Notes to Method and Metaphysics in Plato's Sophist and Statesman

1. On the Sophistic movement itself, which owes its negative assessment largely to Plato, see Kerferd 1981, Barney 2006; and with special reference to Plato’s Sophist, Notomi 1999, ch. 2.

2. The most important sections about being are the Battle of Gods and Giants (Sophist 245e–249d) and the aporetic passage that follows (Sophist 249d–251a). The Gods are friends of the forms and look a lot like middle period Platonists (committed to separate immaterial forms), and the Giants are materialists. The Stranger tries to reconcile the two groups by getting them to agree on a definition of being. He offers the reformed Giants a definition (horos) of being as a capacity (dunamis) to do something to something else or to be affected by something else (Sophist 247d–e), and then tries unsuccessfully to get the Gods to agree (Sophist 248a–e). For different interpretations of the Battle of Gods and Giants, see Owen 1966, Keyt 1969, Brown 1998, and Gill 2012, chs. 3 and 7.

3. The myth has been much debated but will not be discussed in this essay. For some interpretations, see Rowe 1995, Ferrari 1995, and Lane 1998, Part II.

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