Notes to Plato on utopia

1. Guthrie (1987, p. 322).

2. Stalley (1983, p. 3). On authenticity, see Guthrie (1987, pp. 321-2).

3. For discussions of stylometry, see Brandwood (1976, pp. xvi-xviii), (1990), Brandwood in Kraut (1992, pp. 90-120), Kahn (1996, especially pp. 36-70), Keyser (1991), (1992), Ledger (1989), Nails (1992) and Young (1994).

4. Also see Laws 660Dff., 696B-697C and 742D-744A. Note that justice includes wisdom (phronêsis), 631C5-8. There will be citizens, to be sure, in whom the law fails to instill the whole of virtue, but Plato never suggests that the laws fail in the case of every non-philosopher. Indeed, he expects that there will be quite a few successes, see, e.g., Laws 630C, 631CD, 641BC, 647CD, 705E-706A, 707D, 731E-732B, 734E-735A, 742C-743C, 770C-771A, 790B, 807CE, 817BC, 818CD, 822E-823A, 853BC, 876CD, 878AB, 913BC, 921D-922A, 945BE, 946E-947B, and 963A.

The Republic (e.g. 419A-421C) holds that the goal of the laws is to bring about the greatest possible happiness in the city. The Laws (e.g., 631B3-6, 718B2-4, 743C5-6, 806C3-7) still holds that the ultimate end of the legal system is to bring about the greatest possible happiness in the city. This agreement between the Republic and the Laws that the goal of the laws is to make the city or its citizens as happy as possible is compatible with the claim that such happiness is realized in quite different ways in the two dialogues and, in particular, with the idea that they disagree about whether non-philosophical citizens can be become genuinely virtuous.

5. Annas (1999, pp. 31-51) argues that, in the Laws, virtue is the only component of happiness. Bobonich (2002, pp. 210-215) disagrees, and gives a detailed discussion of the options.

6. For more on these issues, including further references, see Bobonich (2002, pp. 350-373) and Frede (2010).

7. There is some disagreement about what precisely this model of the soul is meant to explain and, thus, what range of psychic phenomena we can understand by reference to this model. See e.g. Kamtekar (2010, p. 130) and Frede (2010, p. 118) for suggestions that this model is not meant to capture all of Plato’s psychology in the Laws.

8. Dorothea Frede suggests (2010, p. 116) that “puppet” is a misleading translation if it suggests that external forces pull the strings, and that Plato has something like a wind-up toy in mind instead.

9. There is, of course, controversy over whether to take the division of the soul in the Republic to involve agent-like parts or something more like aspects. For those who take the Republic to be committed to agent-like parts, however, the Laws Book 1 model will be strikingly different. For discussion of partitioning, see Bobonich (2002) and (2010), Lorenz (2006), Price (2009), and Barney, Brennan, Brittain ed. (2012).

10. For more on the puppet metaphor and issues it raises, see Bobonich (2002, pp. 260-288), Frede (2010), and Müller (2013).

11. See Bobonich (2002, pp. 350-373) for a discussion of pleasure in the Laws which advances this interpretation. For references to other interpretations, see section 7 of this article (Poetry and Education).

12. See Irwin (1995, pp. 343-345) and Bobonich (2002, p. 522, fn. 141) for this claim.

13. For a discussion on Plato’s use of history, and its relation to his political project in the Laws, see Schofield (2010); for a discussion of the notion of slavery to the laws and its connection to virtue, see Annas (2010).

14. This claim could fruitfully be compared with Plato’s suspicion of law in other places: see Stsmn. 294A-296A, and also Laws 875C-D.

15. E.g. Saunders (1976, pp. 27-8).

16. Dodds (1973, pp. 209-13), Vlastos (1981, pp. 210-17).

17. Gregory Vlastos (1981, p. 216), for example, suggests that Plato came to think in the Laws that no one, not even a fully virtuous philosopher, could hold autocratic power without being corrupted because of Plato's own final encounter with Dionysus the Younger in Sicily. But this explanation is unsatisfying. Even if Plato had thought that Dionysus was well-brought up, fully virtuous, and possessed full philosophical understanding, it would be rash to generalize from this one case to all possible cases. But Plato thought that Dionysus was badly brought up (Epist. VII 332CD) and had a low opinion of his philosophical knowledge (Epist. VII 338D-339B, 340B-341B, 344D-345C).  (This assumes, for the sake of the argument, that the Seventh Letter is genuine and that it gives us direct insight into Plato's state of mind. On the latter point, see Annas (1999, pp. 72-7.)) It would thus be irrational for Plato to generalize from his experience with Dionysus to the capacities of all human beings. Dion would come closer to Plato's ideal (although his early upbringing must have been somewhat defective, Epist. VII 327B1-4) and Vlastos (1981, p. 216, n. 29) plausibly suggests that Plato did not think that Dion was an autocrat corrupted by power, but was a good man who came to grief because of his associates' villainy (Epist. VII 351DE).

