Plutarch of Chaeronea in Boeotia (ca. 45–120 CE) was a Platonist philosopher, best known to the general public as author of his “Parallel Lives” of paired Greek and Roman statesmen and military leaders. He was a voluminous writer, author also of a collection of “Moralia” or “Ethical Essays,” mostly in dialogue format, many of them devoted to philosophical topics, not at all limited to ethics.
His significance as a philosopher, on which this article concentrates, lies in his attempt to do justice to Plato's work as a whole, and to create a coherent and credible philosophical system out of it. Two moves are crucial in this regard. First, Plutarch respects both the skeptical/aporetic element in Plato (as marked by the tentativeness with which Socrates and the other main speakers in his dialogues regularly advance their views) and the views apparently endorsed by his main speakers, which were widely regarded at the time as Plato's own doctrines. Second, Plutarch focuses primarily on the Timaeus for his understanding of Plato's “doctrines,” and his interpretation of it shapes his understanding of Plato. Plutarch defends a literal interpretation of the Timaeus, according to which the world has come about in time from two main principles, the creator god and the “Indefinite Dyad.” While the Dyad accounts for disorder and multiplicity, such as that of disordered matter before the creation of the ordered physical world, as Timaeus describes it in the Timaeus, god accounts for order and the identity of objects and properties in the world. This metaphysical dualism is further strengthened by the assumption of two mediating entities through which the two principles operate; the Indefinite Dyad operates through a non-rational cosmic soul, while god through a rational one. This is the same soul, which becomes rational when god imparts reason from him to it. As a result of god's imparting reason, matter ceases to move in a disorderly manner, being brought into order through the imposition of Forms on it. The postulation of a non-rational pre-cosmic world soul, inspired by Laws X (but absent from the Timaeus), allows Plutarch to dissolve the apparent contradiction in different works of Plato that the soul is said to be both uncreated (eternal) and created. It also allows Plutarch to account for the existence of badness in the world, because residual irrationality abides in the world soul even when it becomes rational, which is accounted for by the fact that the world soul is originally non-rational in the sense that its movement is such, i.e. disorderly, and reason is an element external to it. This dualism pervades also the sensible or physical world, since the human soul, being derivative from the world soul, has a rational and a non-rational aspect too, as the Republic proposes. Plutarch distinguishes both in the world and in human beings three aspects, body, soul, and intellect. The soul's concern with the body gives rise to the non-rational aspect, which amounts to disorder, vice, or badness, while the co-operation between soul and intellect promotes rationality, that is, order, virtue, benevolence. In an attempt to accommodate the diverse strands of ethical thought in Plato (e.g. in the Protagoras, Republic, Phaedo, Theaetetus), Plutarch is the first to distinguish different levels of ethical life, namely the civic/practical and the theoretical/purified ones, depending on whether virtue pertains to the soul as organizing principle for one's daily life, or to the intellect as one's guide to knowledge of Forms.
- 1. Life and works
- 2. Plutarch's Platonism
- 3. Logic/Epistemology
- 4. Metaphysics
- 5. Psychology
- 6. Ethics and Politics
- 7. Poetics and Educational theory
- 8. Influence
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Plutarch was born in Chaeronea, a city of Boeotia in central Greece around 45–47 CE. This date is inferred from Plutarch's own testimony (On the E at Delphi 385B), according to which he began studying at Athens with a Platonist philosopher named Ammonius (see Dillon 1977, 189–192, Donini 1986b), when Nero was in Greece (66/67 CE). (This assumes that he was not more than twenty years old at the time.) We know little about Ammonius and his impact on Plutarch, the main evidence being Ammonius' speech as a character in On the E at Delphi (391E-394C), on god, being, generation and corruption (Dillon 1977, 189–192). This is indicative of Ammonius' engagement with metaphysics, which must have stimulated Plutarch's interest in metaphysical questions. Plutarch must have stayed in Athens not only during his studies with Ammonius but considerably longer, so as to become an Athenian citizen (Table Talks 628A). He also visited Rome (Demetrius 2) and Alexandria (Table Talks 678A; see Russell 1973, 7–8). However, Plutarch spent most of his life in his native city and in nearby Delphi. There must have been two reasons for this; Plutarch's strong ties with his family, which apparently was wealthy enough to support his studies and travels (Russell 1973, 3–5), and his own interest in the religious activity of Delphi. The latter is testified by the fact that Plutarch served in various positions in Delphi, including that of the priest of Apollo (Table Talks 700E), and also in his several works concerning Delphi and the local sacred rituals (On the E at Delphi, On Oracles at Delphi, On the Obsolescence of Oracles). These demonstrate intimate knowledge of the place, its traditions, and activities. Plutarch must have died after 119 CE, the date at which he was appointed procurator of Achaea by Hadrian (Eusebius' Chronicle).
Plutarch was a prolific writer. The so-called Lamprias catalogue, an ancient library catalogue (preserved mutilated), supposedly compiled by Plutarch's son Lamprias, lists 227 works, several of them no longer extant (Russell 1973, 18–19). Plutarch's works divide into philosophical and historical-biographical. The latter, the so-called Lives (Bioi) of distinguished Greek and Roman men examined in pairs, demonstrate Plutarch's historical and rhetorical abilities, also showing his interest in character formation and politics (Russell 1973, 100–116). Plutarch's philosophical works, many of them dialogues (set in Delphi or Chaeronea), cover half of his literary output. In modern times they have been published under the collective term Moralia, a term first given to a collection of eleven ethical works preserved in a 14th century manuscript (Parisinus Graecus 1672). When the collection was augmented by many other writings preserved in other manuscripts on topics ranging from metaphysics, psychology, natural philosophy, theology, logic, to philosophy of art, the name was retained with the misleading implication that Plutarch's philosophical works are essentially or primarily ethical.
Among Plutarch's works, several serve polemical purposes. He wrote a number of works against the Stoic and Epicurean philosophies. Against the Stoics are mainly the works On the Self-contradictions of the Stoics (De stoicorum repugnantiis), On the Common Notions against the Stoics (De communibus notitiis), On the Cleverness of Animals (De sollertia animalium), and On Moral Virtue (De virtute morali). Plutarch's main works against the Epicureans are: That One Cannot Live Happily Following Epicurus (Non posse suaviter vivere secundum Epicurum), Against Colotes (Adversus Colotem), Is ‘Live Unnoticed’ Well Said? (An recte dictum sit latenter esse vivendum). These works are marked by the use of a distinct polemical tone against assumed adversaries, and of recognizable polemical strategies. They are often captious and in many instances betray a less than fair engagement with the views being opposed.
It is worth considering why Plutarch engaged in writing so many polemical works against the two main Hellenistic schools of philosophy. One reason for Plutarch's preoccupation must be that the early Stoics and Epicureans both strongly criticized Plato. The Epicurean Colotes, for instance, Plutarch's target in the Against Colotes, was critical of Plato's dialogues in his Against Plato's Lysis and Against Plato's Euthydemus (fragments of which are preserved in Herculaneum papyri PHerc. 208, PHerc. 1032), while he also criticized the Republic's myth of Er and the implied view of an immortal soul (Proclus, In Rempublicam 2.109.11–12, 111.6–17). Despite their critical engagement with Plato, however, both schools drew freely and extensively for their own purposes on Plato without acknowledging it. This holds true especially for the Stoics (see Babut 1969a). They were inspired by the Timaeus, for instance, in their adoption of two principles, god and matter, but their god, unlike that of Plato, is immanent in the physical world and bodily, and he alone, without the Forms, suffices for the formation of matter. The Stoics were probably guided to their view that only bodies exist by passages in Sophist (246a-247c) and in Timaeus (31b-32c, 49d-e, 53b-c). For Plutarch, though, this is an utterly mistaken reading of the Timaeus (De communibus notitiis 1073D-1074E). Plutarch's polemics were motivated by his desire to advocate Platonism against what he regarded as misguided interpretations and criticisms. This was of vital importance for Platonism at Plutarch's time, since Stoicism and Epicureanism were still thriving mainly in virtue of their ethics. Plutarch wants to show that Stoic and Epicurean ethics rest on mistaken assumptions about human nature and reality, which render them useless (De virtute morali, De Stoicorum repugnantiis 1041E-1043A, De communibus notitiis 1060B-1073D). Plutarch's polemics are fuelled by the view he shares with Hellenistic philosophers that the end of philosophy is to support ethical life (see e.g. De profectibus in virtute). If a school's ethical ideal is unrealizable or unworthy of human nature, this is evidence that the entire philosophical system is a failure. As in the rest of his philosophical works, in his polemical treatises too, Plutarch aims to show that Plato's philosophy makes good sense as a whole, that is, it does justice to the world and human nature and can bring human beings to happiness (see below, sect. 2), and departure from Plato results into self-contradiction, of which he accuses the Stoics in particular (Boys-Stones 1997). Two further features of Stoic and Epicurean philosophy annoy Plutarch considerably: first, their dismissal of the aporetic/dialectical spirit that Socrates embodies, and which Plutarch regards as central to philosophy, and second, that Stoics and Epicureans alike adopt a corporealist metaphysics, rejecting the intelligible realm (which comprises god, Forms, immaterial souls), which was essential to Platonism. The central line permeating Plutarch's criticism is that Stoics and Epicureans contradict our common notions (see e.g. De communibus notitiis 1073C-1074F) and do not do justice to things themselves (De profectibus in virtute 75F-76A). Ironically, perhaps, Plutarch's polemical writings are chiefly of interest—but also of very great value—for the many quotations they contain from Stoics, Epicurus, and other authors whose works were not preserved into modern times, and for his references to and paraphrases of their views in other passages of works available to him but not to us. Were it not for Plutarch our grasp of Stoic and Epicurean philosophy would be much less extensive than it is, and our ability to reconstruct and appreciate their ideas much reduced.
