Plato on Friendship and Eros

First published Fri Feb 20, 2004; substantive revision Thu Feb 17, 2011

Plato discusses love (erôs) and friendship (philia) primarily in two dialogues, the Lysis and the Symposium, though the Phaedrus also adds significantly to his views. In each work, Socrates as the quintessential philosopher is in two ways center stage, first, as a lover of wisdom (sophia) and discussion (logos), and, second, as himself an inverter or disturber of erotic norms. Plato's views on love are a meditation on Socrates and the power his philosophical conversations have to mesmerize, obsess, and educate.

In what follows, section 1 deals with the Lysis and Symposium. Sections 2–4 primarily with the Symposium alone. Section 5 deals with the Phaedrus. Section 6 with the closing section of the Symposium and with parts of the Ion, Protagoras, and Laws. Sections are not self-contained, however, and are intended to be read sequentially. Most scholars agree that the order of composition of the “erotic” dialogues is Lysis, Symposium, Phaedrus, though some put the Phaedrus earlier than the Symposium.

1. Socrates and the Art of Love

“The only thing I say I know,” Socrates tells us in the Symposium, “is the art of love (ta erôtika) (177d8–9). Taken literally, it is an incredible claim. Are we really to believe that the man who affirms when on trial for his life that he knows himself to be wise “in neither a great nor a small way” (Apology 21b4–5) knows the art of love? In fact, the claim is a nontrivial play on words facilitated by the fact that the noun erôs (“love”) and the verb erôtan (“to ask questions”) sound as if they are etymologically connected—a connection explicitly exploited in the Cratylus (398c5-e5). Socrates knows about the art of love in that—but just insofar as—he knows how to ask questions, how to converse elenctically.

Just how far that is, we discover in the Lysis, where Socrates makes a similar claim. Hippothales, like Socrates, loves beautiful boys and philosophical discussions (203b6–204a3). But he does not know the art of love and so does not know how to talk to Lysis—the boy with whom he is in love. What Hippothales does is sing eulogies to Lysis, and that, Socrates argues, no skilled lover would ever do. For if your suit succeeds “everything you've said and sung turns out to eulogize yourself as victor in having won such a boyfriend,” but if it fails, then “the greater your praise of his beauty and goodness, the more you will seem to have lost and the more you will be ridiculed.” Consequently, someone “who is wise in the art of love (ta erôtika) doesn't praise his beloved until he has him: he fears how the future may turn out” (205e2–206a2). Convinced, Hippothales asks Socrates to tell him “what someone should say or do to get his prospective boyfriend to love him?” (206c1–3). As in the Symposium, Socrates is uncharacteristically forthcoming: “if you're willing to have him talk with me, I might be able to give you a demonstration of how to carry on a discussion with him” (c4–6). What follows is an elenctic examination of Lysis. Socrates' lessons in love, we may infer, are elenctic lessons—lessons in how to ask and answer questions.

At the end of the examination, Socrates characterizes what he has accomplished: “This is how you should talk to your boyfriends, Hippothales, making them humble and drawing in their sails, instead of swelling them up and spoiling them, as you do” (210e2–5). It sounds simply chastening put like that. But in the overall context of the Lysis, where love is a desire and desire is an emptiness, it is much more. It is a step in the creation of the canonical lover—the philosopher:

Those who are already wise no longer love wisdom (philosophein), whether they are gods or men. Neither do those who are so ignorant that they are bad, for no bad and stupid person loves wisdom. There remains only those who have this bad thing, ignorance, but have not yet been made ignorant and stupid by it. They are conscious of not knowing what they don't know. (218a2-b1)

So by showing Lysis that he isn't already wise, by getting him to recognize that he doesn't know, Socrates sets him on the road to philosophy (cf. Sophist 231b3–8).

The elenchus is important to love, then, because it creates a hunger for wisdom—a hunger which it cannot itself assuage. So even though Lysis is already something of a philosopher when he meets Socrates and receives a rare accolade from him—“I was pleased with his love of wisdom (philosophia)” (213d6)—he, too, is left in puzzlement (aporia). He is made aware of his desire by Socrates but the desire itself remains unsatisfied. Socrates may be the master of foreplay, of arousing desire, and may to that extent be a master of the art of love, but when it comes to satisfying desire, he is a failure.

The connection—amounting to an identification—between the art of discussion and the art of loving boys explored in the Lysis allows us to see why Plato's own explorations of love invariably involve an exploration of discussion too—love-talk in the Lysis, symposiastic speech-making and drama in the Symposium, oratory and rhetoric in the Phaedrus. Loving boys correctly, after all, is—in part at least—just a matter of knowing how to talk to them, of how to persuade them to love you back.

