Notes to Plato on Rhetoric and Poetry

1. From Thomas 1954: 192–93.

2. While “representation” and “imitation” are standard meanings of “mimesis,” the inclusion of “expression” in a list of possible meanings of the term might seem odd. I say just a bit below in support of this; for a full-fledged argument, see Halliwell 2002. On p. 14 (n. 31) he remarks: “I develop my twin theses that ancient ideas of mimesis often encompass a dimension of what would now be counted, by many aestheticians, as expression, and that representation and expression are not mutually exclusive concepts in the interpretation of art, as they have so often been taken to be (especially under the influence of Croce), in chapters 4, 5, 8, 10 (notes 23, 47), and 12.”

3. Unless otherwise noted, I shall be using A. Bloom's (1968) translation of the Republic. For the Greek text of the Republic I have used Burnet (ed.) 1968. The identity of the authors quoted here by Plato's Socrates is not known, though the lines seem to be from lyric poetry and from comedy (possibly they are all from comedy). This is surprising in that one would have expected Socrates to identify well established opponents, presumably authors contributing to the main genres of poetry he has been attacking (tragedy and epic).

4. See Nightingale 1995, p. 65, and ch. 2 generally on the literary and historical context of the “quarrel.” Whether Plato is also the last major philosopher to discern a deep and comprehensive conflict between philosophy and poetry is an interesting question. Certainly Plato's best student, Aristotle, did not follow Plato in this respect. At the same time, like many philosophers Aristotle clearly believes that when it comes to grasping truth, philosophy is superior to poetry. It should be noted that some of Plato's philosophical predecessors, such as Xenophanes and Heraclitus, did direct rather severe criticisms against poets (including Homer and Hesiod).

5. See Plato's Apology 18b-19e. Socrates lists several sophists by name—Gorgias, Prodicus, Hippias (all three of whom appear in Plato's dialogues, and two of whom are named in the titles of dialogues)—and denies that he possesses the knowledge they sell. I note that some scholars capitalize “Sophist” and cognates when referring to an established profession in ancient Greece, a convention I have avoided here in order to avoid both confusion as well as giving the impression that there existed an established or well defined “school” of sophistry.

6. For further discussion of the interpretive issues, see J. Annas and C. Rowe (eds.) 2002; Blondell 2002; and Griswold (ed.) 2002 [1988]. See also Griswold 1999b and a follow-up exchange with C. Kahn published in the same journal, volume 20 (2000), pp. 189-97. The bibliographies to these works offer numerous other relevant sources.

7. It is not known whether or not Ion is Plato's literary creation. The interlocutors in Plato's dialogues are sometimes historical characters (whose pronouncements are with rare exceptions assumed to be Plato's invention), sometimes not, even within the same dialogue (as possibly is in the case of the Ion; we know that a Socrates did exist). All quotations from the Ion are from the translation in Woodruff 1997.

8. Apol. 20d-e, 29a-b. Recall that in the Apol. Socrates recounts that to discover the meaning of the pronouncement of the Oracle at Delphi (that no one is wiser than Socrates), he interrogated three types of claimants to wisdom: the politicians, the poets, and the artisans. The poets were unable to answer his questions about the meaning of their poetry—bystanders could do that better!—from which it seemed to follow that poets do not work from wisdom so much as from inspiration (Apol. 22b-c). Naturally, the poets were angry with Socrates, and contributed to the indictment of Socrates (Apol. 23e).

9. H.-G. Gadamer asks: “Although Plato assures us to the contrary, is not his inability to do justice to the poets and to the art of poetry nevertheless an expression of the age-old rivalry between poets and philosophers?” See Gadamer 1980, p. 46.

10. In book III, music is assessed and regulated, and at 401a-c Socrates suggests that painting too, inter alia, must be regulated. This raises the question as to whether the critique of poetry is meant to extend to all of the “fine arts.” Whatever the answer, it is clear that discursive poetry poses the greatest danger, presumably because its medium is that by which we primarily articulate and shape both soul and world.

11. It should be noted that Socrates also allows, in passing, that the guardians can imitate unworthy characters “in play” (396d3-e2); perhaps, that is, by way of making fun of them, but in any case without really identifying with them or being really affected (won over, shaped) by them. Plato himself imitates “bad” people, however, both in the Republic and elsewhere.

12. The commentator referred to is D. Clay, in Clay 2000, pp. 118, 120.

13. For a discussion of some of them, see Griswold 1981.

14. This point is made (and “counterfeit” is used) in Urmson 1997, p. 233.

15. This point is made in a slightly stronger form in Clay 2000, p. 146. As he intriguingly puts it: “Socrates is describing himself [at Rep. 604e], which is to say that Plato, who never competed as a tragedian in the dramatic festivals of Athens, is describing the subject of his own dramatic imitations.”