Here is an overview of Plutarch's works, to give a sense of his conception of philosophy and of what in Platonist philosophy especially he valued.
Plutarch wrote relatively little in the field of “logic” in the ancient sense, which includes philosophy of language and epistemology. This, however, does not necessarily point to a lack of interest or knowledge on his part. Quite the opposite is the case. Plutarch is particularly attracted to epistemology because he considers this as a crucial aspect of Platonist philosophy. He seeks to defend Academic skepticism and the unity of the Academy against Antiochus of Ascalon's (1st c. BCE) rejection of them (see below, sects. 2 and 3). The Lamprias list of Plutarch's works contains one on Stoic logic (Reply to Chrysippus on the First Consequent, #152), and two on Aristotle's: On Aristotle's Topics in eight books (#56), and a Lecture on the Ten Categories (#192), both now lost. Such works are indicative of a reawakening of interest in Aristotelian logic, beginning in the 1st c. BCE, cultivated mainly by Peripatetics such as Boethus and Andronicus, but also characterizing Platonists of Plutarch's era, such as Eudorus and Nicomachus. Although the content of these Plutarchean works remains unknown, we have Plutarch's own claim that Aristotle's doctrine of categories is foreshadowed in the Timaeus (De an. procr. 1023E; Timaeus 37b-c), which suggests that he considered Aristotelian logic a welcome development of Platonic ideas (Karamanolis 2006, 123–125). Plutarch's interest in the Topics, on the other hand, must have been motivated by his interest in the dialectical methodology of arguing both sides of a question (Karamanolis 2006, 86–87; see below, sect.3), to which the Topics is devoted. Plutarch's works on epistemology cover a broad spectrum of issues. The question of the criterion of truth must have been central to works such as On How We Should Judge Truth (#225), What is Understanding? (#144), That Understanding is Impossible (#146), all no longer extant. The lost work Whether He Who Suspends Judgment on Everything is Led to Inaction (#158) must have confronted this common accusation against skepticism. Among Plutarch's surviving works important for understanding his epistemology are the Platonic Questions I and III, Against Colotes, On Common Notions, and On the Generation of the Soul 1024F-1025A (see below, sect. 3).
Plutarch paid special attention to “physics,”, which in antiquity included metaphysics, natural philosophy, psychology and theology. His most important surviving works in metaphysics are those related to the interpretation of the Timaeus, namely On the Generation of Soul in the Timaeus (De animae procreatione in Timaeo), On Isis and Osiris (De Iside et Osiride); from lost works: Where are the Forms? (#67), How Matter Participates in the Forms: It Constitutes the Primary Bodies (#68), On the World's Having Come into Beginning According to Plato (#66), On Matter (#185), On the Fifth Substance (#44). Plutarch shows quite some interest in the explanation of natural phenomena in several surviving works, most importantly in: Concerning the Face Which Appears in the Orb of the Moon (De facie quae in orbe lunae apparet), On the Principle of Cold (De primo frigido), On the Cleverness of Animals. Plutarch's interest is motivated by the wish to develop Platonist natural philosophy and oppose the Stoics, who were dominant in this field especially since Posidonius (1st c. BCE), and in Plutarch's age with his much older contemporary Seneca. Given the importance of god in the world's coming into being according to Plutarch, he is seriously engaged with theology, especially with questions pertaining to the relation between god and man, such as the issue of divination, divine punishment, and so on, in: On Oracles at Delphi (De Pythiae oraculis), On the Obsolescence of Oracles (De defectu oraculorum), On the E at Delphi (De E apud Delphos), On Delays in Divine Punishment (De sera numinis vindicta), and On the Daemon of Socrates (De genio Socratis Socratis). Plutarch's On the Generation of Soul in the Timaeus together with the ten Platonic Questions illustrate well his work as a Platonic exegete. Like the former work, most of the Platonic Questions also deal with metaphysics and psychology (I and III are concerned with epistemology, VII with physics, and X with language).
Among Plutarch's numerous surviving ethical and political treatises, the most important are: On Moral Virtue, On Making Progress in Virtue (De profectibus in virtute), On Delays in Divine Punishment, On Control of Anger (De cohibenda ira), and On Tranquility of Mind (De tranquillitate animi). Plutarch's ethical works include some theoretical ones (e.g. On Moral Virtue, which refutes the Stoic theory of virtue) and some practical ones (e.g. On Control of Anger), offering practical advice on how to attain virtue. There are also works on aesthetics and education, which one could classify also as works on practical ethics, since Plutarch, following Plato, evaluates poetry from the point of view of ethical education. In this category belong the works On How the Young Man Should Listen to Poets (De audiendis poetis) and On the Education of Children (De liberis educandis), the latter of dubious authenticity (Ziegler 1951, 809–811).
Finally, Plutarch wrote a number of works on aspects and figures of the history of philosophy, all lost, such as On What Heraclitus Maintained (#205), On Empedocles (#43), On the Cyrenaics (#188), On the Difference between Pyrrhonians and Academics (#64), On the Unity of the Academy Since Plato (#63). The latter two are not merely historical, however; the historical perspective serves to defend the point of view of the skeptical Academy, which Plutarch defended as doing justice to the aporetic spirit of Plato's philosophy (see below, sect. 2).
Plutarch lived in the wake of the revival of the dogmatic tradition of Platonism begun by Antiochus and Eudorus in the 1st c. BCE, which in a way he continues. Plutarch, however, shows a more complex philosophical profile, apparently through developing the version of Academic skepticism defended by Antiochus' contemporary Philo of Larissa (and Cicero). He strives for a synthesis of the skeptical interpretation of Plato, defended by the Academic skeptics Arcesilaus and Carneades, with that of Antiochus, according to which Plato held doctrines of his own. Plutarch objects to the distinction between Socratic and Platonic philosophy and the corresponding division of Plato's dialogues into Socratic/aporetic and Platonic/doctrinal that Antiochus suggested (Cicero, Academica I.15–17). For Plutarch, rather, Plato accommodates both an aporetic and a doctrinal element in his philosophy with hardly any tension between them. The aporetic element in Plato encourages a way of searching for the truth without prejudices or a priori commitments, and this practically amounts to a dialectical inquiry, arguing either side of a given question. But this dialectical spirit does not deny the possibility of reaching firm conclusions, or even the possibility of achieving secure knowledge. According to Plutarch, Plato had reached such conclusions in his dialogues, which can be identified as Plato's doctrines. Yet he still preserved the spirit of inquiry, embedded in the dialogue form itself, by not holding them in a way which closed off reconsideration and further inquiry. This is why Plutarch advocates an epistemology that integrates both the suspension of judgment (i.e., the rejection of dogmatism) and a defense of the possibility of acquiring true knowledge (see below, sect. 3). On this basis Plutarch defends the unity of the Academy, going all the way back to Plato, which Antiochus had considered as having been disrupted with the advent of Academic Skepticism (in lost treatises, such as On the Unity of the Academy since Plato, On the Difference Between Pyrrhoneans and Academics; see Adversus Colotem 1121F-1122E, Platonic Question I; with Opsomer 1998, 127–133). Plutarch tried to disengage the term ‘Academic’ from implying exclusive commitment to the skeptical construal of Plato. Suspension of judgment, he thinks, is rather a method of research followed by several illustrious ancient philosophers (Heraclitus, Parmenides, Socrates, Plato), rather than an innovation of Arcesilaus (Adv. Col. 1121F-1122A). For Plutarch, the Academic both appreciates Plato's aporetic spirit and still values his doctrines. Similar in this respect appears to be the position of the anonymous author of the (1st c. CE?) Commentary on the Theaetetus and of Plutarch's friend Favorinus, the addressee of the On the Principle of Cold (cf. ibid. 955C, see Opsomer 1997, Opsomer 1998, 26–82, 213–240).