2. Socrates and Athenian Paiderastia

As a man who loves boys in an idiosyncratic, because elenctic, way, Socrates is placed in potential conflict with the norms of a peculiar Athenian social institution, that of paiderastia—the socially regulated intercourse between an older Athenian male (erastês) and a teenage boy (erômenos, pais), through which the latter was supposed to learn virtue. And this potential, as we know, was realized with tragic consequences—in 399 BC Socrates was found guilty of corrupting the young men of Athens and condemned to death. The effect on Plato is palpable in his works, turning very many of them into defenses—not always uncritical—of Socrates, and of what he represented for the young men he encountered. His account in the Symposium of one such relationship—that with the brilliant and beautiful Alcibiades—is an illuminating case in point.

Alcibiades was so in love with Socrates—“it was obvious,” the Symposium (222c1–2) tells us—that when asked to speak of love, he speaks of his beloved. No general theories of love for him, just the vividly remembered story of the times he spent with a man so extraordinary there has never been anyone like him—a man so powerfully erotic he turned the conventional world of love upside down by “seeming to be a lover (erastês) while really establishing himself as a beloved boy (pais) instead” (222b3–4).

The stories of all the other symposiasts, too, are stories of their particular loves masquerading as stories of love itself, stories about what they find beautiful masquerading as stories about what is beautiful. For Phaedrus and Pausanius, the canonical image of true love—the quintessential love story—features the right sort of older male lover and the right sort of beloved boy. For Eryximachus the image of true love is painted in the languages of his own beloved medicine and of all the other crafts and sciences. For Aristophanes it is painted in the language of comedy. For Agathon, in the loftier tones of tragedy. In ways that these men are unaware of, then, but that Plato knows, their love stories are themselves manifestations of their loves and of the inversions or perversions expressed in them. They think their stories are the truth about love, but they are really love's delusions—“images,” as Diotima will later call them. As such, however, they are essential parts of that truth. For the power of love to engender delusive images of the beautiful is as much a part of the truth about it as its power to lead to the beautiful itself. Later, we shall learn why.

Love stories, however inadequate as theories of love, are nonetheless stories, logoi, items that admit of analysis. But because they are manifestations of our loves, not mere cool bits of theorizing, we—our deepest feelings—are invested in them. They are therefore tailor-made, in one way at least, to satisfy the Socratic sincerity condition, the demand that you say what you believe (Crito 49c11-d2, Protagoras 331c4-d1). Under the cool gaze of the elenctic eye, they are tested for consistency with other beliefs that lie just outside love's controlling and often distorting ambit. Under such testing, a lover may be forced to say with Agathon, “I didn't know what I was talking about in that story” (201b11–12). The love that expressed itself in his love story meets then another love: his rational desire for consistency and intelligibility; his desire to be able to tell and live a coherent story; his desire—to put it the other way around—not to be endlessly frustrated and conflicted, because he is repetitively trying to live out an incoherent love story.

In Alcibiades' love story, in particular, these two desires are self-consciously in play: “Socrates is the only man in the world who has made me feel shame… I know perfectly well that I can't prove he's wrong when he tells me what I should do: yet, the moment I leave his side, I go back to my old ways: I cave in to my desire to please the crowd” (216b1–5). Even such awareness of conflict as is manifested here, however, is no guarantee of a satisfactory resolution. For the new love—the one that seems to offer coherence, satisfaction, and release from shame—may turn out to be just the old frustrating one in disguise.

Alcibiades' famous failed attempt to seduce Socrates shows that this is so in his case too (218b8-e5). For Alcibiades doesn't try to win Socrates' love by undertaking the difficult task of self-transformation required to become a more virtuous, and so more truly beautiful and lovable, person. Instead, he takes the easy, familiar path of offering the physical attractions he already has—the ones that have earned him the approval of the crowd. When these fail him, it is to the crowd (in the form of the Bacchic revelers we meet at the end of the Symposium) he will regressively return, having never really succeeded in turning away.

That he has never turned away is made yet more vivid in one of the most intriguing passages in the Symposium. Socrates, Alcibiades says, is “ironical eirôneuomenos) and spends his whole life playing with people. Yet, I don't know whether anyone else has seen the figures within (ta entos agalmata) when he is serious and opened up, but I saw them once, and I thought that they were so divine and golden, so marvelously beautiful, that I just had to do whatever Socrates told me” (216e4–217a2). Imagine seeing Socrates without his ironic mask of mock modesty. What we wouldn't give to see that. As is so often the case with love, however, it is fantasy we are dealing with. What Alcibiades thinks he sees in Socrates are embryonic virtues, which—like spermatazoa in the embryology the Symposium implicitly embraces when it speaks of the lover as pregnant and as seeking a beautiful boy in which to beget an offspring—need only be ejaculated into the right receptacle in order to grow into their mature forms (209a5-c2). Sex can lead to virtue, in other words, without the need for hard work. As soon as the illusion is enjoyed, therefore, it gives birth not to a realistic attempt to acquire virtue, but to the sexual seduction fantasy mentioned earlier.