18. Bobonich (2002). For others who think that there are significant differences between the Republic and the late dialogues on some important points, especially the education of the citizens, see Cooper (1999, pp. 165-91), Irwin (1995, pp. 349-53) and the nuanced accounts of Laks (1990), (2000). For a recent defense of a unitarian position on the relation between the Republic and the Laws, see Rowe (2010); for a defense of the idea that the non-philosophic citizens of the Republic (including those in the producer class) are happier than the non-philosophic citizens of the Laws, see Kraut (2010).

19. Plato's ranking here is:  in first place, full communism throughout the entire citizen body; in second place, the constitution of Magnesia that they are now describing (Laws 739E, 807B and 875D); in third place, constitutions approximating the second best one in less favorable circumstances. See Barker (1960, pp. 370-1 n. 2). The point that this is not the ideal of the Republic was rightly noted long ago by Natorp and recently reemphasized by André Laks (2001). Barker's (1960, p. 251 n. 1, pp. 370-1 n. 1) only reason for rejecting what he agrees is the clear meaning of the text is that he cannot accept that Plato could have a higher ideal than the Republic.

20. Laws 737Eff. and see Brunt (1993, p. 247). Golding and Golding (1975, p. 353) estimate Magnesia's population at about 50,000 plus resident aliens.

21. On land ownership in Magnesia, see Morrow (1960, pp. 105-7). For limitations on the lotholder's testamentary powers, see Laws 877CE and 923Aff.

22. Laws 955E3-4 and 847E2-848B6; also see Morrow (1960, pp. 395-6).

23. Some have interpreted Plato to mean that the highest class has only between two and three times the value of the lot, i.e. their total property taking the notional value of the lot into account would be worth up to four times the value of the lot. The interpretation that they may have movable assets up to four times the value of the lot is held by Aristotle (Politics 1265b22 and 1266b7) and is convincingly argued for by Morrow (1960, p. 131 n. 112). This is important, since the other interpretation reduces the lowest class to the level of subsistence farmers and thus significantly reduces their chances for political participation or leisurely activity. For an important discussion of leisure in the Laws, see Samaras (2012).

24. For an excellent discussion of the family, the household, and the role of women in the Laws, see Samaras (2010).

25. See Morrow (1960, p. 112-3).

26. The legal and social status of women in Magnesia is not entirely clear, for good treatments, see Cohen (1987), Okin (1979), and Saunders (1995). For more discussion with further references see Bobonich (2002, pp. 384-91) and Samaras (2010).

27. On the Assembly, see Morrow (1960, pp. 156-65, 174-6 and 229) and Piérart (1973, pp. 89-121).

28. Morrow (1960, pp. 195-215) and Piérart (1973, pp. 152-208).

29. For discussion with references, see Bobonich (2002, pp. 395-408) and Saunders (1995).

30. For (i), see Stalley (1994, p. 171 n. 65); for (ii) Laks (1991). For recent discussions of the preludes and related issues, see Annas (2010), Bobonich (2002, pp. 97-119), Cooper (1999, pp. 184-90), Irwin (1995, pp. 349-53), Laks (1990), (1991), Nightingale (1993), (1999), and Stalley (1994).

31. For a defense of (II), see Bobonich (2002, pp. 41-88) with discussion of and references to opposing points of view. Among such opposing views, see especially Kamtekar (1998) and Kraut (1973) and (2010).

32. See, e.g., Cooper (1999, pp. 165-91).

33. “Nocturnal Council” is by now traditional, but “Dawn Council” would be a more accurate translation and would avoid the sinister connotations of the former

34. Barker (1960, pp. 406-10) and Klosko (1988) and (2008).

35. Klosko (1988, p. 85).

36. Laws 875A1-C3, on the Laws’ provisions against unchecked power, see Morrow (1960, pp. 521-43).

37. Morrow (1960, pp. 500-18).

38. For a fine discussion of what he calls the “documentary fallacy,” see Saunders (1995).

39. This claim is stated only roughly here, the issues that it raises are complex. For further discussion, see Bobonich (2002, pp. 418-73) and for a related point concerning Aristotle's political theory, see Irwin (1990).