In accordance with this conception of Platonism, Plutarch himself writes dialogues in which the speakers give long speeches in favor of a certain view (Russell 1973, 34–36). Following Plato, Plutarch often uses myths, metaphors, and analogies. The work On Isis and Osiris is interesting in this regard. In it Plutarch relates the myth of the two Egyptian deities, yet he interprets it allegorically as a story informative about god, being, and creation (Ziegler 1951, 206–208). Of particular interest are the eschatological myths in Plutarch, as they integrate cosmological, psychological, and ethical considerations. This is the case with the myth narrated in The Face Which Appears in the Orb of the Moon, which centers on the role of the moon in the world and its role in the life of souls (see Cherniss, Plutarch Moralia, vol. XII, Loeb, Introduction). Analogous is the case of the work On the Delays of the Divine Vengeance, where Plutarch sets out to defend divine providence, yet, following Plato's claim of presenting only a likely account (eikôs mythos) in the Timaeus, he claims to be offering only what seems likely to him about divine actions (549E-F), and also like Plato, he structures his work into argument (logos) and a narrative (mythos). These authorial practices present a problem for the scholar who wants to identify the author's own philosophical views, just as they do with Plato's own dialogues. The works that unambiguously present Plutarch's opinions on exegetical and philosophical matters are On the Generation of Soul in the Timaeus, and Platonic Questions, while the others must be used with caution, for the reasons given, or because of their polemical aim and tone (see Opsomer 2007).
Plutarch represents a synthesis also with regard to his philosophical interests. On the one hand he shares Antiochus' emphasis on ethics, yet on the other he focuses also on metaphysics, which was revived by Eudorus (end of 1st c. BCE) and flourished with Pythagorean Platonists such as Moderatus (1st c. CE). Like them, Plutarch pays special attention to the Timaeus, which from then on became the keystone of Platonism. Plutarch is particularly interested in the generation of the soul, and he devotes an entire treatise to discussing one short passage, Timaeus 35a1–36b5 (On the Generation of Soul in the Timaeus; see Hershbell 1987). It is not an exaggeration to say that Plutarch's interpretation of the Timaeus shapes his entire philosophy. This is because Plutarch apparently endorses the idea suggested in the Timaeus that the universe is a unified whole with humans being an integral part of this unity, which means that both the physical world and natural phenomena as well as human beings and human society should be approached from a cosmic/metaphysical point of view. In the case of natural phenomena, for instance, this means that explanations should make reference to intelligible causes (De primo frigido 948B-C), while in the case of human beings, their nature and final end cannot be determined unless one understands that their constitution is similar to that of the world, consisting of body, soul, and intellect (De facie 943A, 945A, De virtute morali 441D). Plutarch systematically employs the analogy between worldly macrocosm and human microcosm, suggested in the Timaeus, which is important also in Stoicism.
It is also noteworthy that Plutarch is familiar with neo-Pythagorean and Aristotelian philosophies. Interest in both Pythagorean ideas and Aristotelianism were in vogue at the end of the 1st century BCE and during the 1st century CE. Moderatus attempted to systematize Pythagorean ideas as background to Plato (he wrote a work Pythagorean Doctrines in many books; Stephanus Byzantius, s.v. Gadeira, Porphyry, Life of Pythagoras 48; Dillon 1977, 344–351). Aristotelian philosophy, on the other hand, was revived by Peripatetics and Platonists alike during this period. Andronicus of Rhodes was responsible for a complete edition of Aristotle's works at the end of the 1st century BCE, while at the same time Xenarchus of Seleukeia was critically engaged with Aristotle's physics. Besides them, Cicero and Antiochus were acquainted with Aristotle's works, the latter arguing that Aristotle was in essential agreement with Plato, at least in ethical theory (Cicero, Academica I.17, De finibus V.12). Antiochus' students Aristo (of Alexandria) and Cratippus regarded themselves as Peripatetics, while Eudorus, a Platonist, did not hesitate to use Aristotle in order to identify Pythagorean metaphysical principles in Plato (Alexander, In Met. 58.25–59.8 with reference to Aristotle Metaphysics 988a8–17). Plutarch was acquainted with several Aristotelian treatises from all periods of his writing career (cf. Adv. Col. 1115B-C), and preserves numerous fragments from lost Aristotelian works (see Ross, Aristotelis Fragmenta Selecta, Karamanolis 2006, 89–92). Plutarch's attitude to Pythagoreanism and Aristotle is complex and sophisticated. Plutarch's cosmic principles, the One and the Indefinite Dyad (De defectu oraculorum 428F-429A), allegedly found in the Timaeus, had long been considered Pythagorean in origin. Plutarch also integrates into Platonism other Pythagorean elements, such as number symbolism (De E 387F, De def. or. 429D-430B), abstinence from meat (On the Eating of Flesh; De esu carnium), and a belief in the rationality of animals (On the Cleverness of Animals, Beasts are Rational; Bruta Animalia Ratione Uti), probably because he considers them implied in, or compatible with, statements made in Plato (e.g. in the Phaedo, Timaeus). With regard to Aristotle, Plutarch is more cautious than Antiochus; he considers some of Aristotle's doctrines to be an articulation or development of Platonic philosophy (e.g. Aristotle's ethics and logic), and espouses them as being Platonic (e.g. De virtute morali 442B-C, De an. procr. 1023E). However, he also criticizes Aristotle for contradicting Plato's presumed doctrines (e.g. on the Forms and on the constitution of the world; Adv. Col. 1114F-1115C).
Hence it is wrong to portray Plutarch as an eclectic philosopher (e.g. Ziegler 1951, 940, F. Babbitt, Plutarch's Moralia, Introduction, vol. I, Loeb 1927, xiv, Becchi 1981). Plutarch uses philosophers such as Aristotle only instrumentally in order to advance through them Plato's doctrines (see Karamanolis 2006, 92–109). Plutarch shares with Antiochus (Cicero, Academica I.17–19, 33–34) the view that Plato's philosophy is subject to articulation and development through his successors in the Platonist tradition, but also to misinterpretation and distortion. Xenocrates, Polemo and Aristotle developed and articulated Platonic philosophy, though not without faults, while the Stoics and Epicureans were guilty of distortion. Plutarch is not a populariser either (Babbitt op. cit). His work shows great complexity and sophistication and evinces the spirit of a meticulous interpreter, who ventures to advance innovative views, such as on the creation of the soul, on human constitution, on ethics and poetics (see below, sects. 6 and 7). It is also unfair to say of Plutarch that he was “no original thinker” (Ziegler 1951, 938–939). Plutarch lived in an age in which philosophy had taken the form of exegesis of classical philosophical texts, but through this process philosophers in late antiquity crystallize and voice their views on all crucial philosophical questions. Plutarch takes some very interesting lines on metaphysics, psychology, and ethics (see below, sect. 4, 5, 6), which became influential in later generations of Platonists.
Plutarch appears to be particularly sensitive to the question of how we acquire knowledge. Plutarch sets out to defend the interpretation of Plato's epistemology maintained in the skeptical Academy. According to this, suspension of judgment (epochê) is the best way to avoid unwarranted commitment to opinions (doxai), since they can be deceitful. Plutarch defends this position against the Stoic accusation that such an attitude leads to inaction, making life impossible, and also against the Epicurean claim that sense-experiences are always true. Plutarch distinguishes between three different movements in the soul, those of sensation (phantastikon), impulse (hormê), and assent (synkatathetikon; Adv. Col. 1122B). The first two, Plutarch argues, suffice to produce action (Adv. Col. 1122C-D). Since suspension of judgment does not interfere with either perception/sensation or impulse, it does not affect our actions but only eliminates opinions (ibid. 1122B). Consequently it saves us from making mistakes (1124B), but does not prevent us from acting. Opsomer (1998, 88) has noted that Plutarch's argument is very similar to that of the Pyrrhonian skeptics. Suspension of judgment is recommended as a method of testing and evaluating knowledge obtained through the senses (Adv. Col. 1124B). This is not only because the senses often deceive us (De primo frigido 952A); the problem rather is that the world is a place that cannot be known perfectly, except by transcending it, and moving to the intelligible one (De Iside 382D-383A). This does not amount to dismissal of the testimony of the senses, which is how Colotes criticized Plato (Adv. Col. 1114D-F). The senses are of limited application, because they inform us only about the sensible world, which is a world of appearances, not of being (De E 392E). Perfect knowledge, however, can only be of being, and humans must be aware of their limitations in achieving that.