The origins of this fantasy—though, no doubt, partly personal—are predominantly social. It is the complex ideology of Athenian paiderasteia that has shaped Alcibiades' own desires. For, according to it, love is really “two things”: good Uranian love, whose object is the soul, and whose aim is to instill virtue in the younger male; and bad Pandemotic love, whose object is the body and whose aim is sexual pleasure for the older lover (180c1-d7). What causes the split is the need Pandemotic love has to mask itself as Uranian love in order to preserve the illusion that the young man's participation in it is compatible with his status as a future male citizen. It cannot, then, be motivated by a reprehensible desire to adopt a passive, slavish, female pleasure-seeking role. Instead, another motive must be invented for it—a willingness to accept “slavery for the sake of virtue” (184c2–3).

A major cost of preserving this split, however, is that the older male's body-focused, sexual intercourse must itself be masked as intercourse of a more respectable sort. Alcibiades' later re-description of Socrates' inner figures shows him succumbing to the double-vision that inevitably results:

If you were to listen to his arguments, at first they'd strike you as totally ridiculous; they're clothed in words as coarse as the hides worn by the most vulgar satyrs. He's always going on about pack asses, or blacksmiths, or cobblers, or tanners… But if the arguments are opened and one sees them from the inside, he will find first that they are the only arguments with any sense in them, and next that they contain within themselves utterly divine and multitudinous figures of virtue (agalmat' aretês). (221e1–222a4)

For Alcibiades, then, Socrates' body is identical to his words; the virtues that are in him are in them; talking philosophy is having sexual intercourse, and vice versa.

3. Loving Socrates

At the beginning of the Symposium, an unidentified man wants to hear what was said about love by Socrates and the others at Agathon's house. He has heard a garbled account. Now he wants Apollodorus to tell him what was really said. But Apollodorus wasn't there either. He got his account of the proceedings second-hand from Aristodemus. All these men who ought to be chasing boys are presented as so besotted with Socrates and his conversations that one of them—Apollodorus—makes it his business to know exactly what Socrates does and says each day (172c4–6), while another—Aristodemus—is so far gone in his passion for Socrates that he walks barefoot like his beloved (173b1–4). One reason for this complex set-up is to let us see the inverting impact of Socrates—and so of philosophy—on Athenian paiderastic norms. Another is more subtle. Alcibiades' love for Socrates focuses on the beautiful figures of virtue which he thinks he sees lying beneath those “words as coarse as the hides worn by the most vulgar satyrs,” which are the analog for him of Socrates' ugly, satyr-like body (215b3-4). Aristodemus' love for Socrates, by contrast, seems to focus on his coarse exterior, so that Aristodemus himself is a sort of inverted Alcibiades, whose very name associates him with Pausanias' body-centered goddess of love, Pandêmos. Loving Socrates, we may infer, is a complex business, since just what someone loves in loving him is tied to that person's peculiar desires, and the limits they impose on how like Socrates he can become.

In the dialogue's next few scenes, this point is driven home. When Aristodemus meets him, Socrates has just bathed and put on his fancy sandals—“both very unusual events” (174a3–4). Aristodemus remarks on this because he is naturally sensitive to those aspects of Socrates which he himself—perhaps because of his own size and appearance (173b2)—has chosen to emulate. The reason for the departure from his usual habits, Socrates explains, is that he is going to Agathon's party and wants “beauty to go to beauty” (174a9). Oddly, this doesn't stop him from bringing Aristodemus—un-bathed, un-sandaled, un-beautiful—along. But what is odd from the point of view of Socrates' self-ascribed motivations is not at all odd from that of Plato's. He has now made the complexity of Socrates—his beautiful insides and ugly outsides or vice versa—as dramatically present to our eyes as to those of Agathon and his other guests.

Socrates is invited to Agathon's—Goodman's. (‘Agathon’ means good in Greek.) He thinks—wrongly as it happens—that Aristodemus isn't invited, but offers to take him along anyway. Aristodemus' reply—“I'll do whatever you say” (174b2)—again connects him to Alcibiades: “I just had to do whatever he told me” (217a1–2). “Come with me then,” Socrates responds, “and we shall prove the proverb wrong; the truth is, ‘Good men go uninvited to Goodman's feast’” (174b4–5).[1] Aristodemus is not convinced. “Socrates, I'm afraid… mine is the case of an inferior arriving uninvited at the table of a wise man” (174c5–7). The familiar Socratic tri-unity—good, beautiful, wise—are all now in play.