40. The most striking statement of such connection is given at 672E5, where the Athenian Visitor claims that “[i]n our view, choristry as a whole is identical with education as a whole”, but the idea that music and poetry in particular have great educational importance recurs throughout the work (see e.g. the Book 3 claim that the decline of Athens started with the erosion of standards in music (Laws 700A-791B)).

41. Plato regularly expresses skepticism about cultural variation; see also, e.g., Laws 656D-657C for his praise of the Egyptians’ bans on innovation in painting, sculpture, and music.

42. In contrasting the text of the Laws with the poets, Plato claims that the constitution (politeia) is an imitation (mimesis) of the finest and best life and that it is “the truest tragedy” (Laws 817B3-5). André Laks’ “Plato’s ‘truest tragedy’: Laws Book 7, 817a-d” undertakes to explain this fascinating claim, arguing, among other things, that we should think that the inevitable conflict between reason and pleasure and the resulting need for punishment in the state are part of why the constitution is a tragedy. For another interpretation of this claim, see Sauvé Meyer (2011).

43. The claim that the non-philosophers in the Republic don’t achieve anything approaching genuine virtue is, however, controversial. For a recent defense of the claims that non-philosophers in the Republic have a meaningful sort of ordinary virtue that nonetheless falls short of full virtue, and that Plato’s views of ordinary virtue in the Republic and the Laws are importantly continuous, see Kraut (2010). See also section 5 (Preludes in the Laws) for further discussion.

44. See Bobonich (2002, pp. 350-373) for a discussion of pleasure in the Laws which advances this interpretation. Kamtekar (2010) accepts that Bobonich’s account gives us part of the reason for the centrality of music and gymnastics in the educational program, but thinks that it can’t give us the whole story; she also emphasizes the effect that they have on the non-rational parts of the soul, e.g. their ability to engage with psychological affections which have become separated from their associated beliefs. Morrow (1960, p. 305) also takes the natural human pleasure in orderly movement to be crucial to the explanation of the educational program but fits this into an interpretation which focuses rather on the status of music and dance as imitations of good and bad character.

45. That there is some important connection between value and order in the Laws is suggested by, for example, Plato’s willingness to infer from the order in the heavens that the cause of that order must be “good with every virtue” (Laws 899B6). Plato develops a more explicit account of the connection between order and value in the Philebus (26B5-C2) and seems to try to work it out in the ethical context in the Statesman. See Bobonich (2002, pp. 206-9) for more discussion, including further references.

46. For some internal confirmation that the order perceived in music and dance is continuous with that which is exhibited by the heavenly bodies, see Laws 967E; see also Timaeus 47B6-E2 for the claim that the order exhibited in harmony is akin to that exhibited by the circular motion in our souls. For more on the heavenly bodies and their divine status see section 8 (Theology).

47. Kamtekar (2010: 147) raises as a worry for the completeness of this view that it does not explain Plato’s emphasis on participation in physical activity; if coming to grasp the order in music and dance were the only thing of ethical significance, she thinks, then seeing others perform would be just as good. She thus suggests that this account needs to be supplemented by an account of the way in which music and dance affect the non-rational parts of the soul.

48. Mueller (1980, p. 115). See also Knorr (1975, pp. 317-319).

49. See e.g. Republic 523A-525B, 529B-C for a discussion of the way in which the study of mathematics forces the student to go beyond the sensibles in the Republic.

50. Kamtekar (2010, p. 147) emphasizes this fact about the virtue of the citizens, and uses it to support her proposal that the choral education of the citizens has an important effect on the non-rational parts of the citizens’ souls in addition to the rational parts of their souls.

51. For a recent discussion of the educational function and correctness of poetry and the knowledge of the poets, see Hatzistavrou (2011).

52. As many have noted, god is in fact the first word of the dialogue.

53. For other texts which draw a connection between virtue and being like god, see Tht 176A-B and Rep 613A-B. See Annas (1999) and Sedley (2000) for discussion.

54. A few lines later, soul is said to be “among the first things to have come into being” (892C4). This raises questions that go unanswered in the subsequent discussion: what other things are among the first things? Is anything prior to soul? See Mayhew (2010, pp. 212-213) for discussion, including the suggestion (to which he does not commit himself) that reason alone (that is, unensouled reason or the Form of reason) may be prior to soul.