Plutarch makes a sharp distinction between sensible and intelligible knowledge, which corresponds to the fundamental ontological distinction between sensible or physical and intelligible reality (Plat. Quest. 1002B-C). He appears to distinguish two distinct faculties of human knowledge, the sensory and the intellectual, each of which grasps the corresponding part of reality (Plat. Quest. 1002D-E). The faculty for intelligibles, the human intellect, is external to the embodied soul (De an. procr. 1026E, Plat. Quest. 1001C, 1002F; cf. Numenius fr. 42 Des Places); the sensory faculty, on the other hand, comes about when the soul enters the body (De virtute morali 442B-F; see below, sect. 5). Human beings come to understand through the intellect by making use of the notions or concepts (ennoiai), apparently identifiable with the Forms (Plat. Quest. 1001E), with which the intellect is inherently equipped. That is, the embodied soul recollects what it knows from its inherent familiarity with the intelligible realm, as Plato argued in the discussion of anamnêsis or recollection in the Meno (Plat. Quest. 1001D, 1002E; Opsomer 1998, 193–198). This knowledge of intelligibles is superior to sensory “knowledge,” which can only remain at the level of belief (pistis) and conjecture (eikasia; Plat. Quest. 1001C). Indeed, it can take one as far as to understand the divine realm (ibid. 1002E, 1004D). But we can achieve this final knowledge only when “souls are free to migrate to the realm of the indivisible and the unseen” (De Iside 382F). This is the task of philosophy for Plutarch. Philosophy must be inspired by the Socratic practice of inquiry. This practice amounts to the continuous search for truth, which presupposes that, following the example of Socrates, one admits ignorance (Adv. Col. 1117D, De adulatore et amico 72A).
Knowledge of intelligibles through anamnêsis is not in tension with the Academic prescription for suspension of judgment. It can be advanced by it, since suspension of judgment puts aside opinion (doxa) as well as egoism (philautia), both of which prevent us from finding the truth (Plat. Quest. 1000C). To be in a position to carry out this search for truth, however, one must search oneself and purify one's soul (Adv. Col. 1118C-E). Socrates promoted precisely this, using the elenchus as a purgative medicine, trying to remove false claims to knowledge and arrogance from the souls of his interlocutors, and to seek truth along with them, instead of defending his own view (Plat. Quest. 999E-F, 1000B, 1000D; Opsomer 1988, 145-150, Shiffman 2010). Socrates was in a position to do that because he had purified his soul from passions (De genio Socratis 588E), hence he was capable of understanding the voice of his daimôn, his intellect (see below, sect. 5).
Plutarch does not defend the Socratic-Academic epistemology only at the theoretical level, but also applies it practically. While discussing in On the Principle of Cold whether cold is a principle rather than a privation and whether the earth is the primary cold element, he defends suspension of judgment as the right attitude to take (955C; see Babut 2007, 72–76 contra Boys-Stones 1997). This is indicative of Plutarch's attitude to natural phenomena quite generally. He maintains that natural phenomena cannot be understood merely by means of investigating their natural causes. The discovery of the immediate, natural causes, Plutarch argues, is only the beginning of an investigation into the first and highest causes, which are intelligible (De primo frigido 948B-C; Donini 1986, 210-211, Opsomer 1998, 215–6). In other words, a metaphysical explanation in terms of the Forms and god, the creator of the universe, must be sought (De def. or. 435E-436A). This is what, for Plutarch, demarcates the philosopher from the mere natural scientist (physikos; De primo frigido 948B-C), a distinction much exploited by later Platonists (e.g. Atticus fr. 5 Des Places, Porphyry in Simplicius, In Physica 9.10–13; fr. 119 Smith). Plutarch is guided here by the dichotomy between natural and intelligible causes found in Phaedo 97B-99D and Timaeus 68E-69D (Opsomer 1998, 183). Explaining the physical world through an appeal to natural causes is insufficient, since it ignores the agent (god) and the end for which something happens (De def. or. 435E). The fundamental ontological and epistemological distinction between the sensible and intelligible realms suggests an analogous distinction of corresponding levels of explanation (Donini 1986, 212, Opsomer 1998, 217). Plutarch maintains that there are two levels of causality, physical and intelligible, and full understanding of natural phenomena requires the grasping of both. While in the case of natural phenomena suspension of judgment maintains unfailing the spirit of research, in the case of the divine realm, where human understanding is seriously limited, suspension of judgment is due also as a form of piety towards the divine (De sera 549E; Opsomer 1998, 178–179).
Plutarch's metaphysics rests on his interpretation of the Timaeus. Plutarch maintains that the cosmogony of the Timaeus must be interpreted literally, which means that the world had a temporal beginning (Plat. Quest.1001B-C, De an. procr. 1013C-1024C; cf. Timaeus 30a, 52d-53b). Plutarch argues against the interpretation of most Platonists of his time, who refuse to understand creation in terms of an actual generation (De an. procr. 1013E). He thinks that his interpretation is the only way to understand Plato's claim that the soul is “senior” to the body, and that it initiates all change and motion (De an. procr. 1013D-F; Laws 896a-c). This literal interpretation of the Timaeus also aims to solve the puzzle of how the soul in Plato is said to be both uncreated (Phaedrus 245c-246a) as well as created (Timaeus 34b-35a; De an. procr. 1016A), and how the soul is said to be a mixed entity composed of indivisible being (i.e. intellect) and divisible being (i.e. the non-rational pre-cosmic soul; Timaeus 35a; De an. procr. 1014D-E, 1024A). Plutarch tries to address these issues in a number of works (see above, sect. 1), most importantly, of the surviving ones, in On the Generation of Soul in the Timaeus, a commentary on Timaeus 35a1–36b5.
Plutarch proposes the following interpretation. The cosmos is an ordered entity that has come into existence at a certain point (when time did not exist; Plat. Quest. 1007C), as a result of the contact between god and pre-existing, disorderly matter. God puts this matter in order (De an. procr. 1024C; cf. De Iside 374E-F). This means that god cannot be the only cosmic principle, otherwise disorderly matter would be left unaccounted for. Plutarch postulates two antithetic and antagonistic cosmic principles: the one is God (the Monad or the One, the unitary eternal substance from which everything devolves; see below sect. 4.3), and the other is the Indefinite Dyad, both being eternal and uncreated (De def. or. 428E-F). God is the real being, unchangeable, simple (De E 392E-393B), and good (De def. or. 423D)—the cause of order, intelligibility, stability, and identity. This is why he is the object of striving for all nature (De facie 944E). The Indefinite Dyad, on the other hand, is the principle of non-being, multiplicity, disorder, chaos, irrationality, and badness (De def. or. 428F). This principle is described as being identical with matter which is ordered by God (De def. or. 428F-429D) or its logos (De Iside 373A-C), yet the existence in it of an active element which is essentially disorderly and evil (De Iside 369E; Dillon 1977, 206–8) seems to suggest that it is regarded not merely as identical with matter, taken as the underlying element of all qualities, as is suggested in Timaeus 50e (De def. or. 414F).). These two principles were allegedly accepted by the ancient Pythagoreans (Diogenes Laertius 8.24–25; Diels-Kranz 58 Βl), and by the neo-Pythagoreans of Plutarch's time (Sextus Empiricus, Against the Mathematicians 10.261–284, Nicomachus, Introductio Arithmetica II.18.4; see Dillon 1977, 342–3, 354), but they were also attributed to Plato (Plato, Parmenides 149d2, Simplicius, In Physica 453.25–7), presumably by neo-Pythagorean Platonists (Eudorus in Simplicius, In Physica 181.7–30, Moderatus, ibid. 231.8–9; see Kahn 2001, 105–110 and Numenius in SEP). Plutarch identifies the two principles with the Limited and the Unlimited of the Philebus (he also calls the Indefinite Dyad limitlessness, apeiria; De def. or. 428F). The two principles are constantly opposing each other (De def. or. 429B-D, De Iside 369E; Dillon 1977, 203). Although God, the One, prevails over the Dyad (De def. or. 429C-D), order and goodness are always in danger of being displaced by disorder and badness. Both the Indefinite Dyad and God relate to the universe through intermediaries, a non-rational and a rational world soul, which operate as antithetic powers of the two antagonistic cosmic principles. The result of the interaction of the two cosmic principles through these powers is the cosmos.