Despite his reservations, Aristodemus agrees to accompany Socrates—but with an important proviso: “See what defense you're going to make (apologêsê) for bringing me along, because I won't admit I came uninvited, I'll say you brought me!” (174c7-d1). It is this proviso that initiates the next mystifying episode. It begins when Socrates replies by under-quoting Homer: “We'll take counsel about what to say ‘when two go together along the way’” (174d2–3). What he leaves out is what happens when two do go together, namely, “one of them knows before the other” (Iliad X. 24). The elision of this phrase is matched by an elision of Plato's own. For what happened on the road to Agathon's is that “Socrates began to think about something, lost himself in thought, and kept lagging behind” (174d4–7). Yet we are never told what he thought about—what it was that one knew before the other.

That the match between these two elisions is significant is established by another match: the one between the defense Socrates doesn't give for bringing Aristodemus to Agathon's and the one he doesn't give before the jury in 399 B.C., when he is on trial for corrupting the youth. I mean, the defense Socrates' familiar spirit or daimonion prevents him from giving by not preventing him from giving the one in which he speaks and acts in his own accustomed elenctic way—in which he plays the part of himself (Ap. 40a2-b6). Later in the Symposium, the match is reestablished by the close parallels between the preamble to Socrates' speech in praise of Erôs and that to his speech before the jury. There he is “amazed (ethaumasa)” by what his accusers say (Ap. 17a4–5); here Agathon's speech is “amazing (thaumasta)” (Smp. 198b4). There he isn't a clever (deinos) speaker, unless cleverness consists in speaking the truth (Ap. 17a4-b6). Here he isn't clever in the art of love unless encomia to Erôs involve telling the truth about it (Smp. 198c5–199a6). There “what the jurors will hear will be spoken extemporaneously (epituchousin) in whatever words come to mind” (Ap. 17c1–2); here the symposiasts will “hear the truth spoken about Erôs in such words and arrangements as occur to me extemporaneously (tuchê epelthousa)” (Smp. 199b3–5). Whatever occupies Socrates on the road to Agathon's, we may infer, ends not in the knowledge Homer is so confident either he or Aristodemus will have, but in the aporetic awareness of the absence of knowledge that distinguishes Socrates' “human wisdom” from the “more than human wisdom” claimed by the sophists (Ap. 20c4-e8).

The result of Socrates' losing his way in thought and ending up stymied in Agathon's neighbor's porch is that Aristodemus, like a proper Socratic paraclete, arrives at Agathon's quite a bit before Socrates. When Socrates finally does arrive in propria person, Agathon says: “Socrates, come lie down next to me. Who knows, if I touch you, I may catch a bit of the wisdom that came to you under my neighbor's porch” (175c7-d1). Socrates replies with an obviously sexual simile, which acknowledges, so as later once again to invert, paiderastic norms: “If only wisdom were like water which always flows from a full cup into an empty one when we connect them with a piece of yarn. If wisdom were that way too, I value the place beside you very much indeed; for I think I will be filled from you with wisdom of great beauty” (175d4-e2). What actually happens, however, is the very reverse. Socrates responds to Agathon's fancy speech about love with an elenchus, so that his emptiness, his lack of knowledge, flows into Agathon, destroying the wisdom of great beauty that had won his tragedy a first prize the day before (175e4–7).

4. Love and the Ascent to the Beautiful

Socrates is adept at some parts of the art of love but cannot take his beloveds all the way. So he is clearly in need of further instruction in the art of love. In the Symposium, this is provided to him by Diotima, whom he describes as “the one who taught me the art of love” (201d5). And what she teaches him, in a nutshell, is Platonism. What the elenchus needs if it is to satisfy rather than frustrate love, in other words, is the theory of Platonic Forms. What Socrates needs—and so ought to love—is Plato! The story of Platonic love is, one might say, the story of the Platonizing of Socrates.

If what Socrates learned from Diotima was about all love, however, it would be refuted by the very fact of Alcibiades, whose love for Socrates has not led him to love the beautiful itself. It would be equally refuted, indeed, by all the other symposiasts, none of whom has been led there by his love. But Diotima's love story is not so general. It is self-advertised as a story about “loving boys correctly (to orthôs paiderastein)” (211b5–6)—as a lesson in “the correct way to go or to be led by another to the art of love” (211b7-c1). To be sure, it doesn't itself explicitly provide us with a story about how Erôs can act as a force which retards development. But that isn't because Plato thought Erôs could not act as such a force—consider Alcibiades. Rather, it is because Diotima's story is a story about successful or correct love.

