval objections to astrology. Pico extends Ptolemy's doubts about a few astrological practices, for example, into a broader restriction on celestial influences, which he finds either too diffuse or too slight to be the basis of precise predictions. He exposes the claims made by astrologers who often contradicted themselves and violated the canons of reason and experience that the sciences must rely upon. The logical, methodological and epistemological complaints compiled by Pico had been well known since before the ancient sceptics recorded their objections. Pico's real breakthrough was to use humanist philology as a new weapon against astrology, which he does not reject categorically.

Part of astrology's credibility was its pedigree, its long descent from sages of ancient Chaldaea and Egypt. The Oration and Conclusions authenticate this genealogy by reinforcing it with the even more venerable tradition of Cabala. Like Cabala, astrology was also made plausible by classicism, the new humanist culture that measured the authority of a doctrine by its age. Since astrology could claim a record of observing planets and stars over several millennia, it had stood the test of primordial time as its experience accumulated.

In the Disputations that he did not live to finish, Pico now rejected this static mytho-history. Calling on new techniques of biblical and historical chronology, he relocated such cardinal figures as Zoroaster in the human landscape of historical time, thus making them subject to what would later be called ‘historical criticism.’ Pico's critical sense was far from modern, however. When he attacked Chaldaean stargazers as ignorant and superstitious, part of what he found credulous was their obsession with mathematics. Although Pico's attitude to mathematics was scarcely progressive, following the Aristotelian convention, his Disputations eventually attracted Kepler's attention, as well as praise from the later historians and philologists who used his re-dating of the Eastern sages to greatly diminish—if not to eliminate—the allure of the ancient theology.

Pico's least eccentric work of philosophy is the little treatise On Being and the One: it takes an Aristotelian position against a Neoplatonic distinction between being and the One that made the latter higher than the former in the order of the All. In effect, since Marsilio Ficino had developed just such a position, Pico's essay was a challenge to the older philosopher, who saw it as such, and objected politely. Pico's larger purpose was to harmonize Aristotle with Plato, which had also been the goal of many of the ancient commentators on Aristotle, some of whom were Neoplatonists themselves. But Pico was not Platonic enough to suit Ficino, just as he was not Aristotelian enough for doctrinaire Aristotelians. The future was on Pico's side, however, inasmuch as most of the Aristotelianism of the sixteenth century would be eclectic, though not as concordist as Pico would have liked.

And yet Ficino's irenic disposition also encouraged concordism, which was more than just compatible with the historiography of philosophy—the ancient theology—that he promoted in all his works as a way to Christianize the heritage of pagan wisdom. In general, Ficino welcomed Pico as a junior ally in that same cause, as evidenced by the warm personal language of the correspondence between the two thinkers. It is striking, however, that Ficino's letters, published by him in his own lifetime, in 1495, testify better to his friendship with Pico than Pico's letters, published in 1496 by his nephew, Gianfrancesco, who also prepared the Disputations for the press in that same year. A close reading of both epistolaries suggests that the younger Pico—who was at least as close to Savonarola as his uncle—intervened to make the elder Pico's letters, as they appeared in the collected works that the nephew edited in 1496, underwrite the pious Life that introduces the whole collection.

The Pico of that Life is a Savonarolan saint who came almost too late to salvation but finally rejected the world, the flesh and the devil. This is not the Pico who traveled to Rome a few years before to take on the whole world in a failed philosophical extravaganza; nor the Pico who bungled an attempt to carry off a married woman whose husband was named Medici—no less; nor the Pico with whom Ficino bantered about his missteps and misfortunes in letters loaded with astro-mythological allusions. It may be that the disasters of 1486–7 chastened the young nobleman enough to explain the muffling of Cabala in the Heptaplus and the jarring recantation that we find in the Disputations. But since the editor of the Disputations, Gianfrancesco Pico, also edited the letters that he selected to underwrite a tendentious Life of his uncle, and since Gianfrancesco himself was not just a devout fideist but also a prodigiously productive scholar and an original thinker, we should not dismiss the possibility that the Disputations ought to be read more as a pendant to the nephew's Life of Pico than as proof of penitence in a final phase of its his uncle's meteoric career.