This interaction happens in stages. Before the world has come into being, the universe was animated by the non-rational world soul, which accounts for the disordered motion of matter. In Plutarch's words, “what preceded the generation of the world was disorder, disorder not incorporeal or immobile or inanimate, but of corporeality amorphous and incoherent, and of motivity demented and irrational, and this was the discord of soul that has not reason” (De an. procr. 1014B; Cherniss' trans., altered). There is, however, no explicit mention of a non-rational pre-cosmic soul in the Timaeus, which is why Plutarch has been accused of arbitrariness in this regard (Cherniss, Plutarch Moralia, Loeb vol. XIII.1, 140–147). It is wrong, though, to treat Plutarch as one might treat a modern commentator of the Timaeus, with conscientious scholarly attention to what is and is not made explicit in a text. Plutarch assumes there is a single “Platonic view” about the generation of the world, the first principles of reality, and the role of soul in the world's generation, and he seeks support for his interpretation in many Platonic dialogues. He identifies the non-rational soul with the “disorderly and maleficent soul” of Laws X (a testimony Plutarch himself considers unambiguous, De Iside 370F), with the “limitlessness” of the Philebus (26b), the “congenital desire” and “inbred character” of the Politicus (272d, 273b), and with the necessity (anankê) and the generation (genesis) of Timaeus 52d (De an. procr. 1014D-1015A). None of these passages lend clear support to Plutarch's interpretation, since nowhere does Plato explicitly speak of a pre-cosmic maleficent soul or other pre-cosmic soul-like entities: even the maleficent soul of the Laws is not pre-cosmic (Cherniss, ibid. 140). Yet Plutarch's interpretation does have merits in imposing consistency on Plato's work as a whole. First, according to the Timaeus (35a) the demiurge (the creator god) does not create the substance of the soul, but compounds the world soul by blending indivisible with divisible being, which Plutarch not unreasonably identifies with the divine intellect and the non-rational world soul respectively (De an. procr. 1014D-E). This does justice to the nature of the soul, which for Platonists is not subject to change and corruption. Secondly, no motion is possible without a principle of motion (cf. Aristotle, De anima 402a6–7), and this traditionally is the soul in Platonism (cf. Phaedrus 245c-e); so the disordered motion of matter that Plato postulates needs to be accounted for by a soul (see Laws 892a), which must, then, be a pre-cosmic one (De an. procr. 1015E).
Further, the existence of a pre-cosmic non-rational soul is suggested also if one considers the world soul and the human soul in conjunction. Already the Timaeus (34c, 41d-e, 69c) suggests a relation between the two. Plutarch takes the human soul to be derivative from the world soul, which means that their natures are similar (De an. procr. 1025A-D; see below, sect. 5). In Republic 4 and in the Phaedrus it is argued that the human soul has a rational and a non-rational aspect, fighting for dominance. Order and harmony is established when the rational aspect rules over the non-rational, but the non-rational aspect is always capable of revolting against rationality and creating disorder. Plutarch identifies the rational aspect with intellect, which he distinguishes from the soul, making the former the cause of order and the latter the cause of disorder (De an. procr. 1015E; see below, sect. 5). If the human soul reflects the nature of the world soul, then also in the latter even when rationality prevails, when the cosmos comes into being, there is room for disharmony and disorder. This is evidenced by occurrences of badness in the world, such as accidents, natural catastrophes, etc. If there is no non-rational aspect in the world soul, then either God must be ultimately accountable for such phenomena, which is what the Stoics maintain – and this, argues Plutarch, hardly fits God's goodness (De an. procr. 1015A-B) – or they must happen without cause, as the Epicureans maintain, which then diminishes God's ruling power (ibid. 1015C). Better to think they are caused by a non-rational aspect of the world soul. Finally, a pre-cosmic soul is needed to play the role of mediator between God and matter (De an. procr. 1015B, 1024C; cf. Timaeus 35a), which is required in order to maintain God's transcendence, goodness, and purity, since matter, because of its inherent disorderliness and badness, pollutes and taints (cf. Numenius fr. 52.37–39 Des Places; see also below, sect. 4.3).
The first stage in creation is that God imparts his own intelligence and reason to the pre-cosmic non-rational soul, making it into a partly rational thing (De an. procr. 1014C-D, 1016E-D, Plat. Quest. 1001B-C). Plutarch makes clear that the rational world soul is “not merely a work but also a part of God and has come to be not by his agency, but both from him as a source and out of his substance” (Plat. Quest. 1001C). Since the world soul, thus constructed, contains divine reason, which is a “portion” (moira) or “efflux” (aporrhoê) of God (De Iside 382B), it is not merely a product of God but rather an inseparable part of him (De sera 559D, Plat. Quest. 1001C). That is, the world soul becomes assimilated to God (homoiôsis; De sera 550D). This does not entirely eradicate the world soul's initial non-rationality (De an. procr. 1027A), yet the motions produced by the world soul become now (for the most part) harmonious and orderly (De an. procr. 1014C-E). This means that matter ceases to be disordered and indefinite. Matter now becomes stable and “similar to the entities that are invariably identical” (ibid. 1015F). Presumably Plutarch is referring here to the transcendent Forms. He states that the cosmos comes into being when the soul disperses the semblances from the intelligible world to this one (ibid. 1024C; cf. Timaeus 50c-e, 52d-53c). Plutarch appears to maintain that the world soul is capable of being molded by receiving the intelligible Forms, which is how presumably the world soul becomes rational (De an. procr. 1024C). The world soul then transmits the Forms onto matter (De Iside 373A, De Pyth. orac. 404C). This transmission seems to take a two-stage process, allegedly implied in the Timaeus. First, the Forms inform matter to bring about primary bodies, such as water and fire, as Timaeus 53b-d, 69b-c suggests (De an. procr. 1025A-B, Plat. Quest. 1001D-E); second, the imposition of further Forms on matter brings about compound material stuffs and different kinds of objects, which make up the cosmos (De Iside 372E-F, 373E-F).
The precise role of Forms in Plutarch's interpretation of the creation remains obscure. Plutarch discussed this issue in treatises no longer extant, such as Where are the Forms?, yet the surviving evidence is not conclusive. Some insight can be gained from the myth of Isis and Osiris, which Plutarch presents as an analogy to the world creation in his De Iside et Osiride. Osiris is a divine intellect that brings everything into being by being sown in matter, that is, in Isis, the reasons (logoi) of himself (De Iside 372E-F), eventually producing Horus, i.e. the cosmos (ibid. 374A). Osiris is identified with the good itself (372E), to which Isis always inclines, offering herself to be impregnated “with effluxes and likenesses in which she rejoices” (ibid. 373A). Apparently Osiris stands for the demiurge of the Timaeus and also the Form of the Good of the Republic (cf. De an. procr. A-B) —which explains why Osiris constitutes the object of desire by nature and Isis (De Iside 372E-F; cf. De facie 944E). This suggests that Plutarch maintained the existence of the Forms in God (cf. Timaeus 39e), as did several other Platonists in late antiquity (e.g. Alcinous, Didascalicos 163.11–17, with Dillon 1993 93–96). Osiris is both the intellect and the logos present in the world soul (De Iside 371A, 376C). This is supported by Plutarch's statement that God is the totality of Forms (paradeigma; De sera 550D; see Helmig 2005, 20–26). Yet God, as Osiris, can be analyzed into three elements, intellect, soul, and body (De Iside 373A). That Plutarch makes such a distinction is supported by his claim that “God is not senseless nor inanimate nor subject to human control” (De Iside 377E-F) and also by his reference to the body of Osiris, which symbolizes the Forms immanent in matter (ibid.; Dillon 1977, 200). Presumably Plutarch assumes the existence of a divine soul, guided by statements in Plato Philebus 30c, Sophist 248d-249a, Timaeus 46d-e, according to which the intellect, to the extent that it implies life, requires the presence of the principle of life, namely soul (Plat. Quest. 1002F).