The credibility of Diotima's love story is another matter, of course. To many, it has seemed both incredible and distasteful, because it seems to say that beautiful individuals have only instrumental value. When one has climbed the ladder, of which they are merely the first rung, one should kick it—and them—away. But is this message really Diotima's?

What we all love, according to Diotima, is the good—that is to say, we want good things to be ours forever. But because we are mortal, the closest we can come to satisfying this desire is to initiate an endless cycle of reproduction in which each new generation has good things. We achieve this, in a famous phrase, by “giving birth in beauty (tokos en kalô)” (206b7–8, e5). What does this mean? Like Athenian paiderasteia, Diotima recognizes two fundamentally different kinds of love, two fundamentally different varieties of the desire to give birth in beauty. In the case of heterosexual lovers, who are “pregnant in body,” such giving birth consists in producing children who resemble, and so share in the beauty of their parents (209a3–4). Homosexual lovers, however, are a different story. What they give birth to is “wisdom and the rest of virtue” (209b8). When a man who is pregnant in soul finds a beautiful boy, Diotima says, it “makes him instantly teem with accounts of virtue” (209b8), or “beautiful accounts”  (210a8). Giving birth to virtue and giving birth to accounts of it are obviously different. But some of the other phrases Diotima uses show us how to mitigate the difference. For what homosexual lovers want is to give birth to accounts of virtue of a particular sort—ones that can be used in “the proper ordering of cities and households” (209a6–7), and so can “make young men better” (210c1–3).

If the lover's accounts are to achieve this goal, however, they mustn't be the product of distorting fantasy, as Nietzsche thinks so many of our moral concepts are and as some feminists think our concept of romantic love itself is. What is intended to insure that they will not is their openness to reality—an openness guaranteed by the fact that in the course of his ascent the lover must study the beauty of ways of life and laws (210c3–5) and the beauty of the sciences (c6–7). What he gains from these studies are the conceptual resources needed to see the world, including the human world, aright—to gain knowledge of it. This is not the project an analysand takes up in psychoanalysis. Nor is it the one that we less formally undertake when we reflect on our own love stories in hopes of understanding them (often a project provoked alas by an unhappy ending). It is instead the project of philosophy, as Plato conceives of it. That is why it culminates in “the birth of many gloriously beautiful accounts and theories in unstinting love of wisdom (philosophia)” (210d5–6). Yet the grander project intersects with the analysand's project and with ours in an interesting way. The terms or concepts we use to tell our love stories must themselves be coherent if the stories we use them to tell are themselves to be coherently livable.

In Plato's view, this means that they must be the concepts the true lover uses once he has seen the beautiful itself—the concepts whose ontological correlates are forms. If they are not, they will be incoherent and the lover who employs them will find himself embroiled in a love story he does not understand, a love story whose incoherence the elenchus, or psychoanalysis, or just plain critical scrutiny will reveal. It is this incoherence, indeed, encountered at lower stages in the ascent, that leads the correct lover, under pressure from his rational desire for truth and consistency, and the pain of inconsistency, to climb to the next stage.

We can see Diotima, then, not only as revealing the other more abstract loves that a true lover of boys must have, but also as exploring the conditions concepts must meet if they are to figure in genuinely coherent love stories. Her story isn't about a lover who abandons the individual boys he loves, but about someone who comes to love boys successfully by coming to love something else as well.

Like Diotima herself, we have been concentrating on what other things a lover is led to love by his love for his beloved boy. We have said nothing about the changes explorations in this enlarged erotic field effect in the desires and feelings of the lover himself. But these, too, help us to see what happens to his love for his boy in the course of his explorations. What hooks the lover to begin with is love for a particular body: “First, if the Leader leads aright, he should love one body and beget beautiful accounts there” (210a6–8). At this stage, what the boy engages in the lover is his sexual desire for physical beauty, albeit one which, in firm keeping with the norms of Athenian paiderastia, is supposedly aim-inhibited: instead of sexual intercourse, it leads to discussions about beauty and to accounts of it. Here the beauty at issue is, in the first instance, the boy who represents beauty itself to the lover. That is why, when the lover finally comes to see the beautiful itself, “beauty will no longer seem to you to be measured by gold or raiment or beautiful boys or youths, which now you look upon dumbstruck” (211d3–5). One effect of generating accounts of this beauty, however, is that the lover comes to see his beloved's beautiful body as one among many: if it is beautiful, so are any other bodies the accounts fit. And this initially cognitive discovery leads to a conative change: “Realizing this he is established as a lover of all beautiful bodies and relaxes this excessive preoccupation with one, thinking less of it and believing it to be a small matter” (210b4–6).