55. Laws 897A1-3 lists the characteristic motions of souls as: “wishing, investigating, supervising, deliberating, believing correctly and falsely, rejoicing and feeling pain, being bold and feeling fear, hating and loving” (Mayhew trans).

56. The notion of god as a craftsman in particular has connections to the Timaeus, but the idea of god’s reason as governing and as a cause of order in the world recurs throughout the late dialogues: see for instance Tim. 30A, 37D, 53A-B, 69B-C; Phil. 28D-E, 30C; Stsmn. 272E-273D.

57. See Mayhew (2010, pp. 209-210) for discussion, including a list of places in Book 10 in which the Athenian speaks of ‘the gods’ and ‘the god’.

58. For discussion, including the suggestion (to which he does not commit himself) that pure reason may be prior to soul, see Mayhew (2010).

59. E.g., in the Timaeus, by reference to Necessity and the Straying Cause (48A).

60. For discussion of these issues, including references both to Plato’s treatment of these issues elsewhere and to the secondary literature, see Mayhew (2010, pp. 210-211).

61. For discussion of these and other issues, see Mayhew (2010). He himself thinks that some important questions are simply left unsettled by the Laws, perhaps because Plato himself does not yet know the answers and thinks that it might undermine the virtue of the citizens if they were exposed to abstruse theological disputes, and that Plato is leaving these questions to his successors to investigate.

62. There is a vast literature on the relation between the Laws’ and the Timaeus’ cosmology in particular. See, to start, Mohr (1985, chs. 2, 7, 8, 9), Robinson (1995, pp. xviii-xix, xxiv-xxxii, 59-110, 145-57), and Vlastos (1994, vol. 2, chs. 15, 16). Important questions include whether god is the source of all motions or simply of order, and how to explain disorder and evil.

63. See Bobonich (2002, pp. 93-97) for discussion of this point.

64. See Irwin (1995, pp. 343-345) and Bobonich (2002, p. 522 fn 141) for discussion which advances this interpretation of the passage. For arguments that Plato is not a eudaimonist, see Waterlow [Broadie] (1972) and White (1999, 2002).

65. See fn. 1.

66. See Bobonich (2002, pp. 179-209) for discussion.

67. Note that in the Timaeus, the cosmos is itself a living thing; this should make the thought that it is capable of eudaimonia less strange.

68. This latter problem only becomes more difficult when we recall Plato’s emphasis on the motivational efficacy of pleasure in the Laws and his claim that the eudaimôn life is identical to the life of greatest pleasure (Laws 662C-E), because then we will have to show how the life in which I aim at the well-being of the whole is also the most pleasant for me.

69. See Bobonich (2002, pp. 470-471) for this worry.

70. For a spirited rejection of this claim, see Annas (1999).

71. For one attempt to do so, see Bobonich (2002).

72. There has been increased interest in the psychology of the Timaeus and, in particular, a debate over the status of the parts of the soul in the Timaeus and over whether desires and emotions in the Timaeus and other late dialogues have linguistic content: Bobonich (2002), (2010), Lorenz (2006) and (2012), Kamtekar (2010), Karfík (2005) and Lautner (2005).

73. A group of four -- Parmenides, Phaedrus, Republic, and Theaetetus -- are stylistically similar to each other and are closer to the late group of six than they are to the remaining dialogues. Most scholars taking other considerations into account go further than this with regards to dating. Even Kahn (1996, pp. 47-8) finds it reasonable to date the Phaedrus and the Theaetetus in that order between the Republic and the late group of six. The following scholars (in addition to Kahn) accept that the Phaedrus and the Theaetetus occur in that order between the Republic and the late group of six: Guthrie (1987, vol. 4, pp. 50-1), Kraut in Kraut (1992, pp. 46 n. 57, 47 n. 61), Ross (1953, p. 10) and Vlastos (1991, pp. 46-7). Brandwood (1976, p. xvii) and Ledger (1989, pp. 224-5) accept this order, except for placing the Theaetetus just before the Phaedrus. For further discussion of the Phaedrus’ date, see de Vries (1969, pp. 7-11), Nussbaum (1986, pp. 465 n. 7, 470-1 n. 5), and Rowe (1986b, pp. 13-4). I would like to thank Corinne Gartner for her help in turning my text into a webpage.

Copyright © 2013 by
Chris Bobonich
Katherine Meadows <khmeadows@gmail.com>

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