There is a question then as to where in the divine creator the transcendent Forms reside. We have reason to believe that Plutarch places the Forms not in the intellect of the divine creator, as was assumed by several later Platonists (e.g. Alcinous, Porphyry), but rather in the soul (Schoppe 1994, 172–178, Baltes 2001; against Opsomer 2001, 195–197). Syrianus testifies this explicitly (In Metaphysica 105.36–38), while we find the same doctrine also in Atticus (frs. 8, 11, 35 Des Places; Karamanolis 2006, 169–170), who was said in antiquity to follow Plutarch in the interpretation of the cosmogony of the Timaeus (Iamblichus, De anima, in Stobaeus I.49.37, Proclus, In Timaeum I.276.30–277.7, 325.30–326.6; Atticus frs. 10, 19, 22 Des Places). The reason for endorsing such a view is that it allows one to maintain the utter simplicity and order of the demiurgic intellect, so as to preserve God as the source of intelligibility, and yet to distance God from the creation, without however either creating gaps between god and creation or destroying the unity of God. This was the path already taken by Moderatus (Dillon 1977, 348) and later Platonists, such as Numenius and Plotinus, who postulated distinct divine hypostases. If Plutarch endorsed the view that the Forms exist in the divine soul, this may explain why he sometimes speaks of God and the Forms as a unity (e.g. De sera 550D), and at other times as if they are separate (De an. procr. 1024C-D, Plat. Quest. 1001E; Helmig 2005, 24–5). The reason may be that sometimes Plutarch speaks of the divine creator in the strict sense, as an intellect, and some other times in the wider sense, as an animated intellect (one in a soul). When Plutarch refers to being, the receptacle, and genesis in Timaeus 52d2–4, identifying the latter with the non-rational soul, the receptacle with matter, and being with the intelligible realm, while he also mentions an intellect “abiding and immobile all by itself,” this is not evidence that Plutarch adds arbitrarily a fourth entity, the divine intellect, as Cherniss (Plutarch Moralia, Loeb XIII.1, 143) argued. Apparently Plutarch understands “being” in Timaeus 52d2 as equivalent to “animal” in Timaeus 39e8, namely as that which comprises both the divine intellect (in a soul) and the intelligible Forms.
The antagonism between God and the Indefinite Dyad, between intellect and soul, and between the rational and the non-rational aspect of the world soul is an entrenched feature of the world, according to Plutarch. He expresses it also in religious-symbolic terms: he equates the pair of good and evil principles with the Persian pair of gods Oromazes and Areimanius (De Iside 369E). Plutarch's pervasive dualism gives rise to problems, however. The constant presence and operation of the disorderly, non-rational aspect of the soul in the universe (De an. procr. 1027A), implies God's inability totally to dominate. Plutarch appears to maintain that God's power is limited by the necessity (anankê) imposed by matter. Yet, on the other hand, he does distinguish between the rule of nature, or fate, on the one hand, and divine providence on the other, arguing, against the Stoics, that God can dominate nature (De facie 927A-B) and can provide providentially for us (De comm. not. 1075E). The fact that God, by means of his logos, with which he is often identified (De Iside 373A-B), moulds the principle of disorder, the indefinite Dyad, suggests the supremacy of God over any other force. This is actually one of the reasons why Plutarch defends temporal creation; if the world were eternal and God responsible for it, then God would be the cause of both good and bad, while on Plutarch's interpretation the bad is accounted for by the evil world soul (see Dillon 2002, 234; see also below, sect. 4.3).
The problem however remains. It becomes more serious if we move from the cosmic macrocosm to the human microcosm. If disorder, non-rationality, and badness are cosmic forces, producing what is bad in the world, the question is how they relate to the bad or the vice caused by human beings. Plutarch distinguishes three causes, fate, chance, and ourselves as causes of what is up to us, all of which play a role in what happens to us (Quaest. Conv.740C-D). The first two kinds of causes need some explanation in view of Plutarch's metaphysical principles. Presumably, fate amounts to God, chance to the non-rational part of the world soul, since the latter can bring about events not planned by God which are disorderly and evil. Plutarch's distinction amounts to three classes of events. Some events are fated (or planned by God), some happen by chance (or through the operation of the non-rational aspect of the world soul), while there is a third class of events for which we, humans, are the only causes (De tranq. an. 476E). We can, Plutarch says, decide what to do, how to live our lives, but not how life will turn out in terms of desired or intended outcomes of our actions (ibid. 467A-B; Eliasson 2008, 130–141). He criticizes the Stoics for violating this distinction, arguing that the Stoic notion of “that which is up to us” coincides with the Stoic notion of fate (De Stoic. repugn. 1056E-D). Plutarch may appear to defend human freedom, but the problem remains, since it is still unclear how the human's participation in the intelligible realm through soul and intellect, sharing the characteristics of the (originally non-rational) world soul and the (naturally rational) divine intellect, shapes one's character and life.
The issue of human freedom becomes more complex in view of Plutarch's conception of god and his theory of divine providence. This is an important aspect of Plutarch's philosophy. Plutarch distinguishes sharply between God or the divine (theos, to theion) and gods. The latter are various divine beings which appear in different religions and with many names, while God or the divine indicates the divine substance, which is a unity including all divine beings in it (De Iside 377F). God rules over the world and provides over it, but being supreme (anôtatô; Plat. Quest. 1000E), father of gods and men alike, he remains transcendent. This becomes clear in Ammonius' speech in On the E in Delphi, where God is said to be “beyond everything” (epekeina tou pantos; 393B), but also in the On the Obsolescence of Oracles, where Lambrias defends the possibility of God being provident over many worlds, provided that these are of a finite number (426E). This means that God is not immanent in the world, and yet he is its creator. God's transcendence is maintained by delegating to the world soul some mediatory demiurgic performance (see above, sect. 4.1; cf. Opsomer 2005, 94–5). This resonates with Plutarch's more general view (inspired by Plato), according to which the soul has a mediating role between the intellect and the body or sensible reality (see below, sect. 5).
Apart from the world soul, the creator God also needs some further mediation with the sensible world, if his transcendence is to be maintained—this is already suggested in the distinction between the demiurge and the lesser gods in the Timaeus (42e). Plutarch acknowledges the existence of divine entities which are inferior to the first God or the One, the “daimones.” They are said to be “by nature on the boundary between gods and humans” (De def. or. 416C). Placed in the moon, these lesser gods mediate between the first God and human beings, thus extending God's providence to them (Dillon 1977, 216–8). Their mediation consists, for instance, in communicating God's will to humans, bestowing them with prophetic powers and inspiration (Amatorius 758E, De genio Socratis 580C, De facie 944C-D), in taking care of humans when they are needy (Amatorius 758A-B) but also in punishing humans (De def. or. 417A-B) . Plutarch explores a tradition going back to Empedocles, to Plato (Symposium 202e, Phaedo 107D, 113D), and to Xenocrates. However, Plutarch speaks of gods in the plural as well as of “daimones” (De def. or. 416C), and there is a question as to how the plurality of gods is to be understood vis-à-vis the first God. This is far from clear (Ziegler 1951, 940). In the On the E at Delphi Apollo is presented as the supreme God, identified with the Good and Being (393D-394A), while elsewhere it is Zeus who is described as the supreme God, creator of the universe (De facie 927B). Plutarch appears to maintain that the first God can take different names, yet he is to be distinguished from the deities of the Greek pantheon (such as Asclepius in Amatorius 758A-B), who are to be identified with the lesser gods.
A crucial issue that philosophers face during Plutarch's age is that of evil and wickedness and theodicy. Even if God is not responsible for occurrences of evil (see above, sect. 4.2), there is a question of why these are not always punished promptly by God. In his work On the Delays of the Divine Vengeance Plutarch address the question of whether the delays of divine punishment speak against the existence of divine providence (550C). Plutarch replies that this is not the case. God, he argues, acts on reason, not on passionate anger (551A, 557E), thus avoiding errors, and by doing so he sets the model for our own actions (ibid.). On the other hand, Plutarch argues that wickedness is not always to be punished, because it of itself ruins the life of those who act thus, and this is a sufficient punishment (ibid. 556D-E). Besides, Plutarch suggests, the punishment of the divine does not have to be obvious; this can take place in the afterlife of the soul, as is suggested in Republic 10, so Plutarch claims that “it is one and the same argument …that establishes both the providence of god and the survival of the human soul” (560F; see also below, sect. 5).
Plutarch, as a Platonist, regards soul as responsible for all life and all motion of any kind. The world, God, and all living beings have soul. While in Plato soul sometimes includes (or is even restricted to) intellect (e.g. Phaedo 94b) and sometimes not (e.g. Phaedrus 247c, Timaeus 69c-e), Plutarch distinguishes sharply between soul and intellect. He criticizes the Stoics who analyze the nature of man in two parts only, body and soul, for disregarding the intellect (De facie 943A-B; see Alt 1993, 94–6). The threefold distinction of the individual person (body, soul, and intellect) has its equivalent in the universe at large. As the human soul is intermediary between body and intellect, similarly the world soul is intermediary between earth and sun (De facie 943A, 945A, De virtute morali 441D; see Opsomer 1994). In both the human being and the cosmos, the intellect is external to the soul (cf. Phaedrus 247c-d); the world soul is informed by the reason of the creator god, while in the case of humans the intellect is the “daimôn” assigned to each of us (De genio Socratis 591E). Souls are essentially non-rational, given their affinities with the originally non-rational world soul, and also because they are in immediate contact with matter or body. Human souls, however, can be informed by reason and become rational by coming into contact with the intellect. Plutarch argues that all ensouled beings, including animals, exhibit the presence of the divine intellect (De Iside 382A-B). An element of non-rationality always remains in souls (De an. procr. 1027A), but this happens to different degrees, depending on how much a soul partakes of intellect (De genio Socratis 588 D, 591D-E). On this basis Plutarch argues, against the Stoics, that animals also share in reason (De sollertia animalium esp. 960B). The extent to which a soul partakes of reason largely depends on the training and the habits of that soul itself. Strong emotions, for instance, distance soul from intellect and increase its non-rationality (De genio Socratis 591D).