It is important in reading Diotima's description of this change that we see it as comparative and contrastive: the lover used to overvalue his beloved (211d5–8, quoted below)—now he values him appropriately. But valuing appropriately is still valuing. The boy is still included in the class of beautiful bodies the lover now loves. It is also important to notice that cognitive and conative change are going hand-in-hand. To recognize that his beloved is one among many, the lover's love for him has to change. And that means that psychological resources within the lover—beyond his sexual responsiveness to physical beauty—are coming into play. More of the lover is now involved in his love. Hence what his beloved might be thought to lose in exclusivity he gains in richness—and no doubt in endurance and reliability—of response. When his physical bloom fades, he will now still be loved.

But love that is to escape frustration cannot stop with bodies. The attempt to formulate an account of love free from puzzles and immune to elenctic refutation must lead on from beautiful bodies to beautiful souls, and so to the beautiful laws and practices that will improve souls and make young men better. Again this cognitive achievement is matched by a conative one. When the lover sees that all these beautiful things are somehow akin in the beauty, he comes to think that “bodily beauty is a small thing” (210c5–6), and so, as before, becomes less obsessed with it.

At the top of the scala amoris lies the beautiful itself, the first loved object that—like the “primary object of love (prôton philon) in the Lysis (219d2-e4)—is not in any way gone beyond. Here, it seems, the lover at last finds something worthy of the obsessive attention he had once lavished on his beloved boy (211d8–212a7). Nonetheless, obsession is out of place even here. For the beautiful itself can no more satisfy the lover's desires to eat and drink than his beloved can. Here—as there—what he would do if it were possible must not be confused with what he can and does do. After all, the lover himself cannot become immortal except by giving birth in the beauty he has at last found. He does that, however, precisely by arranging for his beloved to grow up, become truly virtuous, and be with him in the contemplation of—and, to the extent that it is possible, the possession of—true beauty.

5. The Art and Psychology of Love Explained

In the Phaedrus we find a more detailed account of the psychology and art of love than in the Symposium. This account will be our exclusive focus. The soul, whether divine or human, Socrates claims, is like “the natural union of a team of winged horses and their charioteer” (246a6–7). But whereas in a divine soul all three elements are “good and come from good stock,” in a human soul the white horse (familiar from Republic IV as the honor-loving spirited element) is “beautiful and good, and of similar stock,” while the black one (the Republic's appetitive element) is “the opposite and of the opposite stock,” so that “the driving in our case is necessarily difficult and troublesome” (a7-b4). When spirit together with the charioteer (the Republic's rational element, there too identified with what is truly human rather than bestial in us (588b10–589a4)) “leads us towards what is best and is in control,” we possess moderation (sôphrosunê) (237e2–3). But when “appetite drags us irrationally towards pleasures and rules in us, its rule is called excess (hubris)” (238a1–2). Of this excess, gluttony is one species, but erotic love another (238b7-c4). This is the bad kind of love—Pandemotic in the Symposium—that Lysias rightly disparages in the speech Phaedrus admires and reads to Socrates (230e6–234c5).

In Socrates' view, however, there is also another kind of love, namely, “the madness of a man who, on seeing beauty here on earth, and being reminded of true beauty, becomes winged, and fluttering with eagerness to fly upwards, but unable to leave the ground, looks upwards like a bird, and takes no heed of things below—and that is what causes him to be regarded as mad” (249d5-e1). This madman is the philosopher of the Symposium, who when he falls in love with a boy is led by his love to ascend by stages to the form of the beautiful. What makes his madness a divine gift, however, is that the ascent is now revealed as involving recollection of a prior pre-natal ascent taken in the company of a god.

From the rich literary account of this ascent, we need to take away just one idea: souls have different psychological structures depending on which god they followed, since this sets an upper limit on how much of the forms they see, and so how much they can subsequently recollect. Since gaining access to forms nourishes and strengthens the rational element in the soul (248b5-c2), this also helps determine their motivational structure: the stronger their reason is, the more likely it will be to succeed in controlling the other elements in the soul.