Bibliography

Primary Literature

The Pico of the 1496 Commentationes was an artifact of his nephew's editorial intentions. Pico as we now know him, even more remote from the facts of his life and thought, is an artifact of twentieth century scholarship whose philosophical roots were in the nineteenth century.

Although Pico's works, especially the Oration, are now widely available in translation, there is no complete modern edition of the original texts in Latin and Italian: such an edition is now underway in the I Tatti Renaissance Library. In the list below, (1) is the most commonly cited of the early editions. For the Oration, Heptaplus De ente et uno and Disputationes, the standard twentieth century editions were by Garin (2, 3). But for the Oration, see now Bausi (16), and for an English version see (5), which also provides translations of De ente et uno and the Heptaplus. Toussaint's De ente et uno (11) contains a French translation. Translations and Latin texts of the Conclusions are available in (10, 14, 15). For the Commento, see (6, 7, 8). For the Psalm commentaries, see (13), and for the sonnets (9). The Latin text and an English translation of Gianfrancesco's Life of Pico can be found in the first volume (12) of the Yale edition of the works of Thomas More, which also contains the prayers and spiritual works.

  1. Opera omnia, reprint of the Basel 1557 edition, Hildesheim: Olms, 1969.
  2. De hominis dignitate, Heptaplus, De ente et uno e scritti vari, ed. Eugenio Garin, Florence: Vallechi, 1942.
  3. Disputationes adversus astrologiam divinatricem, ed. Eugenio Garin, Florence: Vallechi, 1946, 1952.
  4. [Letter to Barbaro] Quirinus Breen, “Giovanni Pico della Mirandola on the Conflict of Philosophy and Rhetoric,” Journal of the History of Ideas, 13 (1952): 384–426.
  5. On the Dignity of Man; On Being and the One; Heptaplus, trans. Charles Wallis, Paul Miller and Douglas Carmichael, Indianapolis: Bobbs-Merrill, 1965.
  6. Commentary on a canzone of Benivieni, trans. Sears Jayne, New York: Lang, 1984.
  7. Commentary on a Poem of Platonic Love, trans. D. Carmichael, Lanham: University Press of America, 1986.
  8. Commento, trans. Stéphane Toussaint, Lausanne: L'Age de l'Homme, 1989.
  9. Sonetti, ed. Giorgio Dilemmi, Torino: Einaudi, 1994.
  10. Conclusiones Nongentae: Le novecento tesi dell'anno 1486, ed. Albano Biondi, Florence, Olschki, 1995.
  11. L'Esprit du Quattrocento: Pic de la Mirandole: le De ente et uno et Réponses à Antonio Cittadini, ed. Stéphane Toussaint, Paris: Champion, 1995.
  12. The Complete Works of St. Thomas More, vol. I, ed. Anthony Edwards et al., New Haven: Yale University Press, 1997.
  13. Expositiones in Psalmos, ed. Antonino Raspanti, trans. Giacomo Raspanti, Florence: Olschki, 1997.
  14. Syncretism in the West: Pico's 900 Theses (1486): The Evolution of Traditional Religious and Philosophical Systems, ed. and trans S.A. Farmer, Tempe: MRTS, 1998.
  15. 900 Conclusions philosophiques, cabalistiques e théologiques, ed. Bertrand Schefer, Paris: Allia, 1999.
  16. Discorso sulla dignità dell'uomo, ed. Francesco Bausi, Parma: Fondazione Pietro Bembo, 2003.
  17. Oeuvres philosophiques: Texte Latin, traduction et notes, ed. Olivier Boulnois and Giuseppe Tognon, Paris: Presses Universitaires de France, 1993.
  18. Apologia: L'Autodifesa di Pico di fronte al Tribunale dell'Inquisizione, ed. Paolo Fornaciari, Florence: Edizioni del Galluzzo, 2010.