16. Lear 1998, p. 240.

17. G. R. F. Ferrari helpfully notes that “poets will appeal to that in us which dwells upon the particular flavour of a human situation rather than to our capacity to minimise it; being vivid, after all, is what the medium of imitation both invites and excels at. It has an inbuilt tendency, then, to heighten the particular, to focus upon crises.” And again: “It is not the passing tremor caused by the sound or appearance of the imitation that he [Plato] considers most dangerous, but the deeper fear of which it is a symptom—a fear which can hold sway over an entire life … . For if my heart swells as I watch son part from mother, or lovers lose their chance of happiness, it swells not only for the characters but for the human situation to which the performance gives me access: I weep that sons must part from mothers, that things should be so.” See Ferrari 1989, pp. 134, 140.

18. Tragedy is referred to six times in book X (595b4, 597e6, 598d8, 602b9, 605c11, 607a3; see also 595c1). Comedy is referred to twice (without citation of any authors of comedies), in one paragraph (606c2-9). Tragedy is plainly Socrates' chief target in his critique of poetry, but it is not his only one. Since Homer is identified as the origin of tragedy and is the most important target of the criticism, and since he wrote in epic, “tragedy” is being taken in a sense that goes beyond literary form. The “tragic vision of life” is Socrates' target.

19. Plato's refusal to carve off a realm of the aesthetic from the ethical may be connected at a deep level to a refusal to treat the beautiful as though it were thinkable separately from the good. One of the underpinnings of Plato's account, that is, may be a metaphysical view.

20. Ferrari again puts it well: “The poet has a skill all his own: not understanding, but capturing the appearance, the look and feel of human life. But just as an image is, or rather should be (in Plato's view), for the sake of its original, the art of image-making is destined to be the helpmate of the art that seeks truth. Poetry cannot, so to speak, be trusted on its own, but as the ward of a philosophic guardian can put its talent to good use.” See Ferrari 1989, p. 108.

21. Symp. 205b8-c2. Socrates there says “Well, you know, for example, that ‘poetry’ has a very wide range. After all, everything that is responsible for creating something out of nothing is a kind of poetry; and so all the creations of every craft and profession are themselves a kind of poetry, and everyone who practices a craft is a poet”. I am using the Nehamas and Woodruff (1997a) translation of the Symposium.

22. See Rep. 500e-501c (cf. 484c-d) where the philosopher-founder is compared to a painter. At 500c2-7 we are told, remarkably, that he “imitates” the Forms, likening himself to them as much as possible. 

23. See Urmson 1997, pp. 231-233, for a striking list of quotations to this effect, including the lines from Dylan Thomas quoted at the start of this essay.

24. See Nehamas 1999, pp. 279-299. On p. 287 he asserts that “the greatest part of contemporary criticisms of television depends on a moral disapproval that is identical to Plato's attack on epic and tragic poetry in the fourth century B.C.”

25. For an analysis of the rhetoric and the meaning of the rhetoric of the Prot., see Griswold 1999a. I will be quoting from the D. Zeyl (1997) translation of the Gorgias, except that I have substituted “rhetoric” for “oratory.”

26. For an interesting discussion, see Roochnik 1991b.

27. S. Scully (2003, p. 15, n. 39) notes that Socrates' first speech is “the only speech in all of Plato where a speaker calls upon the Muses.”

28. I am using the Nehamas and Woodruff 1997b translation of the Phaedrus.

29. By contrast: Plato concludes the Sophist with a series of distinctions intended to isolate and describe the sophist. They include the distinction between a speaker who does not know the truth but thinks he does, and a speaker who (rightly) suspects that he does not know the truth but nonetheless pretends to his audience that he does. The latter, the sophist, is an “insincere and unknowing” (268c8-9) imitator of the truth. It is presupposed in these passages that the sophist has an art (techne). I am using the N. P. White (1997) translation of the Sophist.

30. In the Sophist (263e) and Theaetetus (189e) Plato defines thinking as the soul's conversation with itself.

31. For further discussion of this point, including of how the problem of self-deception is grounded in the Phaedrus' “palinode” speech, see Griswold 1996 [1986], pp. 172–173, 199.

32. For some discussion and references to the literature, see Griswold 1996 [1986], Chapter 6.

33. For some discussion and references to the literature, see the works cited in footnote 6 above.

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