Followers of Zeus, for example, choose someone to love whose soul resembles their patron god. So they seek someone who is “naturally disposed to philosophy and leadership, and when they have found him and fall in love they do everything to make him philosophical” (252e1–5). Nonetheless, the falling itself involves a huge psychological upheaval. The black horse of appetite immediately urges towards sexual intercourse. The white horse—“constrained then as always by shame” (254a2)—holds itself back. Eventually, however, the black horse forces both the charioteer and the white horse “to move towards the beloved and mention to him the delights of sex” (a5–7). Again they balk, “indignant at being forced to do terrible and improper things” (b1). But finally, “when there is no limit to their plight, they follow its lead, giving in and agreeing to do what it tells them” (b2–3). As they come close to the beloved, however, to initiate intercourse, the flashing face of the beloved reminds the charioteer of the beautiful itself, so that his memory “again sees it standing together with temperance on a holy pedestal” (b5–7). He becomes frightened and “in sudden reverence falls on his back, and is forced at the same time to pull back the reins so violently as to bring the horses down on their haunches, the one willingly, because of it lack of resistance to him, but the unruly horse much against its will” (b7-c3). Eventually, “when the same thing happens to the evil horse many times, it allows the charioteer with his foresight to lead” (e5–7). If this control of appetite by reason and spirit continues—even when the boy has accepted his lover and embraces, kisses, and lies down with him—and draws them to “a well-ordered life and to philosophy,” they are blessedly happy here on earth, and, if they live such a life for three successive incarnations, they re-grow their wings and re-join the entourage of their god (255e2-b7).

When followers of Ares fall in love, on the other hand, they “adopt a lower way of living, not philosophical, but honor-loving” (256b7-c1). When they are drinking together, for example, or are careless in some other way, “the licentious horses in the two of them catch their souls off guard,” and since the man's recollection of beauty is dimmer and is not rekindled by philosophical conversation, they end up having sex together—something “the masses regard as the happiest choice of all” (c1–5). Nonetheless, they don't have sex very often, because “what they are doing has not been approved by their whole mind” (c6–7). So while the degree of their love and happiness is less than the philosophical pair and, on their death, “they leave the body without wings,” still they have an impulse, coming from love, to try to gain them. Hence they aren't punished in the next life, but helped on the way to future happiness together (c7-e2).

The love that is divine madness is a good thing, therefore, especially when, “accompanied by philosophical discussions (erôta meta philosophôn logôn)” (257b6), it leads to the beautiful itself and the other forms, which are what we—as most of all the rational element in our souls—truly love and crave. The question is what makes a discussion philosophical? What makes it of the sort to be included in the true art of love that the philosopher who loves the beautiful itself practices? The answer now proposed is that it must be a technê or craft, and so must have the defining characteristics of one. As applied to love itself, for example, it must begin with a definition of love, and reach its conclusions by ordering its discussion in relation to it (263d5-e3). And this definition, in turn, must be established by what Socrates refers to as collection and division (266b3–4).

Collection is a process of “perceiving together and bringing into one form items that are scattered in many places” (265d3–4). It is a process that we, unlike other animals, are able to engage in it, because our souls include a rational element that has prior acquaintance with forms: “a soul that never [prenatally] saw what is true cannot take a human shape, since a human being must understand what is said by relation to a form that is reached from many sense-perceptions being collected into one by reasoning” (249b5-c1). (It is useful to compare this description with the one given in Aristotle, Posterior Analytics II. 19.)

Once a form has been reached in this way, division begins. This is a matter of “cutting the form up again, by relation to [sub-]forms, by relation to its natural joints” (265e1-2). As an example, Socrates cites the case of love itself:

just as a single body naturally has its parts in pairs, with both members of each pair having the same name, and labeled respectively left and right, so the two speeches regarded madness as naturally a single form in us. The one [Socrates' reorganized version of Lysias' attack on love] cut off the part on the left side, then cutting it again, and not giving up until it had found among the parts a love which is, as we say, “left-handed,” and abused it with full justice, while the other speech [Socrates' own defense of love] led us to the parts of madness on the right-hand side, and discovering and exhibiting a love which shares the same name as the other, but is divine, it praised it as a cause of our greatest goods. (265e4–266b1)

Thus, while each speech tells only half the story, the two together show how correct division should proceed. The goal, however, isn't just truth or correctness, but explanatory adequacy. Thus if the form in question “is simple, we should consider…what natural capacity it has for acting and on what, or for being acted upon and by what,” and if it is complex, we should count its sub-forms, and consider the same things about them as about the simple ones (270d3–7). That Socrates—the archetypal searcher for explanatory definitions (Euthyphro 6d9-e6)—should pronounce himself “a lover of these divisions and collections” is no surprise, therefore (266b3–4).