Plutarch maintains that there is a constant interaction between intellect, soul, and body. This interaction manifests itself both at a psychological and at an ethical level. The soul as such accounts for the senses, while the intellect accounts for intelligence (De an. procr. 1026D-E). Clearly, though, perception is an activity involving both the senses and the notions residing in the intellect (see above, sect. 3). It is the intellect that gives order to the sense impressions and accounts for understanding. Analogously, the interaction of soul and body gives rise to non-rational movement or passion, while the interaction between intellect and soul brings about rational movement, harmony and virtue (De sera 566A-D, 591D-F; see Dillon 1977, 194). Plutarch actually suggests that the soul that is devoid of intellect comes close to being quasi-corporeal (De sera 566A; Teodorsson 1994, 120). Regarding the embodied soul, Plutarch appears to be guided by Aristotle's view in the De anima (and also Phaedo 82d-e), arguing that the soul uses the body as an instrument. The soul, he argues, develops faculties, such as the vegetative, the nutritive, the perceptive, when associating with the body, so that it can carry out the functions of an animated body (De virtute morali 442B, 450E, 451A, Plat. Quest. 107E-1009B; Karamanolis 2006, 111-113, Baltes 2000). This coordination of the body is such, however, that we sense and understand, and this is possible because the soul is informed by the intellect (De genio Socratis 589A)
The proximity of soul as such to body in its operations as living body is evidence for the superiority of the intellect. Inspired by passages in Plato such as Phaedrus 247c, Plutarch argues that intellect is as superior to soul as soul is to body (De facie 943A). The intelligent part of the human soul is not subject to corruption (De genio Socratis 591D-F) and Plutarch identifies it with one's true self. He argues that one's self is neither that in virtue of which we sense or in virtue of which we desire, but rather that in virtue of which we reason and think (De facie 944F-945A). Plutarch actually goes so far as to distinguish two kinds of death, first when intellect leaves soul and body, second when soul leaves body (De facie 943A-B; see Donini 1988b, 128-143, Brenk 1994, 15). The separation of intellect from soul and body happens “by love for the image of the sun…for which all nature strives” (De facie 944E). The ascent to the sun as the goal of intellect symbolizes the human being's imitation of, and assimilation to, the divine, and is a frequent theme in Plutarch (De Iside 372D-E, De E 393D-F, De sera 556D; Brenk 1994, 10–14). This is illustrated in the myth presented in On Delays in Divine Punishment of a certain Aridaeus, who like Er in the Republic, died but has come back to life to narrate his experience after death. The death of Aridaeus amounts to the fall of the intelligent part of his soul (to phronoun; De sera 563E-F, 566A), through which humans partake of the divine (564C), with the soul remaining behind (allê psychê) as an anchor in the body (564C; cf. 560C-D). The latter is the non-rational part of the soul, which is such because it is bound to the body (sômatoeidês; 566A) and inclines the entire soul toward earthly concerns, preventing the soul from going very far (566D). This is very similar to what Plotinus maintains later in Enn. IV.8.8.1. After death, souls go through the process of reincarnation, which, as in Plato, is a form of punishment for wicked souls (De sera 567D-F). While all intellects live eternally, those of noble souls become divine (daimones) and operate as guardians of humans (De genio Socratis 593D-594A; see further Dillon 1977, 219-224).
Plutarch shares the view of Hellenistic philosophers that philosophy is a way of life. He is much concerned to advocate the life according to Plato, and to show that it is possible and indeed happy (Adv. Col. 1107E, Non posse suaviter vivi 1086C-D). He criticizes Stoics and Epicureans for proposing misguided ethical ideals (e.g. An recte dictum sit latenter esse videndum 1129F-1130E). Plutarch's strong concern with ethics is reflected also in his Lives, which focus on the character of a historical figure. Central to these is how man's nature (physis) can be educated so that a certain state of character is formed (êthos; Pericles 38, Alcibiades 2.1, De sera 551E-F, 552C-D; Russell 1973, 105-106, 117). Plutarch's especially strong interest in ethics among the sub-fields of philosophy is characteristic of his age. The two most prominent of Plutarch's Stoic contemporaries or near-contemporaries, Epictetus and Seneca, devote most of their attention in their writings to ethics, and this is the case also with the Peripatetic Aristocles of Messene (1st c. CE?), the author of some eight books on ethics (Suda s.v. Aristocles). To some extent, this especially strong interest in ethics goes back to Antiochus (1st c. BCE). Plutarch and the Peripatetic Aristocles identify ethical formation as the goal of philosophy, yet Plutarch at least differs from Antiochus in that he founds his ethics on metaphysics, largely based on his interpretation of the Timaeus. It is because Plutarch maintains the existence of an intelligible world, which has shaped the sensible world including humans, that he rejects the ethics of both Stoics and Epicureans. On the basis of the Phaedrus and the Timaeus, Plutarch maintains that the human intellect and the human soul stem from the intelligible realm, the indivisible and the divisible being respectively, which shapes our human nature accordingly (cf. Plat. Quest. 1001C).
Plutarch argues that the crucial difference between the Platonic and the Stoic understanding of virtue is grounded in their different conceptions of soul as the source of human agency (De virtute morali 441C-E). While for the Stoics soul is reason only, Plutarch defends the conception of soul outlined in the Republic (esp. book 4), which presents the soul as consisting of rational and non-rational parts. As explained above (sect. 4), this fits well with Plutarch's interpretation of the creation of the world, according to which the pre-cosmic non-rational world soul is informed by the reason (logos) of the divine demiurge, yet this is not sufficient to eliminate its natural non-rationality. The non-rational aspect of the human soul accounts for emotions and bodily desires (Opsomer 1994, 41). In fact, however, Plutarch does not lump together bodily desires and emotions as constituting an undifferentiated non-rational part. Given the theory of Republic 4, Plutarch distinguishes spirit as responsible for emotions from appetite, which is responsible for bodily desires. But he classes them together to the extent that both are dependent upon reason, sensitive to, and nurtured by, it (De virtute morali 443C-D; Plat. Quest. 1008A-B). Plutarch describes virtue (without mentioning appetite) as the state in which reason succeeds in managing emotion and drives it in the right direction (De virtute morali 443B-D, 444B-C, 451C-E), while vice arises when emotion is not properly informed by reason (443D). Plutarch defines virtue as the state in which emotion is present as matter and reason as form (440D), a definition inspired by Nicomachean Ethics 1104b13–30 (cf. Aspasius, In Ethica Nicomachea 42.20–25). Plutarch's definition of virtue matches his account of how the world came into being, when matter was informed by reason. As with the world soul, similarly with the human soul, the impact of reason is possible because the soul, or part thereof, can heed what reason dictates.
Plutarch does not refer to the Timaeus to support his theory of the tripartite soul, but rather to Aristotle (442B-C), whom Plutarch, like most ancient and modern commentators, recognizes as adopting essential aspects of Plato's doctrine. The essential feature that Aristotle shares with Plato is the belief in rational and non-rational aspects of the soul. This accounts for unself-controlled actions that, Plutarch thinks, prove how mistaken is the Stoic conception of human agency as deriving from reason alone. Plutarch also relies largely on Aristotle's Nicomachean Ethics with regard to the nature of virtue. He describes virtue as being an extreme of excellence (akrotês), which however lies in a mean, determined by reason, between two opposite emotions (De virtute morali 443D-444D; Nicomachean Ethics 1107a6-8). Plutarch argues that there can be no virtue without some emotion. Without some amount of fear, Plutarch contends, there can be no courage, for instance (De virtute morali 451E-452A); courage is the virtue that one acquires for use when, in a state of fear, one manages to subordinate fear to a goal set by reason, such as fighting for one's country. In this sense, emotion is an ally to reason in constituting virtue (cf. De tranq. animi 471D). Plutarch suggests this specifically in the case of anger becoming bravery (De ira fr. 148 Sandbach). Anger, when moderated and guided by reason, can also motivate reasonable and due vengeance (De sera 551A-B).
