Notes to Method and Metaphysics in Plato's Sophist and Statesman

1. On the Sophistic movement itself, which owes its negative assessment largely to Plato, see Kerferd, 1981; Barney, 2006; and with special reference to Plato’s Sophist, Notomi, 1999, ch. 2.

2. The most important sections about being are the Battle of Gods and Giants (Sophist 245e–249d) and the aporetic passage that follows (249d–251a). The Gods are friends of the forms, who look a lot like middle period Platonists, and the Giants are materialists. The Stranger offers the reformed Giants a definition (horos) of being as a capacity (dunamis) to do something to something else or to be affected by something else (247d–e). For different views on the Battle of Gods and Giants, see Owen, 1966, Keyt, 1969, and Brown, 1998.

3. The myth has been much debated but will not be discussed in this essay. For some interpretations, see Rowe, 1995, Ferrari, 1995, and Lane, 1998, Part II.

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