Philosophy aims at true definitions and true stories based on them. But it also aims at persuasion, since the philosophical lover wants to persuade his boy to follow him on the path to the forms. Philosophy and rhetoric must thus go together, which means that rhetoric, too, must be developed as a technê. It must, first, distinguish and give definitions of the various kinds of souls and kinds of speeches, revealing their respective capacities and susceptibilities, and, second, “coordinate each kind of soul with the kind of speech appropriate to it, explaining why one kind of soul is necessarily convinced by one kind of speech, while another is not” (271b1–5). Mastery of such a science, however, requires one further thing: “the student must observe these things as they are in real life, and actually being put into practice, and be able to follow them with keen perception” (d8-e1). It isn't enough, in other words, to know what kinds of speeches affect what kinds of soul, the philosophical rhetorician must also know that this man in front of him is of such and such a kind, and be able to talk in the kind of way that will prove convincing to him (e2–272b2).

6. Writing About Love

At the end of the Symposium, Alcibiades has gone off, presumably with the throng of Bacchic revelers, who burst into his life as representatives of his overpowering love for the approval and flattery of the crowd. Socrates, Aristophanes, and Agathon are left behind discussing tragedy and comedy: “the main point was that Socrates was trying to prove to them that the same man knows (epistasthai) how to write both comedy and tragedy, that someone who is by craft (technê) a tragic poet is a comic poet too” (223d2–6).

The key words here, as we learn in the Ion, are epistasthai and technê. Ordinary poets cannot write both comedy and tragedy, because they do not write out of knowledge and craft (technê) but out of divine inspiration (Ion 534c5–6). If they did write out of craft and knowledge, if they were craftsmen poets, they would be able to write both comedy and tragedy, because opposites are always studied by the same craft. Thus the comedic craft and the tragic craft would have to be one and the same; just as one and the same craft, medicine, deals with both sickness and health.

Socrates tells us what a craftsman poet would be able to write, he does not tell us what he would write. Other Platonic spokesmen are somewhat more forthcoming. “We ourselves are poets,” the Athenian Stranger tells us in the Laws, “who have to the best of our ability created a tragedy that is the finest and the best; at any rate, our entire constitution is constructed as an imitation of the finest and best way of life—the very thing which we claim is the truest tragedy” (817b1–5). Earlier in the same discussion, the Stranger is equally explicit that this same constitution, though not a comedy, does nonetheless embody comedic knowledge:

Someone who is going to gain practical wisdom can't learn serious matters without learning ridiculous ones, or anything else, for that matter, without its opposite. But if we intend to acquire virtue, even on a small scale, we can't be serious and comic too, and this is precisely why we must learn to recognize what is ridiculous, to avoid being trapped by our ignorance of it into doing or saying something ridiculous, when we don't have to. (816d5-e5)

The Laws is a tragedy, then, because it is “an imitation of the finest and best way of life.”

The Symposium is a tragedy for an analogous reason: it contains an imitation of one part of such a life, namely, what the Protagoras terms a “symposium of beautiful and good men” who “test each other's mettle in mutual argument” by asking and answering questions (347d3–348a9). This is how Socrates responds to Agathon's speech. It is how Diotima converses with Socrates. It is the type of symposium Socrates tries to re-establish when Alcibiades' “satyr-play” is finished, and the throng of Bacchic revelers has left.

Unlike the Laws, however, the Symposium is a comedy too, since it also contains an imitation of the second best kind of symposium described in the Protagoras—one where there are poets present, and where the participants “argue over points that can't be established with any certainty” (347e1–7). An accurate description, surely, of the speeches made by all the symposiasts who speak prior to Socrates.

Finally, Alcibiades arrives with—significantly enough—a flute-girl (212c5-e3; compare 176e6-7). And though she does not play, her arrival inaugurates the further decline of the symposium into something even more like the kind of symposium reviled in the Protagoras as “a symposium of common, vulgar fellows… who, unable to entertain one another with their own conversation, put up the price of flute-girls, and pay large sums to hear the sound of the flute instead of their own talk” (347c4-d2). This is the element of satyr-play in the Symposium—satyr imagery is frequent in Alcibiades' speech.[2]

The idea is the one mentioned earlier. Some love stories—the good ones—are tragedies (in the special sense of the term introduced in the Laws): they involve the kind of love found in the best kind of life, a life that comes as close as possible to the divine—one in which we achieve happiness by having good things be ours forever (205d1–206a12). Other love stories are comedies: they involve a lesser kind of love. Others still are satyr plays: genital farces. But the true story of love, the story that is Plato's Symposium itself, is the story of all these stories. In the Symposium, it takes the form appropriate to its genre and audience. But in the Phaedrus, we learn of the longer more technical road it might take in the future, when armed with a scientific psychology and rhetoric it becomes a matter for experts.


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