Bibliographies

A recent bibliography of Pico editions and works about Pico lists more than 700 studies after 1899, but only 160 for the preceding century, when even Italian scholars came late to Pico and not in large numbers:

  • Quaquarelli, Leonardo and Zita Zanardi, Pichiana: Bibliografia delle edizioni e degli studi, Florence: Olschki, 2005.

Secondary Literature

For recent items (and a few not so recent) not mentioned in Quaquarelli and Zanardi, see the list that follows; see also the on-line bibliography compiled and maintained by Michael Dougherty.

  • Black, Crofton, 2006, Pico's Heptaplus and Biblical Hermeneutics, Leiden: Brill.
  • Blum, Paul Richard, 2002, “Eintracht und Religion bei Giovanni Pico della Mirandola,” in Suche nach Frieden: Politische Ethik in der frühen Neuzeit, ed. N. Brieskorn and M. Riedenauer, Stuttgart: Kohlhammer.
  • Busi, Giulio, 2006, “Who Does Not Wonder at this Chameleon? The Kabbalstic Library of Giovanni Pico della Mirandola,” in Hebrew to Latin/Latin to Hebre: The Mirroring of Two Cultures in the Age of Humanism: Colloquium Held at the Warburg Institute, London, October 18–19, 2004, edited by Giulio Busi, Torino: Nino Aragno.
  • Caroti, Stefano, 2005, “Note sulle fonti medievali di Pico della Mirandola,” Giornale Critico della Filosofia Italiana, (Series 7), 84: 60–92.
  • Copenhaver, Brian P., 1999, “Number, Shape, and Meaning in Pico's Christian Cabala: The Upright Tsade, The Closed Mem, and the Gaping Jaws of Azazel,” in Natural Particulars: Nature and Disciplines in Renaissance Europe, edited by Anthony Grafton and Nancy Siraisi, Cambridge, MA: The MIT Press.
  • –––, 2007a, “Maimonides, Abulafia and Pico: A Secret Aristotle for the Renaissance,” Rinascimento, 47: 23–51
  • –––, 2007b, “Chi scrisse l'Orazione di Pico?,” La Magia nell'Europa Moderna: Tra antica sapienza e filosofia naturale: Atti del convegno (Firenze, 2–4 ottobre 2003, ed. F. Meroi, Florence: Olschki, 79–105.
  • Dietz, Luc, 2005, “De omni re scibili – et de quibusdam aliis: A New Attempt at Understanding Pico's ‘900 Theses,’” Neulateinisches Jahrbuch: Journal of Neo-Latin Language and Literature, 7: 295-301.
  • Dougherty, M.V., 2008, Pico della Mirandola: New Essays, with contributions by Michael Allen, Richard Blum, Francesco Borghesi, Michael Dougherty, Jill Kraye, Sheila Rabin, Carl Still and Michael Sudduth, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Edelheit, Amos, 2007, “The Scholastic Theology of Giovanni Pico della Mirandola: Between Biblical Faith and Academic Scepticism,’” Recherches de Théologie et Philosophie médiévales, 74: 523–70.
  • ––ndash;, 2008, Ficino, Pico and Savonarola: The Evolution of Humanist Theology 1461/2–1498, Leiden: Brill.
  • Idel, Moshe, 2007, La Cabbalà in Italia, Florence: Giuntina.
  • Panizza, Letizia, 1999, “Pico della Mirandola e il De genere dicendi philosophorum del 1485,” I Tatti Studies: Essays in the Renaissance, 8: 69–103.
  • Mauro Perani (ed.), 2008, Guglielmo Raimondo Moncada, alias Flavio Mitridate: Un ebreo converso sicliano (Atti del convegno internazionale, Caltabellotta (Agrigento) 23–24 ottobre 2004), Palermo: Officina di Studi Medievali.
  • Pignandi, Sante, 1964, “Pico della Mirandola e Pascal,” Studia Patavina, 11: 201–35

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