Since virtue is the state (hexis 443D) in which emotion is guided by reason, it follows that virtue requires training in how to make emotion right. Plutarch devotes an entire treatise to that subject (De profectibus in virtute). He defends, against the Stoics, the view that progress in virtue is possible (ignoring the relevant views of Epictetus, Dissertationes I.4 and Seneca, Epistulae 75.8). This training in virtue can be provided by parents and teachers, by the example of the virtuous actions of the people around us (De communibus notitiis 1069A), by the law of the cities (De virtute morali 452D), and also by philosophy, poetry and history (De profectibus 79B-80B). Plutarch maintains that the pervasion of emotion by reason should be thorough, which is why he claims that the temperate person is less virtuous than the practically wise one (phronimos), who does the good without wavering (De virtute morali 445C-D; cf. Nicomachean Ethics 1151b23–1152a3), as a temperate person might. To the extent that virtue reflects the operation of reason in the human soul, which is capable of following reason, virtue, Plutarch argues, is natural to us. He argues that nature itself attracts us (oikeiousa) to things which are natural for us to strive for, but these include also life, health, beauty (De communibus notitiis 1060B-E). Plutarch censures the Stoics because they argue that the final human end is to live in accordance with nature, but, he claims, they contradict themselves when they admit only virtue as being good, neglecting all other things which are, by everyone's admission, good for us, such as health. Plutarch, like Antiochus, maintains that the human final end includes the satisfaction of primary demands of the body, a doctrine Plutarch finds in Aristotle, Xenocrates, and Polemo (De communibus notitiis 1069E-F).
This, however, is not the only conception of happiness that Plutarch advocates. While he argues against the Stoics that a life of thinking only, devoid of all affection, cannot be happy (De tranq. animi 468D), he also defends an alternative end for human life, which consists in a life of theoria (an Aristotelian term: contemplative knowing) or, in Plutarch's words, epopteia (a religious term referring to the final vision achieved in initation ceremonies for mystery religions; De Iside 382D-E). Formally, the end that Plutarch advocates for human beings is, as he says, a life similar to god (De sera 550D-E). This end is suggested in the several eschatological stories found in Plutarch's work, which suggest that a human being can transcend the sensible world and become united with the divine (see Alt 1993, 185–204). This doctrine, which has its roots in the Phaedo and the Theaetetus, is again to be understood against Plutarch's interpretation of the cosmogony of the Timaeus. The “younger gods” of the Timaeus imitate the demiurge in constructing human beings' and the other animals' bodies and souls (40b-d, 42e), and this is also the case with nature, which strives to imitate the creator and become like him (De facie 944; Helmig 2005, 21–23). This assimilation with god (homoiôsis) amounts to the complete domination of the intelligible aspect of humans over the sensible one. Humans are invited to follow the cosmic example, and in this sense to live in accordance with nature also. To achieve this, one should let his intellect rule and get beyond having any emotions. This amounts to having and exercising theoretical virtue alone, which pertains to the intellect (Non posse suaviter vivi 1092E). The practical or civic virtues pertain to the embodied soul and are achieved through the subordination of emotion to reason (Tyrwitt frs. p. 68 Sandbach). Plutarch's distinction between a life of happiness through theorizing and a practical life of happiness is made in his On Moral Virtue, apparently inspired by the relevant Aristotelian distinction in Nicomachean Ethics. Plutarch suggests that his theoretical ideal does not only require a distinct kind of virtue but also determines a distinct kind of happiness. In this Plutarch anticipates Plotinus' distinction of two kinds of ethical life, a political and a theoretical one.
Echoing Plato's Republic, Plutarch was seriously concerned with the effect that poetry has on education. His most important work on this field is On How the Young Man Should Listen to Poets. In this, Plutarch deals with the question of how young people should read and understand poetry, since poetry can be both beneficial and harmful, depending on its interpretation. Poetry, argues Plutarch, is a mimetic art; it imitates the character and lives of various people, good and bad alike (De aud. poet. 17E-F, 26A). In the course of this, poets tell lies and present obscene stories and images (ibid. 16A). Plutarch selects examples of such poetic habits mainly from the Republic, focusing on stories from Homer in particular. Plutarch does not condemn poetry altogether; he rather finds a convenient middle solution. He tries to show how one should read the poets in the most beneficial way. In order to do so, Plutarch argues, first one should avoid reading the deliberate lies made in poetry, which can unnecessarily upset one (ibid. 17B; Russell 1989, 303). Second, Plutarch recommends that the reader, especially the young one, should learn how to read poetry allegorically, in such a way that this can have a beneficial effect on one's character (ibid. 19E-20B; Lamberton 2001, 48-50). This is the approach that Plutarch himself applies to the myth of Isis and Osiris in the work with that title. Plutarch illustrates the search for the correct (morally uplifting) meaning of a poetic saying also on parts of the Table Talks (Quaestiones Conviviales 622C, 673C; Russell 1989, 305). The young man needs to learn the skill of how to recover and isolate the beneficial elements of poetry and absorb them alone. In that way poetry can guide one to virtue (ibid. 28E-F). Plutarch likens properly educated young men in their attitude towards poetry to the way bees select the best from flowers (32E), a simile adopted by the Christians, Basil (To young men on the right use of literature 4.7–8), and Gregory of Nazianzus (Orationes 43.13.1). Such a use of poetry prepares youths for their education in philosophy (De aud. poet. 15F, 37B). This happens in two ways. First, poetry can guide youths towards philosophy by familiarizing them with the concepts that philosophers also use; second, poetry, as we have seen, when properly used, can guide to virtue, and this, Plutarch argues, is a requirement for philosophical education (De aud. poet. 36D-37B). Plutarch actually maintains that the best of poetry is nothing other than philosophy in disguise (ibid. 15F), and throughout his work he tries to illustrate precisely this through a selection of verses from the most well known ancient poets. In On Making Progress in Virtue (79B-D) Plutarch goes so far as to treat poetry and history as complementary to philosophy in educating one's character.
From this point of view one may relate Plutarch's Lives to his philosophical works (Gill 2006). Plutarch himself says he wrote the Lives for the improvement of others, assuming that the actions of virtue will instigate emulation in the reader (Pericles 1–2; Russell 1973, 100–101). Perhaps then the Lives aim to train the reader's character, and in such a way to prepare him for the life of philosophy.
Plutarch exercised considerable influence on later Platonism. His emphasis on the Timaeus and on metaphysics and psychology set the tone for the following generations of Platonists, in which metaphysical and psychological questions and the high authority of the Timaeus were prominent features of philosophical life. Plutarch's literal interpretation of the Timaeus itself was highly debated among Platonists. It was adopted by Atticus, but was resisted by most others, including Taurus, Porphyry, and Proclus. Later Platonists criticized Plutarch for a narrow-minded interpretation of the Timaeus, some of their criticisms (e.g. on the world soul), however, rest on an uncharitable interpretation of Plutarch (see Opsomer 2001). Nevertheless, Plutarch's view that the world soul is created in the sense that it partakes of reason and intelligence imparted to it by the demiurge, is endorsed by Alcinous, Didascalicos 169.33–42 and presumably also by Numenius (fr. 45 Des Places; see Dillon 1993, 127). Plutarch's radical metaphysical and psychological dualism is shared by Numenius and Atticus, but is rejected by Plotinus and Porphyry. The latter, however, draws on Plutarch in his argument that animals partake of reason (De abstinentia 3.6–7). Plutarch's theory of divine providence, as presented in his On Delays of the Divine Providence was influential among ancient Platonists and Christians alike. Proclus, for instance, took over much from it in his Ten Objections Against Divine Providence (esp. 8 and 9). Despite the vagaries of judgment by later Platonists of Plutarch's work, he not only set the agenda of questions for later Platonists, redirecting their attention to the Timaeus, but he was also influential in terms of his interpretative strategy of Plato's work, which aspired to take into account Plato's entire work and to treat it as a system still to be articulated. It is this strategy that leads Plutarch to distinguish hierarchies of being in Plato's work and also levels of ethical life. Plutarch was highly influential also among early Christians, who approved of his literal interpretation of the Timaeus and his educational theory. His work was used by Clement of Alexandria, who followed Plutarch in writing a treatise with the title “Stromateis,” but also by Eusebius, Cyril of Alexandria, and the Cappadocean Church Fathers, especially Basil.
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- The International Plutarch Society (IPS), which contains translations of many works of Plutarch and Bibliographies.
The author thanks Christoph Helmig and Christopher Noble for suggestions and remarks, and especially John Cooper for many valuable comments and suggestions while preparing this article for publication.